Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Sun Feb 2, 2003

Relativism is not a single doctrine but a family of views whose common theme is that some central aspect of experience, thought, evaluation, or even reality is somehow relative to something else. For example standards of justification, moral principles or truth are sometimes said to be relative to language, culture, or biological makeup. Although relativistic lines of thought often lead to very implausible conclusions, there is something seductive about them, and they have captivated a wide range of thinkers from a wide range of traditions.

Relativistic motifs turn up in virtually every area of philosophy. Many versions of descriptive relativism (described below) bear on issues in the philosophy of social science concerning the understanding and interpretation of alien cultures or distant historical epochs. Other versions bear on issues in the philosophy of mind about mental content. Still others bear on issues in the philosophy of science about conceptual change and incommensurability.

Relativistic themes have also spilled over into areas outside of philosophy; for example, they play a large role in today's "culture wars." Some strains of ethical relativism (also described below) even pose threats to our standards and practices of evaluation and, through this, to many of our social and legal institutions. And the suggestion that truth or justification are somehow relative would, if correct, have a dramatic impact on the most fundamental issues about objectivity, knowledge, and intellectual progress.

Relativistic arguments often begin with plausible, even truistic premises--e.g., that we are culturally and historically situated creatures, that justification cannot go on forever, that we cannot talk without using language or think without using concepts--only to end up with implausible, even inconsistent, conclusions. There is little consensus, however, about how to block the slide from inviting points of departure to uninviting destinations.

Both sides in debates over relativism tend to oversimplify the views of the other side. The problem is exacerbated by the fact that relativistic theses often come in two forms: a bold and arresting version, which is proclaimed, and a weaker, less vulnerable version, which is defended--with the first having a tendency to morph into the second when under attack. Relativism also often sounds better in the abstract than it does when we get down to actual cases, which often turn out to be rather trivial, on the one hand, or quite implausible, on the other. But it is also true that most academic philosophers in the English-speaking world see the label ‘relativist’ as the kiss of death, so few have been willing to defend any version of the doctrine (there is less reluctance in some other disciplines). Indeed, many explicit characterizations of relativism are to be found in the writings of unsympathetic opponents, who sketch flimsy versions to provide easy targets for criticism.

Discussions of relativism are also frequently marred by all-or-none thinking. Phrases like “everything is relative” and “anything goes” suggest versions of relativism that, as we will see, often are inconsistent. But to conclude that there are no interesting versions of relativism is to err in the opposite direction. Often the important question is whether there is a space for an interesting and plausible version of relativism between strong but implausible versions (e.g., all truth is relative), on the one hand, and plausible but trivial versions (e.g., some standards of etiquette are relative), on the other.

Finally, relativistic themes are frequently defended under alternative banners like ‘pluralism’ or ‘constructivism’ (with a particular author's line between relativism and pluralism typically marking off those views he likes from those he doesn't). I will use the label ‘relativist’ for all such views, with the understanding that many species of relativism may be plausible or even true. But it is the views, not the labels, that are important.

Section one contains a sketch of the general form of many relativistic claims and maps the general terrain. Section two explores the main things that have been thought to be relative and section three the main things they have been relativized to. Section four presents the chief motivations and arguments for relativism, and section five is devoted to the major responses to the major relativistic themes. After section one the sections, and in many cases subsections, are relatively modular, and readers can use the detailed tables of contents, an index, and hyperlinks in the text to locate the topics of most interest to them.

[Entry Index]
[List of Supplements] [Supplement Index]
[More Detailed Table of Contents (to subsection-level)]
[Most Detailed Table of Contents (to subsubsection-level)]

1. A Framework for Relativism

In this section we consider the general form of the major relativistic claims and introduce some distinctions to map the terrain. We then note the major candidates for things that have been claimed to be relative and the things to which they are often relativized. We also distinguish descriptive and normative versions of relativism and see that normative relativism has two faces, an anti-realist face (there are no framework-independent facts of certain sorts) and a realist face (but there are framework-dependent facts of those sorts). It will save qualifications if we view the relativist as an ideal type that a number of thinkers approach rather closely, even when they disavow that label ‘relativist’.

1.1 Y is relative to X

One is not a relativist, or a descriptive or normative relativist, simpliciter. Both descriptive and normative relativism are families of views, each member of which holds that one or more things (e.g., epistemic standards, moral principles) is relative to something else (e.g., language, culture), and it is possible to be a relativist about some of these things but not about others.

It is often useful to think about relativism in terms of a general relativistic schema:

Relativistic Schema: Y is relative to X.

Different versions of relativism result from replacing Y by different features of thought, experience, evaluation, or even reality (e.g., modes of perception, standards of rationality), replacing X by something that is thought to lead to differences in the value of Y (e.g., language, historical period), and explaining what the phrase relative to amounts to in the case at hand. Each choice of Y and X yields both a version of descriptive relativism and a version of normative relativism (we turn to these below). Many variations are possible, but for a relativistic thesis to be of much interest, Y needs to be something that is important and that is often regarded as non-relative across groups. [1]

It will be useful to have a generic, catch-all label for the X slot--what things are relativized to--and following a common usage we will speak of relativization to conceptual frameworks or simply frameworks. Cover terms that have been used in related ways include ‘worldview’ (Weltanschauung), ‘categorial scheme’ and, more distantly, ‘form of life’, ‘paradigm’, and ‘life world’ (Lebenswelt). Conceptual frameworks themselves are almost always thought to be determined by something else. Hence labels like ‘framework’ are really just placeholders, with the real work being done by concrete instantiations of X with notions like language, culture, historical epoch, or some other parameter.

In the general schema Y is a dependent variable (depending on frameworks), and X is the independent variable (that influences one or more dependent variables). When people speak of relativism of a given sort they sometimes focus on factors that typically function as dependent variables (as with conceptual relativism or moral relativism); other times they focus on factors that typically function as independent variables (cultural relativism, the linguistic relativity hypothesis). But a complete version of relativism requires the specification of both (along with an account of the relationship between them).

It is easy to over intellectualize the notion of a conceptual framework. On most accounts frameworks are not tidy and precise cognitive artifacts like road maps or axiomatic formal systems. They are often messy, indefinite, and may include vague intuitions or cognitive habits as well as specific principles and standards. For example, we form various cognitive habits so that certain things automatically count, with little need for argument or reflection, as strong evidence for certain other things. Nor are frameworks cognitive artifacts that we can abandon or change at will. We inhabit them. They permeate many aspects of our thought and experience, providing much of the texture of our lives, and when they do they are central to who we are, what matters to us most, and what we can see as making sense. We return to frameworks in §3.7.

1.2 Descriptive Relativism and Normative Relativism

It will be useful to generalize a distinction familiar from discussions of ethical relativism and to distinguish descriptive relativism and normative relativism with respect to anything that is claimed to be relative (e.g., descriptive relativism about concepts, normative relativism about truth).

Descriptive relativism is a family of empirical claims to the effect that certain groups in fact have different modes of thought, standards of reasoning, or the like. Such claims are meant to describe (but not evaluate) the principles and practices of the two groups, and they are compatible with the claims that both groups are right (in their different ways), that only one is, that neither is, or even that (in the case at hand) there is no such thing as getting things right (e.g., there is no ultimate fact of the matter as to which epistemic principles or ethical principles are correct). It is possible to be a descriptive relativist about some things (e.g., ethical principles) but not about others (e.g., logical principles).

The claim that a person's culture, language, or the like influences his modes of thought does not mean that they completely determine how she thinks. Smoking is a causal factor for lung cancer; other things being equal, smokers are more likely to get cancer, and to do so because they smoke. But many other things, from genetic make-up to exposure to asbestos, are causal factors as well. Similarly, a claim that culture or language or some other independent variable affects a particular facet of experience or thought allows for other influences as well, and descriptive versions of relativism come in stronger and weaker forms, depending on the hypothesized strength of an independent variables's influence.

The descriptive relativist's claims about epistemic principles, moral ideals and the like are often countered by arguments that such things are universal, and much of the recent literature on these matters is explicitly concerned with the extent of, and evidence for, cultural or moral or linguistic or human universals (see Brown, 1991 for a good discussion).

The fact that the various species of descriptive relativisms are empirical claims may tempt us to conclude that they are of little philosophical interest, but there are several reasons why this isn't so.

First, some philosophers, including Kant, argue that certain sorts of cognitive differences between human beings (or even all rational beings) are impossible, so such differences could never be found to obtain in fact. This claim is interesting, because it places a priori limits on what empirical inquiry could discover and on what versions of descriptive relativism could be true. Second, claims about actual differences between groups play a central role in several arguments for various types of normative relativism; for example, arguments for normative ethical relativism often begin with claims that different groups in fact have different moral codes or ideals. Finally, descriptive versions of relativism help us to separate the fixed aspects of human nature from those that can vary, and so a descriptive claim that some important aspect of experience or thought does (or does not) vary across groups of human beings tells us something important about human nature and the human condition.

Normative relativism is a family of non-empirical normative or evaluative claims to the effect that modes of thought, standards of reasoning, or the like are only right or wrong, correct or incorrect, veridical or non-veridical, relative to a framework. The adjective ‘normative’ is meant in a generic and untendentious sense that can apply to a wide range of views. Like the notion of a framework, the real work is done by the specific form that normativity takes with a specific species of relativism. In the case of beliefs, for example, being normatively correct amounts to being true. This does not mean, of course, that the normative relativist's notion of framework-relative correctness or truth is always clear, and her first challenge is to explain what it amounts to in any given case (e.g., with respect to concepts, truth, epistemic norms).

It is possible to think of normative relativism about something, e.g., normative ethical relativism, as the thesis that claims about ethics are not true or false simpliciter, but only have truth values relative to moral codes or the like. But many of the normative ethical relativist's arguments run from premises about ethics to the conclusion that claims in ethics have relative truth values, rather than depending on general claims about the nature of truth. In such cases it is often more illuminating to consider the type of relativism (e.g., normative ethical relativism) directly, without a detour through a discussion of relative truth, and it also can make it easier to align discussion with much of the literature on various kinds of relativism. We will take this approach here, but this is not to deny that in some contexts it may be more illuminating to examine various kinds of normative relativism as species of truth-value relativism.

It is possible to be a descriptive relativist about something without being a normative relativist about it. In contexts where a point applies to all species of normative relativism, or where it is clear which species are at issue, I will often simply speak of normative relativism, without modifiers like ‘conceptual’ or ‘epistemic’, and similarly for descriptive relativism.

1.3 The Two Faces of Normative Relativism

Each species of normative relativism is a Janus-faced view. First there is an anti-realist face. The normative relativist about morality, for example, agrees with the anti-realist about morality that there are no absolute, completely objective, framework-independent facts about moral truth or moral justification. Similar points hold for normative relativism and anti-realism about other things like epistemic standards or truth. But, second, each species of normative relativism also has a realist face. Its message is that once we relativize things to frameworks, there are facts about morality, epistemic justification, truth, or the like.

The existence of the two faces means that the normative relativist must fight on two very different fronts. On the first front, the normative relativist must defend anti-realist claims to the effect that there are no framework-independent facts about which beliefs, standards, or the like are correct. Sometimes the normative relativist can adapt standard anti-realist arguments to relativistic ends. But in many cases these arguments will be too strong, since they aim to show that there are no facts about which things are correct in any sense, even a framework-relative one.

On the second front the normative relativist must defend (relativized) realist claims that there are framework-relative, or framework-dependent, facts about what is right, justified, or true. This front is more treacherous than the first. In some cases it is difficult even to explain what framework-relative correctness amounts to. Then, assuming such an explanation has been given, the normative relativist must go on to show that there really are framework-relative facts or norms of the relevant sort. Sometimes she can reinterpret or reconstrue standard realist arguments and positions in a way that allows her to adapt or co-opt them, but this is not always the case.

Relativistic Reconstrual

In defending the (relativized) realist face of some species of normative relativism--particularly the more global versions like normative relativism with respect to epistemic standards, truth, or reality--the relativist can sometimes reconstrue or reinterpret realist views about these things with a relativistic spin. This relativistic reconstrual, like Berkeley's account of physical objects, is intended to save most of the phenomena of commonsense--to treat as many of the things that we normally think are true or justified or right as indeed being true or justified or right--while giving them a new and arresting philosophical interpretation. Thus, the normative relativist can agree that at least most events have causes, that inference to the best explanation is a legitimate pattern of inference, and that murder is wrong. But he offers a new and arresting philosophical account about the ultimate nature of--though not necessarily the criteria for--truth, justification, or rightness, relativizing these to frameworks.

No one thinks that believing something true can always make it true, so the normative relativist also needs to provide accounts of belief and truth that allow the him to explain the difference between the two, that enable him to draw a principled distinction between what the users of a framework believe to be the case and what really is the case (relative to that framework). There are various ways to attempt this, e.g., by arguing that there is some sort of neutral input that constrains our experience and determines, in concert with our concepts and other aspect of our framework, what is true in that framework. On such an account our beliefs may often be wrong. For example, if I have a concept of a dog and a concept of this room it may be true that there is a dog in the room, even if I don't believe that there is. It is not easy to work out the details of such an approach, but the relativist needs something of the sort to maintain a a descriptive-normative gap, so that merely thinking something right or true doesn't make it right or true, not even relative to her framework.

Many philosophers will urge that relativistic reconstrual does not give us everything we want. Still, as we will see, this approach yields a more defensible relativism than many alternatives do, since it requires fewer revisions in our concepts and beliefs.

Tensions Between the Faces

The two faces are not always of one mind. At key junctures the realist face of normative relativism needs something objective of the sort that the first face is bound to find threatening. For example, without something objective it is difficult for the normative relativist to avoid idealism or to explain how intra-framework objectivity and truth are possible. As we will see, there is a fine line here. If the objective constraints play too large a role, the relativist's view may simply wind up as some sort of pluralistic realism; if they play too small a role, her view may collapse into some sort of idealism or solipsism.

1.4 Relativism as Presupposing Realism and Inconceivable without It

Relativism presupposes some measure of realism. If there are no such things as concepts, beliefs, or modes of reasoning, then groups cannot differ with respect to their concepts, beliefs, or modes of reasoning. And if speaking different languages or belonging to different cultures leads to different modes of thought, then there must be objective causal connections between speaking a particular language or belonging to a particular culture, on the one hand, and how one thinks, on the other.

This suggests that any all-embracing relativism will be difficult to defend, and in §5.9 we will see additional reasons for concluding this. But it would be a mistake to conclude, without further examination, that this precludes any interesting versions of relativism. The important question is often whether a version of realism leaves enough space for interesting versions of relativism.

1.5 A Taxonomy of Positions

Relativism can be divided into subtypes in various ways, with different divisions useful for different purposes. The classification I'll use is geared to the relativistic schema

Y is relative to X.

and so involves three things:

  1. Y: the thing that is relative
  2. X: what it's relative to
  3. Type of connection between X and Y (reflected in the phrase is relative to)

A complete characterization of a species of relativism requires specification of all three things, telling how changes in one or more independent variables lead to changes in one or more dependent variables. The general structure is shown in below in Figure 1.

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Figure 1: General Structure of the Taxonomy

It is possible to make more distinctions (e.g., by distinguishing various kinds of epistemic relativism), fewer (e.g., by lumping language and culture together), or to add additional categories (e.g., aesthetic relativism). It is also would be possible to have more than two modes of connection (e.g., more than one form of normative relativism). And of course schemes that are not variants of these are possible. The present account aims to distinguish interestingly different views, including those that appear most often in the literature, without endless proliferation (Figure 2).

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Figure 2: The Taxonomy

I will focus on the variables in Table One (see also Figure Two). The items in the left column of the table are the most common candidates for Y, those in the right the most common candidates for X, and there are two modes of connection for each pairing of X and Y}, descriptive and normative. We will consider the major candidates for dependent variables in Section 2 and those for independent variables in Section 3 (the numbers in the table indicate the section where the relevant variable is discussed).  

