Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Mental Representation in Medieval Philosophy

First published Fri May 28, 2004

The notions of mental representation and intentionality are intrinsically related in contemporary philosophy of mind, since it is usually thought that a mental state has content or is about something other than itself due to its representational nature. These notions have a parallel history in medieval philosophy as well, but it has been intentionality that has attracted the attention of medieval scholars (for example, in Knudsen 1982, Pasnau 1997, Perler 2001 and Perler 2002). There have only been a few studies on mental representation (Tweedale 1990, Pasnau 1997 and Lagerlund forthcoming a).

One major reason for the interest in intentionality in medieval philosophy is that it has been widely recognized that Franz Brentano was reviving a scholastic notion when he introduced intentionality as "the mark of the mental" (Brentano 1924). But Brentano never used the terminology of representation to explicate intentionality. This was done much later, in post-Wittgensteinian philosophy of mind. In later medieval philosophy, it was, however, standard to explain the content of a thought by referring to its representational nature.

There are a variety of theories of mental representation in medieval philosophy, which were intensely discussed from the twelfth century up to the time of Descartes. This article will trace the history of the terminology and give a brief outline of the different theories developed during these five hundred years.

1. The Origins of the Terminology

Like contemporary philosophers, scholastic philosophers held that concepts or mental signs with semantic properties have a representational nature, but the capacity to represent and exhibit intentionality was not limited to concepts. Many scholastics claimed that the senses, memory, and imagination all represent things to the mind or soul. It was usually claimed that they do so by being likenesses of the things they represent. The notion of representation was accordingly used in a much broader sense than is typical today. In view of this difference, I will often talk about internal representation as representation in the soul, as opposed to external representation, for example, in a signpost, picture, or map.

The terminology is an important aspect of the history sketched here, but the way the terminology was introduced also shaped the notion of representation. That history will be traced via the Latin terms ‘repraesentare’ and ‘repraesentatio’. The use of representation in connection with the soul became part of philosophical psychology through the Latin translation of the works of Avicenna. By using these Latin terms to translate several Arabic terms, Avicenna's Latin translators managed to form or create a concept of internal representation, even though for Avicenna it is primarily the internal senses that are representational in nature and not concepts. Thinking about concepts as representations comes into philosophy in a slightly different way (see Lagerlund, forthcoming b, for a more detailed discussion of the history presented here).

1.1 The Ancient Background

The English words ‘representation’ and ‘to represent’ derive via Old French from the Latin words ‘repraesentatio’ and ‘repraesentare’, but these are by no means commonly used words in classical Latin. The Oxford Latin Dictionary gives substantially three meanings to these words: (i) a payment in ready money; (ii) an act of bringing something before the mind; or (iii) an image or a representation in art. For obvious reasons I am most interested in (ii) and (iii), which involve the idea of re-presenting something previously absent as present, that is, of making something present again.

Quintilian is one of the ancient sources who uses the word in an interesting way. In his Institutio oratoria, he writes:

Consequently we must place among ornaments that enargeia which I mentioned in the rules that I laid down for the statement of facts, because vivid illustration, or, as some prefer to call it, representation, is something more than mere clarity, since the latter merely lets itself be seen, whereas the former thrusts itself upon our notice.

Quintilian uses the noun ‘repraesentatio’ in the sense of (ii) as something that clearly represents itself to the mind. Vivid illustrations or representations are important tools in good rhetoric, according to Quintilian. A person blessed with the ability to present a situation or action as if it were real — to create a representation so powerful and persuasive that the audience cannot but be convinced by it — is a powerful orator. The representation is then ‘self-evident’ or enargeia, just as if the speaker has painted an unusually clear and convincing picture for us.

This seems to be the closest any ancient author came to the notion of internal representation, and Quintilian's vivid illustrations are in this way extremely rich and complicated representations. The orator describes a situation in words and tries to bring about in our imagination an inner picture, re-presenting the situation for us in our minds. This is the meaning of (ii) and hence we see that (ii) means the same as (iii), the only difference being that (iii) is an external representation and (ii) an internal representation.

One might suppose that this notion of representation in the soul in the technical sense must be a translation of some Greek word used in a similar way. It is unclear, however, what that Greek word would be. One suggestion has been that Plato's and Aristotle's technical usage of the word ‘phantasia’ should be translated as 'faculty of representation' and the plural ‘phantasmata’ as 'representations'. In Aristotle, phantasia is what comes between aisthesis and nous, that is, the end product of sensation and the start of intellectual activity. It might then seem natural to view Aristotle's ‘phantasmata’ as sensory representations of external objects, though this is controversial. Furthermore, there seems to be no ancient Roman author or other Latin writer who presents such an interpretation of Aristotle.

The Latin verb ‘repraesentare’ was, however, used in relation to the Greek word phantasia, and it is Quintilian again who makes the connection. But by the time he did so, the term phantasia had detached itself from the technical vocabulary of Plato and Aristotle and come to mean something like fantasy or imagination in a non-technical sense (Watson 1988). The orator who will most effectively move an the audience is, according to Quintilian, the one who acquires a proper stock of phantasiai. In Book IV of the Institutio oratoria, he writes:

What the Greeks call phantasiai and we may call 'clear visions' are those things through which the images of things not present are so represented to the soul that we seem to see them with our very eyes and have them before us.