Major Relativistic Variables
  • Dependent Variables (What is Relative)
    • 2.1 Central Concepts
    • 2.2 Central Beliefs
    • 2.3 Perception
    • 2.4 Epistemic Appraisal
    • 2.5 Ethics
    • 2.6 Semantics
    • 2.7 Practice
    • 2.8 Truth
    • 2.9 Reality
  • Independent Variables (Relative to What)
    • 3.1 Language
    • 3.2 Culture
    • 3.3 Historical Period
    • 3.4 Innate Cognitive Architecture
    • 3.5 Choice
    • 3.6.1 Scientific Frameworks
    • 3.6.2 Religion
    • 3.6.3 Gender, Race, or Social Status
    • 3.6.4 The Individual

Even with our moderately coarse distinctions the above parameters yield (nine times nine =) eighty one species of relativism, and each comes in a descriptive version and a normative version (= 162). With finer distinctions, or with combinations (e.g., the claim that perception is relative to some interaction between culture and gender), the number climbs well into the thousands. Only someone inordinately fond of splitting hairs could persevere through even a tenth of them, but fortunately many are not particularly interesting or compelling. For example, it is much more plausible to view ethical ideals as relative to culture or religion than as relative to paradigms in high-energy particle physics, and some of the other positions are inconsequential or trivial. We will confine attention to a manageable number of the more interesting packages.

We will explore the relationships among the varieties of relativism in later chapters so here I'll simply note that whether one species of relativism entails, or precludes, another depends on how the details of the relevant variables are filled in and on the background assumptions in play. But even without such detail there seem to be affinities between some positions (e.g., relativism about reality relativism about truth) and strong tensions among others (e.g., the claim that fundamental modes of cognition are due to culture does not fit easily with the views that there are relative to innate cognitive architecture, i.e., to biological makeup).

Although we will consider these matters in more detail below, a few quick examples may help fix ideas. Thus, many American anthropologists in the first part of the twentieth century held that ethical values [2.5] are relative (both in fact and normatively) to culture [3.2], or [2.5]-to-[3.2], for short. Linguistic relativists like Whorf held that concepts, basic beliefs, and some aspects of perception are relative (in fact) to language, i.e., [2.1; 2.2; 2.3]-to-[3.1]. Kuhn's more relativistic passages in the first edition of The Structure of Scientific Revolutions suggest that perception, standards of epistemic appraisal, and meaning are relative (both in fact and normatively) to paradigms or scientific frameworks, i.e., [2.3; 2.4; 2.6]-to-[3.6.1] (further passages suggest that truth and even reality are also relativized to paradigms). Although relativism is typically thought of as a social view, we can also treat the individual as an independent variable; for example, many passages in Sartre suggest that moral values are relative (in fact and normatively) to individuals, i.e., [2.5]-to-[3.6.4].

1.6 Matters of Degree

Relativistic views can differ along two dimensions.

1.6.1 Large vs. Small Differences

Not just any difference in concepts, beliefs, epistemic standards, or the like justifies talk of alternative frameworks or worldviews. Some concepts, beliefs, and standards are much more central than others, and interesting versions of relativism involve these.

Let us call concepts that are especially important to a group, that figure prominently in their most fundamental beliefs, central concepts for that group. Central concepts often have much in common with philosophers' lists of categories. The notion of centrality is vague, but examples should help fix the idea: our central concepts include causation, physical object, person, number, and time, but not the concepts of a pickup truck, a large infinite cardinal number or (for most of us) karma or witchcraft.

A central belief is a belief that is so fundamental for a person or group that they could not abandon it without abandoning many other beliefs (and perhaps some epistemic standards) as well. Our central beliefs include the convictions that at least many events have causes, that physical objects exist even when no one perceives them, and that other people have beliefs and desires. But unlike people at certain other times and places, few of us have central beliefs (or any beliefs at all) to the effect that kings rule by divine right or that all of a person's misfortunes result from evil spells or bad karma. Central concepts and central beliefs are intimately related, since concepts are typically central because they figure in central beliefs, and central beliefs often involve central concepts.

Centrality is a functional, rather than as intrinsic, property of concepts, beliefs, values, standards, and the like. It is a property they have because of the role they play in peoples' thought and action, and the same concept or belief might be central for one group, peripheral for a second, and altogether lacking for a third.

Centrality comes in degrees, and it would be unrewarding to try to draw a sharp line between central concepts and beliefs, on the one hand, and all the remaining concepts and beliefs, on the other. Moreover, we typically gain a better understanding of relativistic themes if we evaluate each case on its own merits, note the similarities and differences between cases, see how these matter, and worry less about giving a sharp ‘yes’ or ‘no’ to the question of whether a particular concept or belief is fundamental enough to justify talk about alternative frameworks.

1.6.2 Local vs. Global Relativisms

A version of relativism is local if it only applies to limited aspects of a group's cognitive or evaluative life. For example, some ethical relativists claim that moral principles or values are relative to a group but allow that other things, e.g., logic or truth about non-normative matters, are not relative. Again, claims that scientific frameworks or paradigms are relative leave room for a non-relative conception of many other things, e.g., logic or morality. By contrast, relativism about all epistemic standards or about truth in general affect more aspects of a persons life and thought, and so are more global. Locality, like centrality, is a matter of degree.

1.7 Exceptions and Dispensations: The Exemption Problem

A completely global version of normative relativism (e.g., normative relativism about truth or about epistemic justification) claims complete, across-the-board coverage, and this would make the relativist's own claims and arguments relative too. This can lead to severe difficulties, including self-refutation, and a recurring danger for relativists is to assume, often tacitly, that the concepts, principles, or standards used to formulate their own relativist theses somehow escape the relativity they insist permeates everything else.

This difficulty, which we might call the exemptions problem, turns up in many guises. Here are a few:

Relativism is not always the most effective topic for promoting consistency in those who discuss it, and as we will see below many relativistic views are unable to give a consistent account of the status of their own claims. With care some local versions of relativism can avoid the exemptions problem, but it is an ever-present danger for more global versions.

2. Dependent Variables: What is Relative?

In this section we examine the chief candidates for relativistic dependent variables. As we will see below, they are not all independent of one another, but they are often singled out for separate treatment, and we begin by following suit.

2.1 Central Concepts

Conceptual relativism is the view that different groups, e.g., those with very different languages or cultures, may have rather different central concepts and that this can lead their members to rather different conceptions of the world. Conceptual relativism can be quite global, applying to concepts across the board, but it also comes in more local versions that apply to more limited domains like ethics or science; for example, Kuhn tells us that what characterizes scientific revolutions is “change in several of the taxonomic categories prerequisite to scientific descriptions and generalization” (2000, p. 30).

Descriptive conceptual relativism is the empirical thesis that members of at least some different groups, e.g., some cultures, linguistic communities or biological species, have interestingly different sets of central concepts. For example, it is generally agreed our modern concept of individual rights did not exist in the Ancient world. More controversially, Whorf (1959, pp. 59, 147, 215) tells us that where modern speakers of English think of many of the things in the external world as falling under the concept of an enduring object (rocks, horses), the Hopi instead think of the things in their world as falling under the concept of an event or happening.

What about normative conceptual relativism? Concepts have many uses, and there is no single sense in which these can be correct or incorrect; furthermore, some of these senses are uncontroversial We all misclassify things now and then, and sometimes we do so systematically. For example, if someone is under the misapprehension that the concept of a score applies to a period of fifteen years (so that four score and seven years is sixty seven years), they simply get things wrong when they deploy the concept of a score.

But when people discuss conceptual relativism they often have a more interesting and more controversial idea in mind. They want to deny that any system or framework of concepts is correct in the sense of matching or fitting or corresponding to the structure of the world. There simply are no concepts that divide things up into groups in a way that corresponds to the way things are truly divided up in nature; to adapt Plato's metaphor, there are no concepts that carve reality at its joints (Phaedrus, 265e). In this metaphor reality is like a chicken; there are real joints out there, facts about which things there are, independently of how we parcel things out in thought. This is what the conceptual relativist typically wants to deny.

The inability to achieve a match with reality is not a defect in our concepts, however, but arises because the world does not come with prepackaged or preindividuated objects exemplifying prefabricated properties and standing in prefabricated relations. Hence this sort of relativism often goes hand in hand with a general sort of relativism about truth and reality. I have separated it here, however, because discussions of conceptual relativism are common and because some partisans of conceptual pluralism want to defend a view of roughly this sort while rejecting other central species of relativism.

Normative conceptual relativism, in the sense we will use here, is the philosophical thesis that no single set of central concepts is correct in any framework-dependent sense, although a set of concepts may be correct relative to a framework. The normative conceptual relativist often adds that our concepts could never be read off from, or even match, the structure of reality, arguing that instead the notions of structure or similarity or kinds are features of our descriptions and thoughts, rather than features of some mind- and language-independent reality “in-itself.” To be sure, some schemes of classification strike us as much more natural, simple, or useful than others. But naturalness, simplicity, and usefulness are our values, not the world's.

2.1.1 Concepts do More than Classify

Classification is rarely an end in itself, and concepts underlie all of our higher mental processes, including inference, prediction, planning, learning, and explanation. The use of concepts (and the information we associate with them) to mediate ampliative inferences subserves many of these other uses, enabling us to apply what we have learned to new and novel cases. When I see that the creature under the rock is a rattlesnake, I immediately infer that it is dangerous.

Concepts Give us Things and Kinds

The members of any very large group of items can be classified or sorted in many different ways, and so many different schemes of classification are possible. But our concepts also determine what things we think are out there waiting to be sorted. Whether we think we have the same thing or something new, one thing or more, depends on which sortal concept we have in mind: this is the same song, but a different verse; same novel, new chapter; same type, different token.

In short, different systems of concepts may sort the same group of pre-individuated things in different ways, but they may also divide the world up into different numbers of things. Indeed, the central role of concepts in the individuation and demarcation of things plays a large role in many arguments for reality relativism. Hilary Putnam expresses the general sentiment this way:

‘Objects’ do not exist independently of conceptual schemes. We cut up the world into objects when we introduce one or another scheme of description (1981, p. 52).

If, as I maintain, ‘objects’ themselves are as much made as discovered, as much products of our conceptual invention as of the ‘objective’ factor in experience, the factor independent of our will, then of course objects intrinsically belong under certain labels because those labels are just the tools we use to construct a version of the world with such objects in the first place (1981, p. 54, italics his).

In such argument we move (by steps that are not always very clear) from the fact that introducing a concept for a kind of thing allows us to individuate things of that kind to a conclusion to the effect that the introduction or use of such concepts plays a role in creating the things in its extension.

2.1.2 Expressibility vs. Usability

It is natural to suppose that if we could come to understand the concepts of some exotic culture or group we could express their concepts in terms we understand--and so their conceptual framework really wouldn't really be very different from our own after all. Even if two groups share certain concepts, however, they may use them in quite different ways, and this could lead them to quite different conceptions of the world.

Applying vs. Not Applying
The most obvious conceptual difference between two groups with the same concept occurs when one group applies a concept to a wide range of things they deem important but the other group doesn't apply it to anything at all. Many historians understand what the divine right of kings was supposed to involve, but few people nowadays think that this concept has any instances. Or one group may apply a concept much more widely than another; for example, the concept of a person would be applied more widely in an animistic culture than in our own.

Applying with Ease vs. Applying with Difficulty
Even when two groups have many of the same concepts, there can be differences in how accessible those concepts are to them, how natural it is to use them, whether they are be used by automatically and by default or only with effort and care. Differences in which concepts are applied by default, habitually or automatically could, if large enough, lead to rather different conceptions of the world. Someone who believed in a world full of magic and spirits and witchcraft might automatically think of disease as the result of witchcraft, whereas a mildly superstitious person might only entertain this possibility as a last resort.

Projecting vs. Not Projecting
Two groups might be able to express all of one another's concepts but project different concepts. For example, we can imagine a group that projects the concepts grue and bleen rather than our green and blue.

  • An object is grue just in case it is observed before 2010 and is green, or else is not so observed and is blue.
  • An object is bleen just in case it is observed before 2010 and is blue, or else is not so observed and is green.

Figure 3: Grue and Bleen Defined in Terms of Green and Blue

Figure 4: Green and Blue Defined in Terms of Grue and Bleen

We can express the other group's concepts in terms of ours and, at the cost of eccentricity and circumlocution, we could even use their concepts to classify things. What we cannot do is project grue and bleen (at least not without massive, compensatory changes in our overall set of concepts, beliefs, and inductive practices). It is both normatively incorrect for us to project such concepts (it violates our standards for good inductive inferences), and it would in fact be very difficult to bring ourselves to do so, to believe viscerally that grass is grue and the sky is bleen.

In short, it is one thing to be able to express a given concept and quite another to be able to use it easily, by default, to project it, or even to apply it to anything at all.

The descriptive claim that different groups in fact employ somewhat different sets of concepts leads only to a conceptual pluralism that is quite compatible with a robust realism about the things the concepts apply to. But our uses of concepts are bound up with our beliefs and practices in many ways, and we will see that conceptual relativism can be used, in conjunction with additional (not always terribly plausible) premises, to defend other types of relativism as well.

The Linguistic Turn

Much twentieth-century philosophy took what is often called the linguistic turn, with questions about properties and concepts being replaced by questions about words and linguistic usage. During this period, conceptual relativism was often transformed into a relativism involving linguistic meanings. For example, some philosophers spoke of the role of language or, more generally, systems of symbols in structuring our experience, thought, or even reality itself. One can find strains of this in Wittgenstein (e.g., 1969) and Carnap (1950), and it is explicit in Goodman (e.g., 1978). No one could now seriously suggest that most philosophical problems are at bottom problems about language, and concepts are once again respectable. But there is a substantial philosophical literature in which the points made here about concepts and relativism were translated into a linguistic mode as parallel points about words and relativism.

2.2 Central Beliefs

A central belief or, to use Kant's term, principle is one that a person could not abandon without having to surrender many other beliefs as well. For most of us these include the beliefs that at least some events have causes and that other people have feelings and emotions. Even if we could somehow divest ourselves of such beliefs, doing so would leave us with a very different picture of the world from the one most of us have now. As is often the case in discussions of relativism, a distinction between descriptive and normative considerations is relevant here. We can distinguish beliefs that a person or group would in fact have great difficulty giving up, those they should, by their standards, have great difficulty giving up, and even those they should, by our standards, have great difficulty giving up.

Descriptive relativism with respect to central beliefs is the empirical thesis that certain groups in fact have different central beliefs. For example, the belief that all of nature is alive may be central in an animistic culture but is not central to, or even held by, many people in the Western world today. The belief in causal determinism may have been central among physicists during the eighteenth century but is not central among physicists now. The belief that all people are of equal moral worth is central to some people now, but wasn't central to many in ancient Sparta.

Normative relativism with respect to central beliefs is the thesis that there is no framework-independent fact about which central beliefs are right, but that such beliefs can be right or wrong relative to a framework. The unqualified claim that any belief, even those that are inconsistent, could be correct relative to some framework or other is too strong to be plausible, but more modest versions of normative relativism about belief are possible. For a belief to be correct is for it to be true, so normative relativism about belief amounts to a normative relativism about truth. But since relative truth is the major flash point in discussions of relativism, we will single it out for special attention below.

2.3 Perception

Perception is the interface between cognition and reality. Descriptive perceptual relativism is the empirical claim that certain groups (e.g., those with different cultures, languages, biological makeup) perceive the world differently. As we will see below, for example, various philosophers of science have argued that theory influences perception to such an extent that partisans of substantially different theories might literally see the world differently.

Descriptive claims about perception are sometimes thought to bear on various versions of normative relativism. For example, some writers have argued that people with different concepts and beliefs will nevertheless perceive the same things in the much same way and that these common perceptions can be used as a fixed point from which to adjudicate the claims of rival frameworks. Most philosophers and vision scientists today now agree, though, that perception is theory-laden; our perceptual experiences in a given situation are influenced by the concepts, beliefs, expectations and, perhaps, even the hopes and desires, which we bring to the situation.

Normative perceptual relativism is the claim that there is not just one correct, framework-independent way to perceive things. But different ways are correct relative to different constellations of concepts and beliefs. Given modern medical training and practice, a competent radiologist should see that this spot on the X-ray is a stomach tumor, and anyone with any sensitivity should see that Sam felt humiliated.

As with most versions of normative relativism, the strongest versions of normative perceptual relativism, ones on which “anything goes,” are implausible; there clearly are constraints on the perception. But weaker versions of the thesis may be defensible. Perception is theory-laden to some degree; it involves what current vision scientists call top down processing click (here for more on top-down processing and the theory-ladeness of perception; here for more on perceptual relativism; and here for an argument against stronger versions of perceptual relativism).

2.4 Epistemic Appraisal

Epistemology (from the Greek episteme, ‘knowledge’, and logos, ‘theory’), or the theory of knowledge, is the area of philosophy that deals with knowledge and related concepts like justification and rationality. On a broad but natural construal, the epistemic realm includes standards or norms for justification and reasoning (e.g., logic, probability theory, guidelines for revising beliefs), ideals of rationality, standards for intelligibility and explanation, epistemic commitments and values (e.g., learning the truth, gaining insight, avoiding error, avoiding ignorance), virtues (e.g., being open-minded) and vices (e.g., having a tendency to jump to conclusions). This is a mixed bag, and one can be a relativist about some of the things in it (e.g., standards of explanation) but not others (e.g., logic).

Many of these things, particularly rationality and justification, are far from clear or univocal. Thus specific beliefs and decisions, ways of arriving at beliefs, policies for making decisions, individuals, groups, and (perhaps) even goals, emotions, and desires are often evaluated a rational or irrational. Moreover, there is intense controversy over what rationality in each of these cases involves; for example, there is debate over whether rational action requires some sort of maximization or optimization, or whether something more modest will suffice. Again, there is debate over whether rationality only involves formal notions like logical consistency and probabilistic coherence, or whether it involves something more substantive. And our concepts of justification are as multifaceted and subject to controversy as our concepts of rationality.

Epistemic Diversity

Many writers have made striking claims about the epistemic diversity among human beings. For example, Jean Piaget and various other developmental psychologists have suggested that children employ a logic unlike that used by adults (1972, p. 163). And C. I. Lewis was inspired to develop several relativistic themes in detail by his work on alternative (in his case modal) logics, which convinced him that the ultimate criteria for selecting a logical system--or any other sort of system of concepts and standards--are pragmatic (e.g., 1923, p. 232; 1929). (Click here for a brief account of logic, arguments, and inference.)

Many discussions of relativism in the earlier part of the twentieth century focused on the French anthropologist Lucien Lévy-Bruhl's (1922/1978) claim that members of preliterate (then called “primitive”) cultures had a “pre-logical mentality” that led them to reason in ways that differ from modes of reasoning common in modern Western cultures. Lévy-Bruhl's opponents countered with the thesis of the “psychic unity of mankind.” Various later writers urged “that standards of rationality in different societies do not always coincide” (Winch, 1970, p. 97), sometimes adding that different cultures have different standards of rationality that make good sense in the rich cultural contexts in which they occur, even if they look odd to us when wrenched out of that context. In a related spirit, the historian and philosopher of science Larry Laudan (1977, p. 187) urges that “specific canons of rationality are time-dependent. A mode of argument which one epoch, or ‘school of thought,’ views as entirely legitimate and reasonable may be viewed by another era or another intellectual tradition as ill-founded and obscurantist.”

Epistemic Genealogy

Concepts and beliefs can have histories, and so can epistemic standards and sensibilities, with what counts as justification, evidence, or reasonableness shifting over time. For example, Aristotle's picture of what it takes to justify a scientific theory (roughly deduction from necessary, self-evident premises) differs markedly from our picture today (roughly testing by making predictions and seeing whether they pan out). The precise and formal conception of probability common today only emerged around 1660, and inferential statistics and experimental design, which now play an absolutely central role in the inductive practices in scientific and medical research, are almost exclusively the product of the last hundred years.

Authority and Tradition

Epistemic standards are not limited to the sorts of things codified in normative models like deductive logic, decision theory, or normative philosophy of science. The epistemic individualism, so pronounced in modern philosophers from Descartes to Kant, can lead us to overlook the fact that most of what we know we learned from others. But in many less-secular, more-traditional cultures, tradition and authority may play an especially dominant role, overriding virtually all other epistemic considerations. Thus, a culture or subculture may believe that the most secure basis for knowledge is faith or divine revelation or some authoritative person (e.g., Aristotle, a shaman, the Pope speaking ex cathedra), text (e.g., the Bible, the Qur'an) or practice (e.g., the deliverances of an oracle), and that their pronouncements cannot be overturned by any other methods (e.g., empirical science). For example, modern views about creationism are sometimes based on the view that the Bible provides a more accurate account of our origins than geology and biology ever could.


Standards of justification and norms of rationality are sometimes construed as rules or even algorithms (e.g., modus ponens or existential generalization for deductive logic; Bayesian conditionalization or Jeffrey conditionalization for updating probabilities of beliefs). But some of our epistemic standards and practices are also more indefinite than the picture of formal rules and procedures might suggest. They are more like rules or thumb or heuristics or even embody procedural knowledge that is difficult to express precisely in words. Indeed, to the extent that connectionist systems provide good models of various aspects of human reasoning, our standards may be quite amorphous and indefinite.

2.4.1 Epistemic Relativism

By analogy with the notions of central concepts and beliefs, we may call a group's more fundamental epistemic standards central or framework standards; as with their counterparts, centrality here is a matter of degree.

Descriptive epistemic relativism about a given mode of inference or reasoning (e.g., deductive inference, causal reasoning, contingency planning) is an empirical claim to the effect that certain groups in fact employ different central standards for evaluating that type of reasoning.

Much of the literature on descriptive relativism in the first two-thirds of the twentieth century was based on uncritical and poorly supported claims about the patterns of reasoning of educated people in modern Western societies. The last three decades have seen a great deal of empirical work on reasoning in our culture, but although we know more now than we did thirty years ago, many of the most basic matters remain controversial (for a general discussion see Swoyer, 2002). These difficulties in getting clear about our own modes and norms of reasoning suggest a measure of skepticism when we encounter glib descriptions of the exotic reasoning patterns of members of quite alien cultures or groups.

Normative epistemic relativism is the claim that there are no framework-independent facts about which modes of inference, norms of justification, standards of rationality or the like are right, but that there are facts about such things relative to particular frameworks. Put another way, people or groups can disagree about what counts as good evidence or strong justification without being inconsistent, irrational, unintelligent, unjustified, or even just obtuse. Epistemic standards have a strong normative dimension--we use our standards of rationality and reasonableness to guide, evaluate, and criticize reasoning, both our own and that of others--so here the label ‘normative’ applies in a very full-blooded sense. And if knowledge requires justification, as many philosophers suppose, then relativism about justification also leads to relativism about knowledge.

Normative epistemic relativism is one of the most interesting and important species of relativism. The strongest versions, ones that allow any epistemic standards or norms, even those that are blatantly inconsistent by their own lights, to be correct relative to some framework or other are implausible. But a number of writers endorse more subtle versions, or at least pay lip service to them, and it is not as easy as one might suppose to show that all of these are false. It is not easy, for example, to devise non-circular defenses of some of our more fundamental epistemic standards and practices like induction (click here for a brief discussion of the justification of epistemic norms).

This does not mean that the normative epistemic relativist wins by default, since she must defend a realism account about framework-immanent correctness in addition to an anti-realism about framework-transcendent correctness, but his claims cannot be dismissed out of hand.

Although normative epistemic relativism has attracted numerous proponents, we will see that problems of self-refutation threaten stronger versions of the view that are just as severe as the problems of self-refutation that beset the doctrine of relative truth.

2.5 Ethics

Our ethical lives involve principles, rules, commitments, rights, duties, ideals, virtues, modes of justifying and criticizing ethical claims, and doubtless other things as well. It is possible to be a relativist about some of these (e.g., what constitutes a good or worthwhile life) but not about others (e.g., rights).

The phrases ‘ethical relativism’ and ‘moral relativism’ are sometimes used interchangeably, but it is useful to distinguish them because morality is often characterized as a part of ethics, that involving obligations, rights, and justice, whereas other parts of ethics concern such things as what constitutes a good life or human flourishing (Aristotle's eudaimonia).

Descriptive ethical relativism is the empirical claim that certain groups differ along one or more ethical dimensions. For example, it is often said that modern Western cultures count individualism, autonomy, and personal dignity as key values, where certain other cultures see group solidarity or placating the Gods as more important. Again, one group may view meekness, humility, and submissiveness to the group as virtues, where another emphasizes heroism and pride. Such differences in moral concepts, values, and practices could also give rise to differences in moral perception and moral sensibilities.

Normative ethical relativism is the claim that what is right or just or virtuous or good only holds within, relative to, a particular ethical framework.

Ethical (or moral) relativism is the topic of a separate entry, and we will only advert to it when it is helpful to note its similarities to, or difference from, other species of relativism.

2.6 Semantics

There are various ways to be a relativist about the semantics of natural languages, i.e., about the meanings of words, phrases, and sentences in a languages like English or Choctaw. Some of these are fairly trivial, but others are more interesting, in part because they are frequently invoked in defense of other relativistic themes. The distinction between descriptive and normative relativism may be less clear cut here than in other cases, but it can still be usefully drawn.

Descriptive semantic relativism, as we will use the phrase, is the empirical claim that different groups, e.g., people living at different times or in different cultures, sometimes have different beliefs about the meaning of a word (where words are individuated independently of their meanings by such things as pronunciation or spelling). For example, as we will see below, some philosophers of science urge that scientists in the late seventeenth century used the word ‘mass' so differently from the way physicists use it today that members of the two groups think of the word as having different meanings.

Normative semantic relativism is the view that the meanings of words literally are determined by a linguistic community, culture, or historical period. So if two communities overlap enough to have the same word (individuated without recourse to meanings), it is possible that it will have different meanings in the two communities. For example, some philosophers argue that in the Newtonian framework ‘mass’ has one meaning (e.g., it denotes a physical magnitude that isn't affected by velocity) and in today's physical framework it has a different meaning. Similarly, it is sometimes urged that the meanings of logical connectives (e.g., ‘not’, ‘if’, ‘some’) is relative to alternative logical frameworks like intuitionism or classical logic (click here for more on this).

More global versions of normative semantic relativism sometimes arise in debates about the meanings of texts (like novels and epic poems). Originally such concerns involved Biblical interpretation, but in the nineteenth century Schleiermacher, Dilthey and others extended interpretive or hermeneutical concerns to all texts (and some contemporary literary theorists have extended the notion of a text, so that it needn't even involve anything linguistic). Interpretive work needn't involve strong versions of normative semantical relativism, but it sometimes does, particularly in postmodernist literary or cultural theory (“every interpretation is just a reinterpretation”).

Virtually everyone would agree that the meanings of words are in some way determined by the practices and beliefs of the members of the linguistic community who uses them. The important point for strong and interesting versions of semantic relativism is the form this determination takes. On relativistic accounts it typically involves a semantic holism to the effect that the denotations, or at least the meanings in some more general sense, of linguistic expressions are determined by their overall role in a language (theory, form of life, etc.). Indeed, the semantic relativist often continues, the denotations or meanings of the expressions of one language cannot be expressed in any but the most approximate way in a substantially different language. Semantic relativism, so construed, is more a linguistic thesis than an overt species of relativism, but there are interesting parallels with other species or relativism and, more importantly, it is frequently invoked in defenses of other species.

2.6.1 Meaning Holism and the Relativity of Meaning

The notion of linguistic meaning is multifaceted and subject to endless controversy, but most thinkers agree that meaning, denotation (i.e., reference), and truth, are key semantic notions. We will begin with the intuitive but somewhat amorphous notion of meaning, focusing on the ways relativism about it are frequently invoked to defend other relativistic themes. Relativism about truth and relativism about denotation are discussed below.

Incommensurability and Conceptual Change

The most widely-discussed form of semantic relativism in recent decades is the doctrine of the incommensurability of meaning championed by Thomas Kuhn (e.g., 1970b), Paul Feyerabend (e.g., 1962), who cites Whorf in support, and several other philosophers of science in the 1960s. Although their views became more nuanced over the years, their early proposal was that the terms (e.g., ‘mass’, ‘gene’,‘temperature’, ‘electron’) of scientific paradigms (Kuhn) or high-level background theories (Feyerabend) draw their meaning from their location or overall role in that paradigm or theory.

When a scientific paradigm or theory changes substantially, as happens during a scientific revolution, scientists change their mind about the truth values of many of the most important sentences or beliefs involving these terms (e.g., “the mass of an object is the same relative to all inertial frames”), and surprising new claims employing such terms many be added to the picture. Hence, the argument continues, the roles of such terms changes, and with it so do their meanings. This is a version of semantic or meaning holism, the view that the meaning of linguistic phrases and sentences is determined by their place in the overall web of beliefs or sentences that comprise a theory or, at the limit, an entire worldview.

If the thesis of meaning holism is right, then substantially different theories cannot contain words or phrases that have the same meanings. It follows, proponents of incommensurability add, that in such cases the claims of competing theorists cannot be compared, because even when they seem to be using the same word, e.g., when Newton and Einstein use the word ‘mass’, it means different things. Rather than disagreeing, proponents of competing theories simply talk about different things--and past each other. And so it is that their claims and beliefs and theories are incommensurable.

It is also possible to formulate a holistic account of belief or mental content, so that the meaning or content of a belief is determined by its place in a large web of beliefs, and to develop an account of incommensurability and relativism in terms of concepts rather than worlds. Most of the issues that concern us here are similar in either case, however, and much of what follows applies to the content of concepts and beliefs as well as to the meanings of words and sentences.

Sometimes relativism is simply equated with the view that there are, or could be, completely incommensurable frameworks. This extreme view, which is rarely defended in any detail, has little to recommend it because it simply dismisses many interesting versions of relativism. Still, incommensurability theses do support some varieties of descriptive relativism, since groups with quite different outlooks would have quite different frameworks of concepts, standards, and beliefs.

Incommensurability and Cross-Cultural Comparisons

The meanings, concepts, and beliefs of very different cultures are also sometimes said to be incommensurable. For example, it might be argued that our word ‘rights’ (or, on more mentalistic accounts, our concept of individual rights) derives its meaning from its relationships to our other words or concepts (e.g., liberty, obligation, autonomy, equality), beliefs (e.g., people should be allowed some control over their own lives), and practices (e.g., our system of laws and sanctions).

The Problem of Conceptual Alignment

But if the meanings and concepts and beliefs and traditions and practices of another culture are substantially different from our own, it follows that none of their words (or complex phrases) line up well enough with the meaning of our word ‘rights’ for us to accurately interpret them as having any phrases or concepts that are genuine counterparts of our word or concept, or as having any beliefs about rights. Similarly, this line of thought can be continued, another group might have quite different meanings or concepts when it comes to causation, epistemic evaluation, or even logic (cf. Winch, 1970 §1). And if this is so, it leads to a descriptive relativism about concepts, logical principles, or the like, as well as to weak truth-value relativism. (We turn to criticisms of such views below.)

The Inscrutability of Reference and Ontological Relativity

The influential American philosophy W. V. O. Quine is well known for his thesis of the inscrutability of reference and its attendant notions of the indeterminacy of translation and ontological relativity. These labels may conjure up visions of an extreme relativism in which ontology (i.e., what exists) is relative to languages or frameworks. In fact, though, Quine's views are a form of antirealism about both semantic and mentalistic notions that would simply undercut many forms of relativism. The thesis of the inscrutability of reference tells us that it makes no sense to say absolutely, i.e., in any language or framework-independent sense, what objects a speaker is talking about. For example, there is no language-transcendent fact as to whether someone pointing in the direction of a rabbit is speaking of enduring physical objects (rabbits) or events (temporal stages of rabbits).

Hence, far from supporting most varieties of relativism, Quine's views actually undermine them, since there is no longer any absolute fact about what the speakers of different languages or members of different cultures think and talk about, and hence no fact that they think in interestingly different ways. It is not that the native--or anyone else's--mind is inscrutable, Quine tells us, but that there is simply “nothing to scrute” (1969, p. 5; cf. p. 27 and 1960, p. 58 and p. 77). Nor is there any absolute fact to scrute about the denotation of the native's words or the contours of his worldview.

2.7 Practice

Much of our thought and action takes place against a background of common but tacit assumptions, understandings, intuition, attitudes, concerns, skills, and other ways of coping with the world around us. These are largely unarticulated, perhaps sometimes not articulable, and often difficult to identify. They include inferential and other cognitive habits, automatic ways of interpreting things, and the concepts it is second nature to project.

The claim that explicit beliefs and reasoning do not tell the whole story about our mental lives is not just some esoteric bit of theory. Few of us see our abilities to speak our native language or to recognize facial expressions in terms of precepts or rules, and cognitive scientists who have tried to write explicit rules to simulate these skills inevitably find it very difficult to do. Some aspects of practice, e.g., the ways we individuate things into physical objects, may be part of our biological heritage, but other aspects differ from one group to another. Practice is in some ways more naturally viewed as an independent variable (e.g., as an aspect of culture or form of life), but in some ways it also works like a dependent variable, so it is useful to introduce it here.

One would expect an emphasis on practice in Marxist writings on praxis and pragmatists' writings on inquiry and education, but many other writers have stressed it as well. Aristotle emphasizes the importance of practical wisdom (phronesis), the ability to judge what to do in concrete situations, and because practical wisdom cannot be reduced to formal directives, he emphasizes that education should aim to inculcate habits and promote the internalization of ways of seeing and feeling and acting, rather than simply to impart rules.

Much more recently Michael Polanyi (1958) has argued that we know more than we can tell and that this tacit knowledge underlies all of our more explicit knowledge. Related themes surface in Gilbert Ryle's distinction between knowing-how and knowing-that, in Pierre Bourdieu's notion of habitus, in Thomas Kuhn's likening the learning of science to an apprenticeship in which one acquires not just explicit knowledge, but also habits and skills. And various philosophers (e.g., Searle, 1983, Ch. 5) have argued that an inexplicit, unarticulated, and perhaps even non-representational background of assumptions, presuppositions, ways of perceiving, and modes of acting underlie our all our knowledge and evaluation.

This emphasis on practice--on engagement, judgment, and action--is a useful corrective to what Dewey excoriated as spectator theories of knowledge that portray human beings in too passive a way--and that still mars some treatments of relativism.

Practice and Relativism

Descriptive relativism about practice is the empirical claim that certain groups have different practices of the sort that lead to different modes of thought and evaluation. On such pictures one might think of cultures, say, as determining practices, which in turn determine modes of classification and evaluation. But it would be more accurate to see cultural practices and modes of classification and evaluation as aspects of the same thing that we separate, somewhat artificially, for purposes of discussion.

Normative relativism about practice is the claim that there can be framework-dependent, but no framework-independent, facts as to which practices are right. The notion of a practice being right in some framework-independent sense is not particularly clear, but examples give us some purchase on the idea. Thus Goodman argues that there is no framework-transcendent fact that people should project the concept green rather than grue. Still, it would be incorrect for us, with our current inductive practices, to do so. Goodman urges that which predicates are projectible--for us, here, now--depends in part on the inductive practices of our community, on which predicates its members have successfully projected in the past. Indeed, the history of our practices determines which categories are right for a variety of purposes (e.g., Goodman, 1984, pp. 120-124; 1978, p. 138).

Ludwig Wittgenstein's treatment of practice is especially important. He argues that justifications and reasons do not bottom out in arguments or beliefs or principle, but in the fact that we behave in the ways that we do, in our form of life, in the practices we have. For example, at some point our applications of rules and standards rests on the fact that we (typically) agree about what counts as going on in the same way or what makes for a correct application of a rule in a novel situation. Some aspects of our form of life may be common to all normal adult human beings, but others may vary across groups. The first two passages are from Wittgenstein's On Certainty, the next two from the Philosophical Investigations.

¶110. What counts as its test? “But is this an adequate test? And, if so, must it not be recognizable as such in logic?”--As if giving grounds did not come to an end sometime. But the end is not an ungrounded presupposition: it is an ungrounded way of acting.

¶204 Giving grounds, however, justifying the evidence, comes to an end;--but the end is not certain propositions' striking us immediately as true, i.e. it is not a kind of seeing on our part; it is our acting, which lies at the bottom of the language-game.

¶217 If I have exhausted the justifications I have reached bedrock, and my spade is turned. Then I am inclined to say: “This is simply what I do.”

What has to be accepted, the given, is--so one could say--forms of life (Pt. II, p. 226).

Practice suffuses all aspects of culture and thought and evaluation, but it is worth singling it out because its very ubiquity makes it easy to overlook.

2.8 Truth

Truth is important because it is a major goal of inquiry, a central component of knowledge, the thing justification is supposed to track, what valid arguments preserve, perhaps (in the form of truth conditions) a component of linguistic meanings and, for many people, a valuable end in itself. Philosophers call truth and falsity truth values, so it is natural to call relativism about truth truth-value relativism.

Descriptive truth-value relativism is the empirical claim that in some cases the members of different groups believe different things to be true.

Normative truth-value relativism is the claim that tokens of sentences, beliefs or the like are only true relative to a framework. Thus Kuhn says “If I am right, then ‘truth’ may, like ‘proof’, be a term with only intra-theoretical applications” (1970a, p. 266). Normative truth-value relativism comes in two versions. The weak version is the claim that there may be things that are true in one framework that are not true in a second simply because they are not expressible in the second. The strong version, which receives the most attention, is the claim that one and the same thing, e.g., one and the same belief, can be true in one framework and false in another.

Relativism about truth boils down to relativism about belief, but rather different sets of issues are typically connected with central beliefs or principles, on the one hand, and issues about relative truth, on the other. The first set of issues involves what I will call framework principles, very general principles (e.g., every event has a cause) that guide classification and inquiry. By contrast, the second set of issues involves the strong version of normative truth-value relativism quite explicitly. Since the two sets of issues are rather different, we treat them separately here.

Truth is a major flash point in discussions of relativism. The traditional indictment of the strong version of truth-value relativism is that it is self-refuting. The claim that truth is relative is, by the relativist's own lights, only true relative to some frameworks and it may be false relative to others. Hence, it is argued, the relativist cannot account for the status of his own claims. We examine this objection in §5.9.

2.9 Reality

In a phrase so arresting it couldn't help but catch on, Peter Berger and Thomas Luckmann (1966) spoke of the social construction of reality. The term suggests that the world, reality itself, is in some measure the product of our cognitive activity. Such views have gone by various names, including metaphysical relativism and constructivism, and they are the most extreme forms of relativism that there are. I will call the general view reality relativism.

Descriptive reality relativism is the empirical claim that certain groups think about, or experience, the world as involving certain things (e.g., physical objects) whereas other groups think or experience it differently (e.g., events). This claim overlaps descriptive relativism with respect to concepts, beliefs, and perception, and so is not of great independent interest

Normative reality relativism is the view that what is real is somehow relative to a framework. But what could this mean? Perhaps in some sense we use concepts to construct the world, but no one supposes that the world is literally composed of concepts. It is tempting, and often best, to regard talk of social construction as a metaphor that is meant to suggest some less hyperbolic doctrine, e.g., that people with quite different concepts will think about things in different ways.

There is escaping the fact, however, that some very able thinkers, from Immanuel Kant to Nelson Goodman, have held the stronger view that the mind plays an essential role in the construction of the objects of knowledge. This is not to say that it constructs them out of nothing; most thinkers who adopt this line urge that there is some sort of input or raw material that we shape, not with our hands or coping saws or lathes, but with our concepts and beliefs and cognitive practices. Here a common theme, noted above, is that the individuation of the raw material into things requires the imposition of concepts on it.

On the face of it, the view that reality is socially constructed seems so peculiar that it is worth documenting that a wide range of thinkers have said things that at least strongly suggest it (click here for some smoking-gun passages). The greatest difficulty with normative reality relativism is making sense of it, with finding a version of it that does some justice to the claims of thinkers sympathetic to it without being incoherent when we turn to the details. We will return to this in §4.

Other Contenders

Other things, including aesthetic standards, emotions, personality structure, memory, strategies for solving problem, motivation, decision making, social cognition, and even sense of humor, have been claimed to be relative in interesting ways. In her famous work, for example, Margaret Mead claimed to find differences in personality structure between adolescents in American and Samoa. But the variables discussed above have received the greatest attention in discussions of relativistic themes. Table One displays these nine independent variables, along with a few illustrative subtypes (qualifiers like ‘central’ and ‘basic’ are omitted; not all of the subtypes discussed, much less all of those that might be distinguished, will easily fit into a readable tree). Each type and subtype comes in a descriptive and in a normative version.


Figure 5: Tree Diagram of Dependent Variables with Illustrative Subtypes

2.10 Relationships among the Kinds of Relativism

The goal here is to facilitate discussion rather than to give a taxonomy of mutually exclusive positions, and in fact there are areas of overlap among some of these species of relativism. For example, normative truth-value relativism about ethics overlaps normative ethical relativism. The best way of thinking about a view in the region of overlap often depends on the purposes at hand, e.g., whether we are primarily interested in the ethical aspects of the view or whether we are interested in comparing different types of relativism about truth.

The precise relationships among various types of relativism, e.g., between conceptual relativism and epistemic relativism, depend on the detailed way in which the view is developed, but there are affinities between several types of relativism as they are most commonly construed.

Some connections exist because we have abstracted away from the rich texture of peoples' thought and life. For example, talk of ethical or epistemic or legal or religious realms may suggest a sort of compartmentalization that rarely exists in actual life. People often have a multiplicity of concerns at any given time, and in many cases the boundaries between various sorts of considerations and reasons--e.g., the prudential, the epistemic, the ethical--are blurry. Indeed, it is sometimes even unclear whether some aspect of a person's cognitive life is best construed as a rule, value, or a higher-order belief. For example, a person's commitment to modus ponens might be construed as a logical rule that they endorse, or as the belief that if a conditional and its antecedent are both true, its consequent must be true as well.

Various species of relativism support one another, although this support often falls short of entailment. Here we note just a few of the potential connections among various species of relativism.

Concepts, Beliefs, and Perception:
Relativism about concepts or beliefs is connected, rather trivially, to other kinds of relativism because all of them involve concepts and beliefs. For example, groups with rather different ethical or epistemic concepts are likely to have somewhat different epistemic standards and values. More substantively, if certain empirical claims about the theory-ladeness of perception are true, relativism about concepts and beliefs leads to perceptual relativism.

Epistemic Relativism:
Our epistemic standards and practices are interwoven with our concepts. Indeed, a central task of concepts is to mediate inferences. Furthermore, the concepts we project partially determine which ampliative inferences we sanction. These inferences can also depend on a background of general beliefs, for example the belief that the future will be pretty much like the past in ways we consider relevant or that if two types of events are correlated then either one causes the other or else they have a common cause.

Truth-Value Relativism:
Normative relativism about epistemic standards does not entail normative relativism about truth or about reality. It can, however, be combined with other substantive principles in various ways in arguments designed to support the latter. First, if truth is explained in partially epistemic terms, e.g., as what would be warranted or justified under certain idealized conditions of inquiry, then relativism about standards of warrant or justification leads naturally to relativism about truth. But even on non-epistemic conceptions of truth, the view that an epistemic standard is legitimate only if it is truth-conducive, i.e., only if it tends to lead to true conclusions when applied to true premises, together with the view that epistemic standards are relative, can be deployed to argue for the relativity of truth. The argument can also be run in the opposite direction, from the claim that truth is relative and that good epistemic standards are truth conducive, to the conclusion that epistemic standards are relative.

Reality Relativism:
Reality relativism supports relativism about many other things. A common argument for reality relativism, examined below, turns on the claim that our central concepts and beliefs somehow structure or shape the world as we know it and that any notion of an objective world that is entirely independent of the way we know it is empty and useless. If this is correct, it is tempting to conclude that the only notion of truth that is not empty and useless is truth about things with respect to our conceptual framework. On this picture, which involves a standard relativistic reconstrual, the sentence ‘grass is green’ is true because it corresponds to the facts or fits the world--but since the only world we can talk or think or know about is the world of our framework, we must (we are told) conclude that the sentence corresponds to the facts of that world. Truth makers are relative to frameworks, and so the only sort of truth we can hope to discover is truth in, or relative to, a framework.

3. Independent Variables: Relative to What?

In this section we examine the chief candidates for relativistic independent variables. As with the dependent variables, the chief candidates here are not all independent of one another--language and religion are important facets of culture, for example--but they are often singled out for separate treatment, and we begin by following suite.

While such things are concepts, logical principles, and truth are often relativized to conceptual frameworks, frameworks in turn are usually thought to be determined by something else. Issues involving descriptive relativism are often central in discussions of the independent variables, since one of the chief questions is whether (and, if so, how) something like language or culture in fact influences modes of thought or evaluation. But normative issues often surface as well.

Relativism as Social. Over two thousand years ago the Greek philosopher Protagoras declared that man is the measure of all things. Plato interpreted this as the claim that what is true is relative to each individual person's beliefs. But virtually all of the versions of relativism that have been defended in any detail since Plato's time treat it a social phenomenon, and almost no later writers take their inspiration from Protagoras. Instead, members of a group said to have their modes of thought as part of their social heritage, because of some common possession like culture or language, or as part of their shared biological endowment.

3.1 Language

Language (along with culture) is the most frequently discussed independent variable, the thing most commonly said to influence modes of thought. This can be generalized, as it has by Nelson Goodman (1978), to the claim that symbol systems--including computer languages, conventions for diagrams, even styles of painting--influence perception and thought.

The claim that one's language affects how she experiences and thinks about the world is known as the linguistic relativity hypothesis or linguistic relativism (it is also called, in deference to two prominent proponents, the Whorf hypothesis or the Sapir-Whorf hypothesis). It is typically a descriptive (rather than a normative) claim about the actual influence of human languages on human thought and experience.

Any serious discussion of linguistic relativism requires us to answer three questions:

  1. Which aspects of language influence which aspects of thought in a systematic way?
  2. What form does this influence take?
  3. How strong is the influence?

For example, certain features of a language's syntax (e.g., whether there is a distinction between intransitive verbs and adjectives) or its lexicon (e.g., what color words or numerical vocabulary it has) might be said to influence perception, classification, or memory in clearly specifiable ways.

As with relativistic claims about the other independent variables, linguistic relativity hypotheses are claims about causal influence: one or more aspects of language causally affect one or more aspects of thought. Such influences can vary in magnitude, so linguistic relativity hypotheses differ in the strength of the hypothesized influence. Finally, as with many other versions of relativism, the weakest versions of linguistic relativism are trivially true and the strongest versions are known to be false. The important question is whether interesting versions between these extremes are true. Current evidence suggests that a person's language does have some influence on her perception and thought, but that it is much less dramatic than the more extreme partisans of linguistic relativism have maintained. (Click here for more on linguistic relativism.)

Morals for Independent Variables In General

The greatest challenge for proponents of linguistic relativism is to adduce evidence to show that differences in language actually lead to differences in thought. This is a problem that arises for most of the independent variables we will consider, so linguistic relativism is a good case study for descriptive relativism in general. The points that emerge from an examination of linguistic relativism are defended in a supplement to this section; the discussion there suggests the following morals for a number of independent variables, including culture and history, as well as language.

  1. Questions about the impact of an independent variable on cognition are empirical and causal questions.
  2. Such questions can only be answered once we specify which aspects of an independent variable (e.g., the color lexicon, religious practices) influence which aspects of thought (e.g., perception, causal reasoning) and what form the hypothesized influence takes.
  3. Such hypotheses can vary greatly in specificity, strength, and scope.
  4. Testing a specific version of a relativity hypothesis requires a combination of skills. Depending on the type of relativism involved in may require the expertise of an ethnographer, linguist, experimental psychologist, historian, or biologist.
  5. A comparison of more than two groups (e.g., linguistic communities, cultures) is needed to draw any firm conclusions about a descriptive relativity hypothesis.
  6. The truth of specific relativity hypotheses may turn on issues involving the modularity of mind and the degree of modular encapsulation. For example, if the mind is highly modular, finding an influence of one aspect of language or culture of some aspect of cognition (e.g., language comprehension) may tell us little about the influence of other aspects of language or culture on other aspects of cognition (e.g., long-term memory).

3.2 Culture

Culture is perhaps the most central theoretical concept in anthropology, and it is important in many of the other social sciences as well. The nature and role of culture are matters of controversy, but a quite general characterization will suffice here. Culture is socially transmitted from one generation to the next. It includes ideals about how one should live, customs, mores, taken-for-granted common knowledge, systems of production and exchange, ways of coping with illness, disease and death, legal institutions, religion, rituals, rites of passage, myths, taboos, technologies, social hierarchies and status, sexual practices, accepted ways of displaying emotions, marriage, kinship structures, power hierarchies, sports, games, art, architecture, language.

There are always differences in outlooks and beliefs within the same culture, especially in large and heterogeneous ones, and at some point the notion of a culture may begin to blur enough that we introduce notions of like that of a subculture. These also have a certain haziness (we will return to this below), but useful generalizations about particular cultures are still often possible.

Cultural relativism is the thesis that a person's culture strongly influences her modes of perception and thought. Many anthropologists, particularly in the earlier parts of the twentieth century, saw culture as a force that was nearly unlimited in its power to shape human beings. This passage, from the influential American anthropologist Ruth Benedict, is typical:

No man ever looks at the world with pristine eyes. He sees it edited by a definite set of customs and institutions and ways of thinking. Even in his philosophical probings he cannot go behind these stereotypes …The life-history of the individual is first and foremost an accommodation to the patterns and standards traditionally handed down in his community. From the moment of his birth the customs into which he is born shape his experience and behaviour. By the time he can talk, he is the little creature of his culture, and by the time he is grown and able to take part in its activities, its habits are his habits, its beliefs his beliefs, its impossibilities his impossibilities. Every child that is born into his group will share them with him, and no child born into one on the opposite side of the globe can ever achieve the thousandth part (1934, pp. 2-3).

Amorphous debates over pre-logical and pre-literate modes of thought that were once popular have now given way to more detailed and precise work in cross-cultural psychology and cognitive anthropology (see Berry, et al. 1996, Cole, 1996, and D'Andrade, 1995 for good discussions of the two fields). The extent to which cultural forces can shape modes of thought is still not fully understood, but it appears that although there are some modest cognitive differences between cultures, nothing remotely as dramatic as the claims made in some of the earlier literature on cultural relativism have received much support.

3.3 Historical Period

Technology and art are products of their times. So are many concepts, standards, and beliefs. Historical relativism (or historicism, in one of its many meanings) is the view that groups from quite different historical epochs will have different modes of thought. The British philosopher and historian R. G. Collingwood (e.g., 1940, esp. ch. 6) particularly stressed the historical dimension of relativism, but many other thinkers agreed. Karl Mannheim, the founder of the sociology of knowledge, put it this way:

When we attribute to one historical epoch one intellectual world and to ourselves another one, or if a certain historically determined social stratum thinks in categories other than our own, we refer not to the isolated cases of thought content, but to fundamentally divergent thought systems and to widely differing modes of experience and interpretation (1929/1936, p. 57).

Historical differences are typically thought to stem from cultural and linguistic differences, so historical relativism does not add anything radically new to cultural and linguistic relativism. Introducing history as an independent variable makes a new range of cases relevant, however, and it means that historical texts and historiography can be used to study relativistic themes. History has also played a key role in discussions of more local types of relativism, particularly in science.

In his influential book, The Whig Interpretation of History, Herbert Butterfield (1931) made a strong case against the “Wiggish” view that history involves progressive evolution toward where we are now. This picture is often another form of ethnocentric projection, and in fact changes of many sorts occur for many reasons. Still, history sometimes allows us to see earlier modes of thought as precursors to our own, and this opens the door to studies of conceptual change. It also holds out the hope of a sort of self-understanding, some insight into how we came to be the way we are.

3.4 Innate Cognitive Architecture

Nature vs. Nurture

The nature-nurture debate is the perennial dispute over the relative strength of innate biological makeup (nature), on the one hand, and enculturation, socialization, and other forms of learning (nurture), on the other. Both are obviously necessary for normal human life, and the debate has often been confused or oversimplified, with inexact talk about a gene for this or being “wired up” to do that. Still, there is a genuine empirical question about the extent of the malleability vs. the constancy of human nature, about the boundaries of the biologically possible and the degree to which our biological makeup, especially the organization of our nervous systems and brains, underdetermines culture, language, and modes of thought.


During the 1940s and 50s, when behaviorism was dominant in psychology, linguistics, and (perhaps to a lesser extent) the other social sciences, the pendulum had swung sharply to the empiricist (nurture) pole. Very little, save for general learning mechanisms, were thought to be built into the human mind, and so there was a good deal of scope for language and culture to shape modes of thought.


In recent decades the pendulum has swung sharply to the opposite (nature) pole. The pioneering linguist Noam Chomsky emphasized innate linguistic universals, which this led to a picture of deep commonality beneath surface differences in languages. And with the increasing popularity of nativist views in cognitive science, e.g., claims that the mind comes with a number of innate modules, talk of cognitive universals and pre-configured modules is now common. From this perspective, a rich cognitive architecture is “wired in,” so there is less scope for culture or language to influence how we experience or think about the things.

In the last few years, however, even some of cognitive science's founders (e.g., Bruner, 1992) have reacted against what they see as its overemphasis emphasis on information processing and its relative neglect of culture. Culture is now being worked back into the picture, and people are once again asking just how much influence it can have on cognition. Still, although the issues here are difficult and far from settled, a good deal of empirical work does suggest that the human mind comes pre-wired in interesting and important ways (e.g., with predispositions to learn certain kinds of languages, or to recognize human faces). So it may well turn out that at an abstract, but still interesting level, people do in fact think in much the same ways. (We will return to some of these matters below).

Nativism only Bears on Some Types of Relativism

Nativist views of cognition support many sorts of descriptive relativism with respect to human beings. But they raise the possibility that certain aspects of human cognition result from the contingent, often highly accidental, evolutionary history of our species, and if the similarities among human beings stem from contingent features of our brain and our sensory apparatus, creatures with quite different biological makeups might perceive and think in quite different ways. From this perspective, in fact, the contingent features of our cognitive architecture may begin to look like limitations.

Even if human nature is strikingly uniform beneath the veneer of cultural and historical differences, normative issues about objectivity, justification, and truth also remain. Indeed, nativist views can accentuate normative issues, since it is possible that human cognition is less than optimal in various ways; for example, evolutionary selection pressures may have favored quick and tolerably accurate cognitive mechanisms over slower but more accurate ones.

3.5 Choice

If alternative frameworks of central concepts, beliefs, and standards are possible, can we simply decide which ones to adopt? On some accounts it is discretionary, a matter of choice or explicit convention, which categories and principles we employ; this is not to say that it is arbitrary or capricious, since there may be good reasons--e.g., simplicity, ease of use, comprehensiveness--for preferring some choices to others, but we do have some say in the matter. On other accounts, alternatives may be possible in some abstract sense, but they are not live options for us.


At the voluntaristic end of the spectrum we find thinkers urging that there is a great deal of leeway for choice. For example, existentialists like Sartre hold that there are no objective facts about moral values and principles, and that we must select them for ourselves with an existential leap, a fateful existential choice. Many Anglo-American non-cognitivists about ethics, including Ayer, Stevenson, and the early Hare held less portentous versions of a similar view. Going a step further, some of Nietzsche's remarks in his posthumously edited and published Will to Power (1906/1967) (which he might not have endorsed) suggest that many other aspects of cognition are also matters of choice. And, to take a very different figure, Carnap (1950, §2) tells us that we can choose to speak the “thing language,” in which physical objects are central, or a “phenomenalistic language,” in which sense data are.


Writers at the opposite end of the spectrum argue that it is difficult, or even impossible, to make substantial changes in our central concepts, beliefs, and evaluative standards. We cannot simply decide, for example, to begin thinking about the world in completely non-causal terms. Indeed, if our most fundamental concepts and beliefs are part of our biological endowment, it may not be biologically possible to dispense with then. There would be less scope for changing the way we experience and think about colors, for example, if certain aspects of color cognition were determined by the neurophysiology of our visual system (as the opponent-processes theory suggests) than if they were determined by the color lexicon of our native language (as some linguistic relativists supposed).

But many writers who stress nurture over nature also resist the picture of easy alteration. Some even invoke the language of coercion to emphasize the point. For example, some early champions of the linguistic relativity hypothesis employed phrases like ‘linguistic determinism.’ Thus Whorf tells us that “[n]o individual is free to describe nature with absolute impartiality but is constrained to certain modes of interpretation [determined by the language he speaks] even while he thinks himself most free” (1956, p. 214). Benedict makes similar claims for culture, as does Collingwood (1940) for history. Among other things, these writers urge that our central concepts and beliefs permeate our thought so thoroughly that it doesn't even occur to most of us that there could be alternatives.


Between these extremes we find writers who hold that dramatic revisions of frameworks are occasionally possible, but only in exceptional circumstances. Speaking of a scientist's choice to embrace a new paradigm in its early stages, Kuhn tells us that “a decision of that kind can only be made on faith,” and he frequently speaks on accepting a new paradigm in terms of faith and conversion (1970b, p. 158 and pp. 19, 148, 150). Polanyi (1958, pp. 152f) speaks of conversion in a similar context, and when imagining a confrontation between people with very difference cognitive practices. Collingwood (1940, p. 256) speaks of faith in a similar context. And Wittgenstein tells us that “at the end of reasons comes persuasion. (Think of what happens when missionaries convert natives.)” (1969, §612; cf. §92)

Piecemeal Modification

Probably the most popular view among current philosophers is that human beings can only modify their frameworks gradually and that some parts may be utterly immune to revision at any given time. Such claims are often accompanied by an invocation of Neurath's simile[2] of rebuilding a ship at sea: we can change the ship bit-by-bit, relying on the unchanging parts for stability as we proceed, but we cannot rebuild the entire ship all at once.

Similarly, gradual and piecemeal changes in our conceptual framework are possible, but we cannot change large chunks of it all at once, since we would have no concepts or principles to use in working out the transition. For example, we would have no standards to judge whether two proposed modifications were consistent with one another.

3.6 Other Contenders

3.6.1 Scientific Frameworks

In the 1960s many historians and philosophers of science reacted against what they saw as the insufficiently historical and overly formalistic approach of the dominant philosophy of science of their day. The key insurrectionists were Norwood Russell Hanson (1958), Stephen Toulmin (e.g., 1972), Paul Feyerabend (e.g., 1975/1993), and, above all Thomas Kuhn, whose Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1970b, first edition 1962) has sold over a million copies. None of these writers, save Feyerabend in some of his varied moods, viewed themselves as relativists, but many of their views--especially their claims about the theory-ladeness of perception, incommensurability, and the impossibility of determining how well a theory fits reality--suggested relativistic conclusions to many of their readers.

A person's scientific outlook rarely saturates her life to the extent that her native culture and language do, and so the relativistic themes that emerged in their writings were more local and limited than those suggested by linguistic or cultural relativists. The arguments of the new philosophers of science were often more careful and detailed than many previous arguments for relativistic conclusions, and their examples, episodes from the history of science, could be evaluated without having to go to another culture or (often) without having to master an exotic language.

Much of this work, typically without the more relativistic overtones, has been absorbed into mainstream philosophy of science. Relativistic themes continue to surface, however, in the so-called "strong programme" in the sociology of science and in the new fields of science studies and related areas like cultural studies.

3.6.2 Religion

The great French pioneer of sociology, Émile Durkheim, (1858-1917) argued (not terribly convincingly) for the formative power of religion in The Elementary Forms of Religious Life (1912/1995). He held that a great deal of our cognitive and social life is strongly influenced by religion and that concepts as fundamental as genus and species, and even logic itself, have their source in religious thoughts and practices. Durkheim himself thought that human religions were similar enough that these concepts would be the same across cultures, but if we combine his account with a more relativistic picture of actual cultures and religions, we would get a sort of relativism.

And the great German pioneer of sociology, Max Weber (1864-1920), argued that various features of protestantism had led to the an “iron cage” of instrumental rationality. This involves the “disenchantment” of the earlier world, with all its rules, regulations, and the whole dreary apparatus of quantification and everything-by-the-book bureaucracies.

The influence of religion on modes of thought will seem more plausible when we consider cultures where religion plays a more pervasive role than it does in many cultures and sub-cultures in the West. In more traditional cultures there is often no separation of church and state, a priest or shaman may be the ultimate authority on virtually everything, and morality, law, and religion are thoroughly entwined. If the religion is animistic, all of nature may seem alive and capable of causing harm. In such settings, the impact of religion on modes of experience and thought could be quite powerful.

3.6.3 Gender, Race, and Social Status

In many societies members of some ethnic groups, genders, or social classes are treated differently than members of other ethnic groups, genders, and classes. They are thus situated differently, and it is sometimes argued that this can lead to important differences in modes of thought and patterns of evaluation. Furthermore, the argument continues, those in power may, consciously or unconsciously, downplay or suppress the modes and patterns of those who are not, and having ones viewpoints recognized can often be a step toward achieving empowerment and equality.

Marx's account of ideology is one of the earliest views of this sort, but this theme has been developed in various ways in later thinkers. In some cases, e.g., Michel Foucault (1980), these ideas are linked quite intimately to themes of domination and power. A good discussion of many of the relevant issues can be found in the entry on feminist epistemology and philosophy of science.

3.6.4 The Individual

Virtually all versions of relativism that have been defended in any detail treat it as a social phenomenon. We can, however, allow for a subjective version of relativism as limiting case in which each person has her own concepts, epistemic standards, moral principles, or the like. For example, the view that Plato attributes in his dialogue the Theatetus to the Ancient Greek Sophist Protagoras relativizes truth to the individual.


It is possible that various combinations of independent variables (e.g., language and religion) would lead to interesting outcomes, reinforcing one another, neutralizing one another, or interacting in complex and unexpected ways. It is also possible that some of the variables lead to relativistic effects only under certain conditions; this is, after all, how causes typically work.

3.7 Frameworks Revisited


Everyone is a member of many different groups-- tribes, linguistic communities, subcultures, social classes, religious groups, political parties, clans, families--with a variety of perspectives and allegiances. Which groups matter for relativism? The answer is that different species of relativism single out different groups as relevant. The claim that a certain sort of group (e.g., culture, linguistic community) is important for relativism, whereas other sorts of groups (e.g., soccer teams, bridge clubs) are not, is a substantive, descriptive, relativistic thesis that must be defended, or refuted, by empirical evidence.

Our Framework: Who are We?

Different philosophers use different terms for their versions of the more generic notion of a conceptual framework employed here. Terms that have been used in related ways include worldview (Weltanschauung) and categorial scheme. There are also similarities to Wittgenstein's forms of life, various phenomenologists' notions of the life world (Lebenswelt), R. G. Collingwood's sets of absolute presuppositions of a given culture and time, Thomas Kuhn's paradigms, Michel Foucault's epistemes, and Nelson Goodman's world versions. Some of these, e.g., a culture's entire form of life, are quite global, influencing almost all aspects of cognition. Others e.g., paradigms and many world versions, are typically more local; for example, the first involves just a particular style of science during a particular period, and second might involve something as local as a given style of painting.

It would illuminate the general notion of a framework if we were clearer about our own. Just what does it involve? And who are we? In large, heterogeneous, multicultural societies with many subcultures, talk of things like “our morality” involves considerable oversimplification (and often a bit of ethnocentric projection as well). Muslims, evangelical Christians, the Amish, secular humanists, and disaffected teenagers in the inner city doubtless share some moral outlooks, and if we describe their views at a sufficiently abstract level they may look similar. But down at ground level, in the shadows and fog where human action and feeling actually take place, abstract principles at best tell part of the story. At this more elemental level the moral outlooks of such groups differ in ways that can matter a lot. At this level you don't have to go halfway around the world to find moral alternatives; if you live in a large city, you don't even have to go half way across town.

Something similar may be true, though perhaps to a lesser extent, of other relativistic dependent variables like rationality or evidential standards. For example, many members of modern Western societies believe in the existence of a supernatural being and view (what they take to be) its pronouncements as having strong epistemic force, others are more skeptical, and some simply dismiss such beliefs as superstitions.

Furthermore, even if we confine attention to relatively small and homogeneous groups, it is often difficult to say with any precision just what their concepts and evaluative standards amount to. Indeed, philosophers who have spent decades trying to say what “our” standards of rationality involve, what logic (if any) we use, or what such central concepts as causation, person, or justification boil down to are no where near a consensus. In fact, the general project of conceptual analysis that was supposed to answer some of these questions is now widely regarded as a failure.

Given the lack of clarity about our own case, caution is recommended when we hear astonishing claims about the Hopi conception of time, the Trobriand conception of causation, or the other exotic concepts or values or beliefs so often attributed to other groups in discussions of relativism.

Pyramid Relativism and Raft Relativism

On the simplest picture, sets of central beliefs and standards serve as principles that individuate frameworks. We might call this pyramid relativism. It may be tempting to view such principles as akin to the basic beliefs in foundationalist theories of knowledge. This would not be completely wrong, but it may suggest a model of central beliefs as axioms that are used to justify further claims, where these on construed on the model of theorems, whereas the role of central beliefs is more to provide a structure within which experience and thought can occur. We will encounter this view briefly below.

But a rather different picture of the structure of frameworks is also possible, one in which the notion of centrality is a matter of degree and in which no single set of beliefs or principles serves to individuate a framework. This picture fits naturally with a more coherentist conception of justification in which each belief may receive support from others. We might call this raft relativism, since (as suggested by Neurath's boat), there are no essential framework principles and all beliefs can receive support from other beliefs, although some may be much more central than others.

Pyramid relativism suggests that our concepts, beliefs, and standards are more precise and well defined than they actually seem to be. Such accounts also fit most naturally with a foundationalist picture of justification, and this picture doesn't accurately depict many of our actual epistemic practices. Furthermore, features like centrality and depth come in degrees, and we would be hard pressed to name the foundational principles of our own framework. Raft relativism can accommodate these facts more easily than pyramid relativism can.

Raft frameworks are more difficult to individuate than pyramid frameworks, but this is not clearly a drawback, since there is no reason to think that there is always a clear fact of the matter as to whether two groups have the same culture, language or, more generally, framework. Often it is more enlightening to simply note the most salient similarities and differences between groups, without worrying about thresholds or sharp yes-or-no answers.[3]

4. Arguments For Relativism

The various types of relativism are often assumed rather than argued for, and when they are defended the arguments on their behalf vary greatly in quality. We have touched on several arguments for various species of relativism above; in this section we consider the most common arguments in more detail.

4.1 Perception is Theory-Laden

We discussed perceptual relativism earlier, so here we only need to recall how arguments for it typically proceed. The basic claim is that perception is not, contrary to what have supposed, a neutral physiological process that leads all normal human beings to perceive the same thing in the same way when they gaze in the same direction. Instead what we see (hear, feel, etc.) in any particular situation is partially determined by the concepts, beliefs, and expectations we bring to the situation.

Claims about top-down processing and theory-ladeness are descriptive claims about the human perceptual system, and by themselves do not entail any normative conclusions. But, various writers add, the way that observations are colored by our beliefs and expectations makes it difficult, perhaps even impossible, to adjudicate between competing scientific theories or paradigms, forms of life, or the like.

Many philosophers of science had believed that a theory-neutral observation language existed which could be used to frame theory-neutral descriptions of scientific observations. Others spoke of a given, non-conceptual, element in experience. If such claims were correct, then theory-neutral observations, a sort of perceptual Archimedean point, could be used to adjudicate competing claims in a way that would not beg the question in favor of one party and to the detriment of the other.

Such arguments were given a prominent role by philosophers of science like Norwood Russell Hanson (1958), Thomas Kuhn (1962), and Paul Feyerabend (1975/1993) argue that scientific observation is theory-laden. Their claims were important because many philosophers of science had supposed that there is a observation language that could be used to describe experience in a neutral way, independent of any theories. the existence of such a language would weaken many relativistic claims, since it would a neutral, non-question begging perspective from which we adjudicate the claims of competing conceptions of the world. And many other writers, from anthropologists to art historians, make related points, urging that perception is influenced by various aspects of language or culture.

For example, in a much-cited thought experiment, Hanson (1958, Ch. 1) asks us to imagine Tycho Brahe (an advocate of a geocentric picture of the solar system) and Johannes Kepler (an advocate of a heliocentric view) as they gaze to the east at sunrise. Although they do see the same object, the sun, Hanson tells us they see it very differently. Tycho sees the sun rising, whereas Kepler sees the horizon dipping or falling away from the fixed and immobile sun. Hence there is no neutral observational framework that allows them to determine who is correct.

Such claims are sometimes used (often in conjunction with other premises) to support various species of normative relativism, especially normative epistemological relativism, by noting the fundamental role of observation in forming and justifying our beliefs. At the very least, such arguments would eliminate simple pictures of justification as based in perception which would, if correct, be a serious obstacle to relativism (responses so such arguments are discussed below in 5.2).

4.2 Alternative Frameworks are Incommensurable

In our discussion of incommensurability and semantic holism incommensurability and semantic holism we noted the view that the meanings of a person's words and sentences (or the contents of her concepts and beliefs) are determined by the overall role the words or concepts play in her culture, scientific framework, linguistic community, or the like. So, the argument continues, if two frameworks are substantially different from one another, the concepts and linguistic meanings of one will not line up well enough with those of the other for members of the members of the respective groups to even discuss the same things. For example, we may be told, earlier concepts of mass, or rights, even logical concepts can differ so much from ours that we cannot accurately interpret their users as having any phrases or concepts that are genuine counterparts of our words or concepts or, indeed, as having any beliefs about mass or about rights or logical consequence.

Such arguments turn on claims about the meanings of words and concepts, but they are sometimes buttressed by claims about perception. For example, Feyerabend (1975/1993, p. 166) tells us that “Given appropriate stimuli, but different systems of classification (different ‘mental sets’), our perceptual apparatus may produce perceptual objects which cannot be easily compared.”

If incommensurability arguments are sound, they support weak normative truth-value relativism, because they tell us that if the two groups' concepts and beliefs differ in fundamental ways, the subject matters they can discuss are so different that they cannot be compared (responses to such arguments are discussed in §5.4).

5. Arguments Against Relativism

Different responses are appropriate to different versions of relativism. Although there are a few a priori, philosophical arguments designed to show that certain sorts of cognitive or evaluative differences are in fact impossible, most species of descriptive relativism are empirical claims that must be supported, or discredited, with empirical evidence. Most species of normative relativism, by contrast, require a more purely philosophical response. The most damning objection to the more dramatic forms of normative relativism (like truth-value relativism) is that they are self-refuting, but other objections have been leveled against various versions relativism, and in this section we consider some of the more compelling ones.

The first four responses on the list below are targeted primarily at various forms of descriptive relativism; the remaining responses are targeted primarily at various forms of normative relativism, although empirical considerations enter here and there.

5.1 No Facts of the Matter

If there are no concepts or beliefs, then groups cannot differ with respect to their concepts or beliefs and descriptive claims about the relativity of concepts or beliefs cannot get off the ground. In such cases it also makes little sense ask normative questions about whether some concepts or beliefs are better or more correct than others.

Although he popularized phrases like ‘ontological relativity’, we saw above that Quine opposes relativism with respect concepts, beliefs, and meanings precisely because he holds that there are no facts of the matter about such things. Much of Quine's skepticism about minds and meanings and mental representations is based on non-discredited behaviorist assumptions, but there are more current anti-realist views about the mind that would also nip many versions of relativism in the bud. The best-known example is eliminative materialism, the view that our everyday talk of concepts and beliefs and intentions is part of a defective theory that should disappear as science progresses. But the thoroughgoing anti-realism about concepts, beliefs, and other representations required to discredit most versions of relativism is very counterintuitive, and few philosophers find the existing arguments for such views very compelling.

5.2 Perception is not Hopelessly Theory-Laden

Descriptive perceptual relativism is an empirical claim about human beings, and a common response to it is that although human perception is somewhat theory-laden, it is not as theory-laden as more extreme relativists often maintain. Furthermore, the reply continues, to the extent that descriptive perceptual relativism has been used to support various types of normative relativism, the limits of theory-ladeness weakens the case for them.

Controversy persists among vision scientists over the extent to which our concepts and beliefs and expectations influence the content of our perceptions, but the cumulative force of a large number of examples and experiments leaves little doubt that they sometimes play an important role. Still, there are limits; we cannot, on pain of hallucination, see just anything we hope or expect or are primed to see. Once again, the question is whether there is room between two extremes for an interesting version of relativism.

Science and Observation

As noted above, various philosophers have argued that perception is theory-laden in a way that can make it difficult, perhaps even impossible, to use our observations to adjudicate between competing frameworks. For example, in a much-cited thought experiment, Hanson (1958, Ch. 1) asks us to imagine Tycho Brahe (an advocate of a geocentric picture of the solar system) and Johannes Kepler (an advocate of a heliocentric view) as they gaze to the east at sunrise. Although they do see the same object, the sun, Hanson tells us they see it very differently. Tycho sees the sun rising, whereas Kepler sees the horizon dipping or falling away from the fixed and immobile sun.

But Hanson's claims far outrun any historical evidence. Many people today think of the earth as moving and the sun as standing still, but almost four centuries after Kepler's work we still speak of the sun rising and setting, and it looks and feels that way to many of us even now. More importantly, by Kepler's time all responsible parties to this debate knew that things would look exactly the same to observers on the surface of the Earth, whether Tycho or Kepler (or Ptolemy or, we may now add, Einstein) was right about the layout of the cosmos.

Culture and Perception

It is also an empirical question just how much (if at all) the mechanisms involved in top-down perceptual processing lead members of different cultures to perceive the things differently. As with all cross-cultural work, especially with cultures that are very different from our own, experiments here are vulnerable to many mishaps, and so it is not surprising that much remains uncertain. Current evidence does suggest that culture and language can influence perception; for example, there is evidence that people tend to perceive things in ways that are influenced by the manner in which they have learned to think in order to function efficiently in their ecological setting. But large influences of culture or language or beliefs on perception have yet to be documented (click here for more detail).


A neutral, pure sense-datum language is indeed a myth, but most evidence suggests that the familiar world of physical objects is usually neutral enough to allow for tests of scientific theories and at least passable communication across cultural divides. Such empirical claims, which of course may require revision as new evidence is found, only bear on descriptive perceptual relativism in the case of human beings. They leave open the possibility that other intelligent creatures--particularly those with quite different sensory modalities like echolocation or delicate sensitivity to magnetic fields--might perceive the world in quite different ways. They also leave open many of the issues involving normative perceptual relativism.

5.3 Cognitive Architecture and Cognitive Universals

To the extent that predispositions to use certain central concepts (e.g., physical object, person, causation), hold certain central beliefs (e.g., at least some events have causes, human beings have intentions), or employ certain inference patterns (e.g., induction by enumeration) are innate, it tells against descriptive relativism with respect to those concepts, beliefs, or styles of reasoning. It is an empirical matter whether human infants come into the world with such predispositions, but there is emerging evidence that they do and, indeed, that there are at least some important linguistic, cognitive, and cultural universals.

The evidence comes from several fields.

Noam Chomsky's emphasis on innate linguistic universals led to a picture of deep commonality beneath surface differences in natural languages. Linguistics is particularly important, because universals were first defended here, and many languages have now been carefully studied from this point of view.

Developmental Psychology
In the last two or three decades developmental psychologists have devised several ingenious techniques for studying the perceptions and concepts of infants, and there is growing evidence that human neonates arrive in the world with strong propensities to perceive and think in certain ways. For example, they are strongly predisposed to think of the world in terms of physical objects that behave in predictable ways (e.g., their paths of motion are continuous, they do not disappear when people quit looking at them), persons with intension, and so on (e.g., Xu and Carey, 1996; Spelke and Newport, 1998; Chiang and Wynn, 2000).

Some workers in cognitive anthropology and cross-cultural psychology have argued for the existence of rather intricate cultural or human universals. Frequent candidates, often said to be found in all known cultures (though not necessarily in all individuals), include the use of tools, the differentiation of sex roles, having myths and legends, music and dance, and common facial expressions of certain emotions (e.g., smiling when happy). To the extent that there is a fairly rich and detailed set of human universals, a common core of human nature, it places important limits on descriptive relativism with respect to human beings.[4]

5.3.1 Normative Mileage from Factual Consensus?

Claims about human universals bear most directly on descriptive relativism, and then only with respect to humans, but they can also arise in discussions of normative issues. One popular idea is that evolution weeded out genotypes that built people who got things badly wrong; the process favored a cognitive architecture that implements normatively sound modes of perceiving and reasoning. Hence, the mere fact that certain concepts or beliefs survived in our species is reason to think that they are pretty close to being right. Thus the psychologist Donald Campbell speaks of natural selection as “validating the categories” (1974, p. 444).

Such claims have their critics. Some of the criticism is based on general critiques of certain kinds of adaptationist reasoning (e.g., Gould and Lewontin, 1979), but even many thinkers who do not object to adaptationism in principle have doubts about such claims. Thus, it is often pointed out that evolution rarely has an opportunity to design the best. It can only work with organisms as they already are, and kludges that are prone to certain kinds of errors may have been the best it could do under the circumstances. Furthermore, evolution might be willing to trade a propensity to certain kinds of error for other adaptations, e.g., for perceptual or conceptual mechanisms that are fast and automatic. It would probably be more adaptive to classify some nonpredators as predators, for example, than to take more time getting things right, since greater accuracy here might be purchased at the cost of an increased likelihood of being eaten.

Debate over these issues often has an all-or-nothing flavor, but more nuanced approaches are possible. In his program for the rational analysis of human cognition, the psychologist John R. Anderson (e.g., 1990) has made a detailed attempt to explain various aspects of human cognition on the assumption that they are well adapted to the environment, i.e., that they are optimized with respect to specific criteria of adaptive importance. And in a series of highly original papers, the cognitive psychologist Roger Shepard (e.g., 1994) has explored ways in which various perceptual and cognitive universals may be adaptive reflections of certain very general features of the world around us.

On a more philosophical note, Christopher Stephens (2001) has argued that under some conditions having reliable belief-forming mechanisms might confer a selective advantage, while under other conditions it might not, and he has developed a decision-theoretic model that tells us which to expect when. Of course, it is always important to bear in mind that evolution involves more forces than just natural selection, and it is possible that countervailing, non-selective evolutionary forces (e.g., genetic drift, migration) would swamp the effects of selection even in cases where it favored having true beliefs or using extremely reliable patterns of inference.

5.4 Semantic Realism

5.4.1 Reference and Relativism

Reference or denotation is an especially important species of meaning. It is standardly viewed as a relation between linguistic expressions, on the one hand, and things and properties in the world, on the other. The thing or property that a linguistic expression (or, on more mentalistic accounts, concept) refers to is called its referent or denotation.

Reference is sometimes thought to provide a way to break out of a group's language and concepts and beliefs. Several early opponents of incommensurability theses in the philosophy of science argued that just as two witnesses in a courtroom could have different beliefs about a single person--the defendant--while still referring to her, two scientists could have rather different beliefs about mass or genes without the denotation of ‘mass’ or ‘gene’ changing at all. Moreover, some philosophers have argued, even in cases where terminology may change, scientists may use words that apply to one and the same physical magnitude; for example, Earman and Fine (1977) argue that Newton's word ‘mass’ has the same meaning as our phrase ‘proper mass’.

Similarly, it may be argued, members of two cultures may have words or phrases that refer to the same kinds of things (e.g., rabbits) or to the same specific thing (e.g., that rabbit by the elm tree). And when this is so, the denotations of their words provide a common denominator that allows different groups to break out of their frameworks and to talk to each other about a common, objective world.

Partisans of incommensurability often responded by claiming that the denotation of a linguistic expression, and not just its meaning in some more amorphous sense, is determined by its place in an overall theory or web of beliefs. Such claims rely on what philosophers of language call descriptivist theories of reference, according to which a word's denotation is determined by the descriptions or the contents of the beliefs that constitute the word's meaning, intension, or sense. Descriptivist theories have come under withering attack from partisans of direct theories of reference, who argue that words and concepts are attached more directly to their denotations, without the mediation of a cluster of descriptions. Hence, it may be prudent for the semantic relativist to grant that reference is more like the advocates of direct theories contend, but to hold that it refers to things in a world relativized to a framework (this is an instance of the second strategy below).

5.4.2 Semantic Externalism and Relativism

There is a more general picture about the meanings of words and (with minor adaptations) concepts that has a similar anti-relativistic flavor. About twenty-five years ago the American philosophy Hilary Putnam presented a thought experiments in which we were invited to imagine twin-earth, a planet as much like earth as possible except that every place there is water on earth the counterpart of that place on twin-earth has a liquid that seems very much like water, but which in fact has some complicated chemical makeup, call it XYZ.

Putnam argues that the word ‘water’ has a different meaning when used by citizens of twin-earth than it does here on earth and that the external, chemical composition of the liquid affects the word's meaning. The moral we are encouraged to draw from this, and related examples developed by Tyler Burge and others, is that meanings just are not in the head. At least not completely. Many philosophers found these examples intuitively compelling, and so they accepted one or another version of semantic externalism, according to which the meanings of many words (or the contents of many concepts and thoughts) are at least partially individuated by environmental and social factors (like the chemical structure of XYZ).

If such views are right, it seems natural to conclude that the meanings of words and the contents of concepts and thoughts often involve features (like the molecular constitution of a liquid) in an of an objective, mind-independent, non-relativistic world that play a vital role in determining the meanings of our words and the contents of our thoughts.

The issues here are complex, and we will just note two responses the relativist might make. First, although these thought experiments provide good support for their suggested conclusions, it is not conclusive, and the relativist could simply reject Putnam's intuitions about the roles of various external factors in determining linguistic meanings.

Second, the relativist could opt for a relativistic reconstrual, arguing that the meanings of many of our words and concepts do involve external factors, but that these are in turn shaped by, or relativized to, frameworks. On most accounts frameworks are shared, social things whose details are not always transparent to their users. So, the relativist might argue, once we adopt a framework in which things can be individuated in terms of chemical structure, there could be facts about chemical structure that we have yet to discover, and these could affect the meanings of our words and concepts. In short, the relativist can argue for a world-relative externalism.

5.4.3 Platonism and Relativism

Platonism is a family of views that get their name because they involve entities--propositions, properties, sets--which, like Plato's Forms, are held to be abstract, immutable things that exist outside space and time. On many platonistic approaches, concepts express abstract properties and beliefs are relations between people and abstract propositions. This suggests a way around some types of relativism, since people in quite different cultures could have many of the same beliefs (because they could believe the same abstract propositions), and a belief would be true just in case the immutable proposition it expresses is true.

The relativist may reply that platonistic accounts lead to severe difficulties in epistemology and semantics. The problem is that we are physical organisms living in a spatio-temporal world, and we cannot interact causally (or in any other discernible way) with abstract, causally inert things. Moreover, few people are aware of having any special cognitive faculty that puts them in touch with a timeless realm of abstract objects, neuroscientists have never found any part of the brain that subserves such an ability, such a view is not suggested by what is known about the ways children acquire concepts and beliefs, and nothing in physics suggests any way in which a physical system (the brain) can make any sort of contact with causally inert, non-physical objects. Moreover, if our minds cannot make epistemic contact with such things, it is difficult to see how our words and linguistic practices can make semantic contact with them.

None of this proves that abstract propositions don't exist, but it shows it isn't obvious that they do. There have been few debates between relativists and platonists over such matters, however, perhaps because the two views lie so far apart that their proponents cannot easily engage one another.

5.5 The Mediation Problem: Concepts aren't Veils

A common line of argument for several species of relativism, including truth-value relativism and reality relativism, turns on what we might call the mediation problem. This argument takes various forms, but the fundamental idea is that we are trapped in our concepts or beliefs or epistemic standards or, more generally, trapped in our frameworks in a way that precludes our checking to see if they match reality. And once we add that alternative frameworks of concepts, beliefs, or standards are possible, the relativist urges, we are well on our way to relativism. One especially common version of this argument focuses on concepts. We cannot think without concepts (or talk without words), and so we cannot get outside our concepts (and words) to assess their fidelity to the world as it really is, independent of language and thought.

Such arguments encourage the picture of concepts as intermediaries that stand between us and the world “out there.” The model of mediation at work here is similar to representative realism, a position once commonly attributed to John Locke (1632-1704), in which ideas are always interposed between our experience and cognition, on the one hand, and the outside world, on the other. On this model there is indeed a problem of knowing whether our thoughts and ideas accurately represent external reality, and it is no accident that such views tend toward skepticism. I am trapped behind the veil of my ideas, and so I can never discover, even in principle, whether my ideas of dogs or chairs correspond to anything out there in the world.

But, the anti-relativist may respond, representational realism is the wrong model for conceptual mediation. In ordinary circumstances my concept of a dog allows me to individuate and reidentify dogs, to recognize and reason about them, but it does not stand between me and Rover. Under normal conditions I can just look and see that there is a dog in front of me.

To be sure, different frameworks of concepts are possible, at least to some degree, and of course we cannot talk without language or think without concepts. But, this response continues, once we have a battery of concepts, truth often is completely clear and perfectly objective. If we don't accept the view that there is just One True Story of the world told in terms of The One Right Lexicon of Concepts, we do not need to check to see if our concepts are the right ones. Rather, we need to check to see whether our beliefs or sentences (framed in terms of our concepts or words) are true. And it is not necessary to go to a “neutral cosmic exile,” or to find an “Archimedean point” outside all language and thought, in order to do this. It is something we do all the time, right from where we are; once I have the concept of a dog, it is often obviously and unproblematically true that there is a dog in the corner.

As always, relativists have various rejoinders e.g., that when we factor in the framework-relativity of central beliefs and epistemic standards, we may be trapped in our frameworks in more sinister ways. But there is no quick and simple argument from the necessity of some concepts (or other) for experience and thought, even together with the possibility (at least up to a point) of different frameworks of concepts, to the conclusion that we are ineluctably trapped in a way that leads to any of the more insidious versions of relativism.

5.6 Going off the Deep End: Extrapolation into Unintelligibility?

Relativistic conclusions are sometimes based on claims about the exotic beliefs and practices of distant cultures or on thought-experiments in which we are encouraged to imagine (putative) dramatic alternatives to our own modes of evaluation and thought. But the fact that we can coherently imagine beliefs and standards and practices that differ in small ways from our own does not mean that we can coherently imagine ones that differ in massive ways. Efforts to extrapolate from genuine, but modest, differences to vast differences may simply lead to incoherence.

We can, for example, imagine people who reject the law of excluded middle and people who do not, and we can probably imagine one group using intuitionistic logic where another uses classical logic. But we cannot easily make sense of the idea of a group that regards conjunction introduction and elimination as blatantly fallacious. And if attempts at dramatic extrapolation beyond our familiar modes of thought fail to reveal real possibilities, they do not support relativism after all.

Making Sense of Things

To doubt, to raise questions, to offer justification, to engage in any sort of rational activity requires the possession of some concepts and beliefs and epistemic standards that we use to perform the activity. Perhaps we can replace many, or most, or (some tell us) even all of our beliefs and epistemic standards, provided that we modify them bit-by-bit over a long stretch of time. But we cannot make drastic revisions in our entire corpus of beliefs and standards all at once. This would be like dismantling Neurath's ship all at once while at sea (see footnote 2); among other things, it would leave us without any standards to judge whether two proposed modifications were consistent with one another, whether one provided evidence for another, whether one explained another.

Trying to understand vastly different norms and practices requires us to do something similar in imagination. To get a genuine feel for what it would be like to think in a vastly different way requires us to bracket more and more of our own cognitive resources, to jettison our very standards of understanding and intelligibility, and this leaves us bereft of resources for understand anything at all. For example, a vital core of our reasoning involves the use of logical principles like modus ponens and conjunction elimination. These are very nearly constitutive of our ability to think, and attempts to imagine our way into forms of reasoning that constantly flout these principles leave us dumbfounded, rather than with an enriched sense of the possibilities. Such projects ask us to make sense of alternatives that require us to abandon our resources for making sense of anything whatsoever.

Partisans of more local versions of relativism may concede the point, urging that it leaves open the possibility that more limited thought experiments may be more successful. For example, trying to imagine a morality rather different from our own needn't deprive us of logic or some of our other standards of rationality, so the project is not obviously self-subverting.

When it comes to more global versions of relativism the more extreme relativist may reply that our inability to make sense of various alternatives now does little to show they are impossible or incoherent, because what we can make sense of or imagine is itself historically and culturally (and doubtless biologically) conditioned. The limits to conceivability depend partly on our current concepts, beliefs, and epistemic standards. Before the nineteenth century most people believed non-Euclidean geometries to be impossible, even incoherent, but this is no longer true.

Alternative Standards aren't all that Different

In some cases we can make sense of modes of thought and reasoning that are somewhat different from our own, but it is often easy to overestimate just how different they are. For example, even professional philosophers, economists, and mathematicians in our own culture champion somewhat different normative models that sometimes offer conflicting advice. Thus we find alternative logics (classical logic, intuitionistic logic, and many others), probability theories (e.g., the classical theory, Shafer's belief functions), schools of statistics (e.g., Fisher's, Neyman and Pearson's, the ill-motivated blend of the two often taught today), and decision theories (e.g., evidential decision theories, various causal decision theories, regret theory). And if the experts can't agree about which model is best, the relativist may ask, how can we expect to find any solid ground in the area?

But competing normative models they needn't be viewed as package deals to be accepted in all-or-none fashion. Usually some aspects of a model will be more compelling and defensible than others, and when it comes to this more solid core, many of the competing models agree. For example, classical and intuitionist logic disagree about whether the law of excluded middle is valid, but there is no logical system (with any adherents) in which modus ponens is invalid. Similarly, although there are alternative normative models of probability, none of them permits a conjunction to be more probable than either of its conjuncts.

Even when there is no uniquely correct answer to a problem, it doesn't follow that every possible answer is equally good. This is reflected in the fact that when competing models do not agree on a precise answer, they often agree that the answer falls within a certain range. We may overlook the large measure of overlap because it is so obvious it goes without saying, while the areas of difference seem much more interesting.

5.6.1 Live Options

Where we can go next depends on where we are now. The bare, abstract possibility of an alternative mode of evaluation or thought does not mean that it is a live option for us, here and now. Indeed, even if we can make sense of an alternative and would like to adopt it, it doesn't follow that we can. There are several reasons why this is so.

For one thing, as Bernard Williams (1986) notes, cultures provide contexts that make certain ways of life possible and others impossible. The social and cultural structure no longer exist anywhere today that would enable someone to live the life or think the thoughts of a Greek Bronze Age chief or a medieval samurai. Or, to take a rather different sort of case, some cognitive and evaluative options are probably too complex for human beings to even grasp; among other things, the rather severe limitations on human working memory and the fact that our neurons react rather slowly place some kinds of concepts and reasoning beyond our reach. You can't get there from here.

The fact that we cannot currently understand certain (putative) alternatives is sometimes taken to show that they are not really possible at all, but such arguments turn a verificationism and anthropomorphism that are as implausible here as anywhere else. Arguments concerning conceivability and cognitive options are often inconclusive, however, partly because the limits to the humanly or biologically possible are difficult enough to chart, and the margins of absolute coherence or possibility are even more uncertain.

Should Merely Abstract Possibilities Matter?

When something isn't a live option for us we do not face practical worries about whether to adopt it, but it doesn't follow that learning about it shouldn't affect how we think about things. Realizing that if we had been born in a very different time and place many of the things that now seem obvious and important to us would have seemed implausible or trivial, while things that now seem implausible or trivial might have seemed obvious and important, can reinforce our sense of the contingency of our current forms of evaluation and thought. This in turn can affect our normative views, because it can undermine our confidence, in our more reflective moments, that the (apparent) obviousiousness or inevitability of a principle or a belief ensures that it is right or true.

5.7 Transcendental Arguments

Transcendental arguments are often characterized as arguments designed to show that some obvious feature of experience or knowledge presupposes our having certain concepts and beliefs. The most famous transcendental arguments were developed by the German philosopher Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) in the Critique of Pure Reason. His aim was to justify our use of the twelve central concepts he called categories (e.g., causation, substance) and our belief in certain principles (e.g., that every event has a cause), which are framed in terms of the categories.

Kant's arguments are designed to do two things. First, they are intended to show that all finite creatures who experience things as being in space and time must think of the world in terms of central concepts like object and property, causation, reality, negation, possibility, and so on (although Kant doesn't always mean by these exactly what we would mean now). Furthermore, such creatures must regulate their thought by the principles associated with these concepts (e.g., they must assume that every event is caused). In short, certain concepts and beliefs are necessary or indispensable for experience and knowledge.

Second, Kant's arguments are intended to show that we are correct or justified in using these concepts and holding these beliefs. Events really do have causes or, as Kant puts it, the concept of causation has “objective validity.” Kant saw these two aspects of his arguments as inseparable, but it will be useful here to focus on them separately; we may call the first the indispensability aspect and the second the justificatory aspect.

Although Kant's one-time student (and one-time friend) Johann Gottfried Herder (1744-1803), and Kant's neighbor and friend Johann Georg Hamann (1730-88) were busy sowing the seeds of relativism in Königsberg, right in Kant's backyard, their claims would only later find a following, and Kant himself was not much concerned with such views. Still, if the indispensability aspects of Kant's arguments were sound, there would be a common core of thought that is indispensable, necessary, immune to revision, and invariant across all creatures remotely like us. This would provide a purely philosophical, a priori refutation of descriptive relativists' claims that different groups do--or even that different groups might--lack concepts like causation or get by without thinking that events have causes.

Furthermore, if the justificatory aspects of Kant's arguments were sound, they would answer the normative relativist by showing that the use of these concepts and principles is justified. Moreover, they would justify our modes of thought from within, without any yearning to escape to some mythical Archimedean point in a futile effort to justify them from the outside.

Kant's arguments are subject to a enormous scholarly dispute, but the basic claim is that finite creatures (like us) who experience things as being in space and time cannot have even a rudimentary self-consciousness or sense of a temporal history--cannot have any coherent experience at all--unless they are aware of an objective world. Dispensing with Kant's jargon, the general view is that coherent temporal experience is possible only if it is experience of a world of physical objects with determinate extensive and intensive properties, each of which has a definite location in a single, unified (Euclidean) space and a single unified time, and in which every event has a cause and each object causally interacts with all of the rest.

All of this sounds a little too good to be true. The most immediate difficulty is that many of the things Kant held to be necessarily true no longer seem true at all. It is no longer possible to maintain that it is necessarily true and knowable a priori that physical space is Euclidean. Furthermore, the special theory of relativity tells us that time is not unified in the strong sense that Kant supposed and that not all objects can causally interact with each other. And on the usual interpretations (most other than David Bohm's), quantum theory tells us that determinism fails and that objects need not always have determinate locations in space and time or determinate magnitudes (like a particular momentum or energy or spin).

The justificatory aspects of Kant's arguments depend on his doctrine of transcendental idealism, the claim that space and time and, hence, spatio-temporal objects and occurrences, do not exist in the world as it really is, independently of how we think about it. But Kant's defense of this thesis is almost universally agreed to be unsound. Indeed, the view that the world as it really is, independently of how we know and experience it, is not spatial or even temporal is very difficult to understand, much less believe.

5.7.1 Two Types of Retrenchment

Although few philosophers have endorsed all of the details of Kant's philosophy, many later thinkers tried to adapt various aspects of his approach to their own ends. We briefly note two general approaches here. The first, like Kant's own work, would tell against many versions of relativism. But when it comes to relativism Kantian themes are a double-edged sword, and the second approach has, ironically, often been used to support various relativistic theses.

Necessity without Construction

In Individuals Sir Peter Strawson (1959) attempts to salvage a scaled-down Kantianism that does not depend on transcendental idealism. Strawson believes his arguments show both the indispensability and justifiability of certain modes of thought, roughly that we employ a framework of physical objects and persons that exist in a single, unified space and time.

Barry Stroud (1968) makes a compelling case that without something very much like transcendental idealism Strawson's arguments at best show that certain modes of thought are inevitable for us. For example, we may not be able to help believing in the existence of objects in an external world, but it doesn't follow that this belief is correct. If the indispensability aspects of Strawson's arguments worked they would still show that various sorts of descriptive relativism are untenable, but many philosophers now believe that although he shows that certain ways of dispensing with concepts like those of physical objects (as in his ingenious universe of sounds in ch. 2), he fails to show that no ways of dispensing with them could work. Hence, he doesn't even show these concepts to be indispensable.

Construction without Necessity

Strawson tries to retain some of the indispensability aspects of Kant's arguments while abandoning Kant's transcendental idealism. Other philosophers tried the reverse, agreeing with Kant that the mind does play an essential role in shaping the structure of experience and knowledge (although few philosophers go so far as to hold that the mind literally contributes all aspects of space and time), while abandoning the indispensability aspects of Kant's work.

The basic idea here is to endorse Kant's claim that a person's central concepts and beliefs play a large role in structuring the world as they know it, but to argue that rather different frameworks of concepts and beliefs can be used for this task. Different historical periods or cultures may have rather different central concepts and beliefs and standards, i.e., different frameworks, and when they do, this will lead their members to construct their worlds in rather different ways. Views of this sort, which still have their proponents, were developed by thinkers as diverse as William James (e.g., 1907, esp. Lecture 5), C. I. Lewis (1923, 1929), Hans Reichenbach (1920), Ernst Cassirer (e.g., 1923), R. G. Collingwood (e.g., 1940), Rudolf Carnap (e.g., 1950) and to some extent the Wittgenstein of On Certainty (1969). In most cases the debt to Kant was quite explicit, and one Kantian theme running through many of these discussions is that a group's central principles and concepts provide something like conditions for the posibility of knowledge; the unKantian part is that the principles and concepts are not fixed and immutable.[5]

It is a great irony that Kant, a supreme objectivist and champion of the Enlightenment who would have been repelled by virtually any form of relativism, introduced an idea that came to play a pivotal role in many relativistic arguments, including arguments for reality relativism, the strongest version of relativism that there is.

5.8 Understanding and Charitable Construal

A number of philosophers and social scientists, including W. V. O. Quine (1960, ch. 2), Donald T. Campbell (1964), Martin Hollis (1967), and Donald Davidson (e.g., 1974), have argued that we can only understand or interpret others if they largely agree with us about what is true, reasonable, justified or the like.

Davidson's discussion is the most detailed and the most well-known. He argues that we must employ a principle of charity if we are to interpret or understand the members of a newly-discovered alien culture (or anyone else, for that matter). Without worrying about detailed formulations for a moment, the principle counsels us to interpret others in a way that makes as many of their beliefs true as we can.

The point is not merely philosophical. In a methodological discussion of his cross-cultural work on visual illusions (Segal, Campbell, and Herskovits, 1966), Campbell (1964) stresses the need for comprehension checks. He and his coworkers used pictures of lines of various colors, lengths, and orientations, and it was only after their informants correctly identified which of two lines were longer, which more slanted, and so on that the experiment could begin. Without such agreement, it would be impossible to go on to test for susceptibility to illusions, because the results could not be interpreted as showing that the subject was talking about the same things that the experimenter was asking about. As Campbell puts it:

It turns out that the anthropologist's main cue for achieved communication is similarity between the response of the other to a stimulus and the response which he himself would make. Disagreement turns out to be a sign of communication failure (1964, p. 37).

Although many writers agree that something like a principle of charity is right, they disagree about the details. A recurring criticism is that some kinds of agreement (e.g., agreement about physical objects in the immediate environment) matter more than others (e.g., agreement about the more subtle aspects of religion), so simply aiming to maximize or optimize the degree to which others agree with us is insufficiently discriminating. Still, in retrospect it appears that many writers had the same general point in mind: in order to understand others we must assume that many of their beliefs about most obvious things (e.g., that there is a rabbit in front of them) are true or at least sensible (by our lights), that they hold many beliefs that we would hold if we were in their circumstances, and that they reason in ways not too different from the ways that we reason.

But how could we possibly know, without actual empirical investigation, that others will agree with much of what we think? Well, the response goes, suppose that I point to a rabbit and my informant says ‘Gavagai’. Unless I assume that she sees what I see, takes me to be asking a question about it, and intends her answer to be relevant and true, I have no reason to interpret any of her behavior as evidence that ‘Gavagai’ means ‘Rabbit’. And if I can't get a line on her beliefs about salient objects right there in front of us, how can I ever come to understand her when we turn to more abstruse matters like ethics or religion? Or consider a few of the agreements involved with Campbell's comprehension checks: we require agreement about what lines are, which figure the experimenter is pointing to, that the experimenter is asking a question and hopes for an answer, and a host of other things that are so obvious they are easily overlooked.

In short, the argument concludes, it is not that successful translation and interpretation just often happen to disclose a good measure of agreement. A good measure of agreement is a precondition for successful translation and interpretation.

Morals for Relativism

If something like the principle of charity is right, it would place rough limits on the amount of conceptual or epistemic diversity that translation or interpretation could reveal. But the argument from charity does not show that there couldn't be groups with concepts and beliefs very different from our own, so different, perhaps, that we couldn't even understand or express one another's views. The fact that we cannot translate what we think might be a group's language or understand what we think might be their mental life only tells against the claims that they have a language and a mental life if some dubious version of verificationism, according to which there could only be conceptual differences if we could discover them, is right.

Davidson has also used the principle of charity to defend the normative thesis that any creature capable of having beliefs at all must have mostly true beliefs. But even if this is so, it leaves open the possibility of a weak version of a truth-value relativism in which the sets of beliefs of two groups are so different that there is very little overlap between them.

Finally, the principle of charity precludes the discovery of dramatic and disquieting differences between groups only if we have very exacting standards for what counts as dramatic or disquieting. After all, vast differences--e.g., those between Hitler and Mother Teresa--actually do exist. Indeed, at least many real differences, genuine clashes, can only take place against the background of a certain amount of agreement that allows for a shared subject matter; if two groups are to disagree about whether most events have causes or whether murder is wrong, they must share the concepts of an event and causation, of murder and being wrong.

5.9 Self-Refutation: Quicksand all the Way Down?

Truth is the Achilles' heel of relativism. According to the normative thesis of strong truth-value relativism one and the same thing can be true relative to one framework and false relative to another, true for some groups and false for others, and ever since Plato's argument against this form of relativism in the Theatetus many philosophers have agreed that the view is self-contradictory or self-refuting. Plato's argument is sometimes known as the peritrope; it's a turning the tables, turning the relativist's line of reasoning back against itself to show that his thesis succumbs to the very relativity he defends. Relativists always face the occupational hazard of sawing off the limb they are sitting on, but with strong truth-value relativism they seem to cut down the whole tree.

The Problem is General

The problem of self-refutation is quite general. It arises whether truth is relativized to a framework of concepts, of beliefs, of standards, of practices. It also arises for many of the more sweeping claims that central epistemic notions are somehow relative. If the epistemic relativist argues that all justification or rationality is framework relative, he lays himself open to the reply that his very claim is at best justified relative to his framework, only rational by his own standards, only defensible by his own guidelines, just as much a social construction as he insists everything else is.

Plato's argument against strong truth-value relativism is typically said to go like this: either the claim that truth is relative is true absolutely (i.e., true in a non-relative sense) or else it is only true relative to some framework. If it is true absolutely, all across the board, then at least one truth is not merely true relative to a framework, so this version of the claim is inconsistent. Furthermore, if we make an exception for the relativist's thesis, it is difficult to find a principled way to rule out other exceptions; what justifies stopping here? On the other hand, if the relativist's claim that truth is relative is only true relative to his framework, then it can be false in other, perhaps equally good, frameworks. And why should we care about that the relativist's (perhaps rather idiosyncratic or parochial) framework?

5.9.1 Complete Metastasis

Weak truth-value relativism escapes many of the dangers of self-refutation, since it does not allow one and the same thing to be true in one framework and false in another. But if normative truth-value relativism is intended as a view that is true simpliciter, it metastasizes very quickly. Suppose, for the sake of argument, that truth is relative to a person's (or group's) conceptual framework (for ease of exposition we consider individuals, but the point generalizes easily). Then, the relativist tells us, the very same belief (or sentence), call it p, can be true in Wilbur's framework, W, but false in Sam's framework, S. But if truth is relative in the strong sense, it can also be true in Wilbur's framework W that p is true in W and false in Sam's framework S that p is true in Wilbur's framework W. There is not even any objective fact about what is true in any given framework.

Worse is in store. There could be frameworks in which it is true that Wilbur's current belief has the content that grass is green and other frameworks in which his belief has the content that snow is white. There could be frameworks in which it is true that Wilbur's framework is W and other frameworks in which it is false that Wilbur's framework is W, and so there is no objective fact about what framework anyone has. Furthermore, it may be true in Wilbur's framework that the frameworks W and S are identical (W = S) but true in Sam's framework that W and S are distinct (WS). It may also be true in Wilbur's framework that W itself is a framework and true in Sam's that W is not a framework. It may be true in Sam's framework that there are no frameworks, or that everything is true in every framework, or that nothing is true in any. It may also be true in some frameworks (e.g., ones without concepts of physical objects or persons) that Wilbur and Sam do not exist.

In short, there is no fact about whether there are frameworks, about what frameworks are, about what is true in any particular framework, about what framework anyone has, about what anyone even thinks his own framework is like, or about anything else. It is quicksand all the way down. The metastasis is total. The meltdown is complete.

5.9.2 Damage Control

There seem to be only three hopes for escape.

1. Exemptions?

Champions of relative truth often find it tempting to suppose that their thesis of strong truth-value relativism (perhaps along with a few other things that go along with it) is true in some absolute sense. The doctrine of relative truth is somehow exempt. But why go just this far and no further? No one has ever given any argument that would begin to support the case for such exemptions, and the prospects are dim, because such a strategy is in considerable tension with the general pictures that lead to strong truth-value relativism in the first place.

2. Other Defenses of the Relativist's Framework

The relativist might urge that frameworks in which truth is relative are superior in some way to frameworks in which it is not, then urge that this difference gives us a reason to accept his framework, and with it the thesis of strong truth-value relativism. But the relativist's framework cannot be superior by virtue of containing the truth about relativism (or about anything else) since, according to his view, all truth is relative. Nor is it clear how the relativist's framework could be better justified than the non-relativist's. Among other things, justified beliefs are ones that track truth in some way, and if truth is relative, justification is likely to turn out relative as well. Indeed, the arguments to support the claim that truth is relative in the strong sense are very likely to support the claim that justification is relative as well. The problem is that no one has yet found any good reasons why the relativist's framework should command our allegiance, while his opponent's framework should not.

3. Taking a Stand

The relativist's best hope is to admit that he inhabits a framework and can only speak from within it. He can even acknowledge that his claims are only true relative to it. Still, it's his and his claim is important in it.

It's us, not just me

This strategy will be more compelling if the relativist can convince his interlocutors that their--seemingly objective--concepts and beliefs in fact presuppose the same framework as the relativist's and that the doctrine of relative truth is true in the framework they all share. It's not just that his claim is true in his idiosyncratic framework, but that it's true in the framework that we also inhabit. If the relativist could make such a view plausible, he could then add that his claims are no worse off than most of the other things we hold to be true. In short, The realist's or objectivist's seemingly objective concepts and beliefs presuppose the same framework as the relativist's, and truth is relative in it. And if relativism's claims are as secure as the myriad claims that are on solid ground for us normally, what more can we say? Indeed, the relativist might even attempt to expropriate one response to relativism and argue that frameworks in which his thesis is false are not live options for us.

The project of showing the objectivist that her beliefs depend on a common framework of concepts, standards, and beliefs and that relativism is reasonable according to them would not be easy; in effect it would involve the various sorts of arguments and counterarguments that have surfaced throughout this entry. Furthermore, even if the relativist succeeded, his view would still be at best relatively true. Whether such a position is at all defensible is a matter of debate, but at this juncture things have become more complicated than the simpler versions of Plato's refutation might suggest.

Culture Shock: Non-trivial Differences

The claim that truth is relative in the strong sense does indeed subvert itself, but this doesn't mean that there couldn't be genuine and interesting differences among groups that could quite reasonably be called relativistic. What it does mean is that if these views are to be developed in an interesting way, we must find a way to dissociate them from the strong version of truth-value relativism.

5.10 “Beyond Relativism”

It is difficult to deny some of the key premises relativists employ in defending their views. We are historically and culturally situated creatures who cannot step outside our concepts and standards and beliefs to appraise their fit with some mind-independent reality of “things-in-themselves.” Furthermore, although we can justify many of our more central beliefs and epistemic standards in a piecemeal way, we cannot justify all of them at once, and perhaps we cannot justify some of them, like induction, at all.

The challenge is to do justice to such facts without ending up in the quicksand of extreme relativism, and many writers now advise moving “beyond relativism” (many books, chapters, and articles bear this phrase in the title), counseling us to steer a course between the Scylla of relativism, on the one side, and the Charybdis of an over-simplified absolutism, on the other. Finding such a course is easier said than done, however, and there is more agreement on the desirability of such a project than on how to carry it out. Still, various proposals recur in the literature.

5.10.1 Not Just Anything Goes

Relativistic claims often sound better in the abstract than they do when we get down to cases (a point that made an unusual appearance in the public press in 1996 with the Sokal hoax).[6] When we turn to concrete examples, extreme relativistic claims are often not at all true to experience. No one really supposes that a postmodernist witness can justify his testimony, come what may, that he saw Jones commit the murder on the grounds that everything is a social construction and this is just how he constructs things. Indeed, our belief that such practices are unacceptable is much stronger than our beliefs in most of the premises used in arguments for stronger versions of relativism.

Once a framework is up and running, there are many obvious facts about what is right or wrong, probable or improbable, true or false. Furthermore, coherent and workable frameworks cannot be created by simple fiat. It took several millennia of extraordinary imagination and labor on the parts of thousands and thousands of people to produce the frameworks of modern science. It just isn't true that “anything goes.”

5.10.2 Rational Change Does Occur

Conceptual and epistemic changes do occur, and talk of being trapped in our current beliefs and standards can be overstated. Children learn radically new things, adults sometimes acquire jarringly new values and beliefs, scientists occasionally embrace dramatically new theories. Moreover, people often view things after the change as great improvements over what went before (although this is tempered by the fact that the new convert to Nazism or to mystical anti-rationalism may feel a sense of improvement just as keenly as those who move in the opposite directions).

5.10.3 Reconciling Rationality and Contingency

Perhaps the most promising strategy for finding a middle way between extreme relativism, on the one hand, and an over-simplified objectivism, on the other, is to try to reconcile the contingent, historical, culture-bound nature of our thought with what seems to be our ability to come to think in better--and not simply different--ways.

Thinkers who attempt this often begin by observing that we must start from where we are, warts and all, with our current concepts and beliefs and standards and limitations (we could, after all, scarcely begin from anywhere else). Furthermore, they often continue, our beliefs and standards do not require justification unless they are challenged in some relevant way. This is not to say that we are forever stuck with our current views, however, because various pressures can lead us to make improvements. This possibility of improvement is often overlooked, however, because we are in the grip of some overly-ambitious model of rationality or justification that refuses to count something as an improvement unless we can give something like a formal demonstration that it is better than what went before.

These lofty conceptions of rationality and justification often go hand in hand with the view that rationality is powerful enough, in principle, to settle all difficult cases or to bring all rational people into agreement. But this overlooks the possibility of less-exalted conceptions of rationality which, although they cannot guarantee convergence or agreement, can still lead to various sorts of epistemic improvements in a person's or group's standards and beliefs. What we need are not completely framework-independent epistemic standards, but a diligent attempt to do the best with what we have; to forthrightly acknowledge that we have preconceptions and biases of various sorts, but to strive to pinpoint such limitations and to discount for them when we can.

Various philosophers have suggested ways in which our beliefs and standards could improve over time in spite of the fact that we are historically and culturally situated creatures. For example, John Dewey and others argue that our epistemic standards evolve in trial-and-error process of inquiry itself. Others suggest that the criteria for rational change, even in science, sometimes involve things like problem-solving ability, rather than getting closer to the truth about some reality that is independent of our language and thought. Again, the method of reflective equilibrium may allow us to improve both our general standards and our particular beliefs from the inside, without having to employ some timeless and immutable standards. Although this method cannot guarantee that groups that begin with different standards and beliefs will converge, it may nevertheless lead both groups to better-justified overall sets of standards and beliefs.

5.10.4 A Residual Sense of Contingency?

Even if we scale back our demands of rationality and justification, however, an uncomfortable sense of the contingency of our own modes of thought and evaluation may remain. The increasing salience of historical and cultural diversity highlights modes of thinking and acting that differ in interesting, and sometimes disquieting, ways from our own. Had we been raised in a very different time or place, we could easily have wound up with very different styles of thought, standards of evaluation, and intuitions about what is obvious. Moreover, some of these alternatives do not involve any obvious failure of rationality or any violation of epistemic norms.

All of this can be unsettling, because the recognition of such differences, especially differences that seem difficult to settle in a nonquestion-begging way, is in tension with the fact that in practice it is virtually impossible to view our most central concepts and beliefs and principles as just one set among many equally good ones. We want to be able to say more than “Well, this is how we do things where I come from,” or “You are wrong because you aren't measuring up to my standards.” It would be gratifying to find a way to avoid the tension this sense of contingency can generate, but it is not altogether obvious there is one to be found.


The literature on relativism is nearly endless, so the usual disclaimers about incomplete coverage apply more than usual. The following references will point the reader to important literature in various areas, some of which includes detailed bibliographies.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Davidson, Donald | feminist (interventions): epistemology and philosophy of science | Feyerabend, Paul | Herder, Johann Gottfried von | Kuhn, Thomas | moral realism | moral relativism | reflective equilibrium | Rorty, Richard