Quintilian here uses the term ‘repraesentare’ in virtually the same sense as before. It thus seems that the classical usage of these terms, which has bearing on the history of the notion of mental representation, is strictly limited to rhetoric.

1.2 Early Medieval Usage of Representation

In the early Middle Ages, the classical usage of the terms ‘repraesentare’ and ‘repraesentatio’ continued, although they were used rather infrequently in the sense of (ii) above. There was, however, a whole tradition of theological writers who used the notion of representation as image or example, that is, in sense of (iii) above. One example can be found in Abelard's Epitome Theologiae Christianae where he writes:

In such a way are we obliged to have Christ before our eyes in the sacrament, in the way he was led to the passion, suffered, and crucified for us. This representation of his love, which he himself has shown to us, makes us remember. (Cap. XXIX; PL, Col. 1740D.)

Abelard stresses that in the Eucharist we must have Christ's suffering before our eyes as an example or image of his love in order for us to remember that love. This representation seems to be an external representation in the form of Christ on the cross, although we should retain it in our souls so that it can be a representation in the sense of (ii) above. Abelard's use of the term is reminiscent of Quintilian's, though with a specific Christian element added to it.

The usage of the word 'representation' with this strong theological element clearly owes something to Tertullian. The word occurs quite frequently in his texts, unlike other writings from the period. Tertullian's use of this term has been studied by Adhémar d'Alès in the book La théologie de Tertullien (1905), in which he claims that there are three main uses of the verb ‘repraesentare’ in Tertullian: one physical, having to do with something being really present; one mental, having to do with representation in the imagination or the intellect; and finally, one moral, having to do with images of examples — preferably Christian. The first use is in line with (iii) above and the third is basically the same as the one we have noted in Abelard, but the second use mentioned by d'Alès is especially interesting. He presents hardly any examples of it, however, other than from the book De spectaculis in which Tertullian writes:

… we have this [the coming of Christ] already represented before us by the power of the Holy Spirit. (Cap. 30, PL, col. 0662A - 0662B.)

This is the same idea as in Abelard: by the power of the Holy Spirit, we have a representation of mental image of Christ's return before his arrival. By his relatively frequent appeals to this idea, Tertullian established the medieval association of representation with Christian or theological notions.

Augustine very rarely uses these words and none of his uses is interesting or relevant for our history. The Latin words ‘repraesentare’ and ‘representatio’ likewise do not occur in Boethius' or later medieval translations of Aristotle's works into Latin. The only exception is again found in the Rhetoric, in William of Moerbeke's thirteenth-century translation in which he renders ‘mimesis’ with ‘repraesentatio’. See, for example, the following passage:

And since learning and admiring are pleasant, all things connected with them must also be pleasant; for instance, a work of imitation, such as painting, sculpture, poetry, and all that is well represented, even if the object of representation is not pleasant … (I, 11, 1371b4-8)

In the early translation by James of Venice, the Latin term ‘imitatio’ is used for ‘mimesis’. There seem to be no other reason why he should have changed the translation, especially since it is not rendered by ‘repraesentatio’ in the Poetics, unless he had been aware of Quintilian's use of the term.

1.3 The Introduction of Representation in the Twelfth Century

The twelfth century was a dynamic period in medieval philosophy and in a sense it is no wonder that it is in this century that we find the concept and terminology of representation in the soul being exploited seriously for the first time. This century saw the reappearance of Aristotle's works in the west, as well as numerous other works that were being translated into Latin for the first time. Much of the technical vocabulary of Latin Western philosophy was established during this time.

The terminology of representation in relation to the operations of the soul can be divided into three main groups: sensory (visual) representation, internal (sensory) representation, and mental (conceptual) representation.

1.3.1 Sensory Representation

If not the first, then at least one of the very first uses of the notion of sensory representation can be found in the twelfth century translation of Nemesius of Emesa's De natura hominis by Burgundio of Pisa, who translates the Greek word ‘parhistemi’ with ‘represento’. The Greek term means something like ‘to set before’. In the chapter on vision, he writes:

Whenever truly in conformity with itself, [vision] manifestly represents that which appears, since [whatever appears] is not seen from a great distance, but from a great distance a square tower, in fact, appears round. (Cap. VI, 79.14-17)

Here the word is used exactly to mean a sensory representation of some external thing to the soul. The idea Nemesius wants to express is that vision, whenever it functions normally, correctly represents things as they appear, since at close range and under normal conditions things are as they appear. At a greater distance things are not always as they appear and in a visual appearance what is represented as round by the senses might in fact be square.

The square tower that appears round from a distance is a traditional example, going back at least to Sextus Empiricus in his famous work Against the Mathematicians from the second century, but it is reported as well by Tertullian in his De anima, though Tertullian does not use the term 'representation' in the context of this example. It was not common in later medieval philosophy to use the notion of representation in relation to vision, but there are occasional examples (for which, see John Blund's Tractatus de anima).

1.3.2 Internal Representation

The usage of the terms ‘repraesentatio’ and ‘repraesentare’ for internal representation in psychology or philosophy of mind seems to have its origin in the Latin translation of the works of Avicenna. In no earlier work can such frequent use of these Latin words be found, and, more importantly, they were not previously associated with the internal senses.

The translation of Avicenna's works into Latin was completed at about the same time as the translation of Nemesius of Emesa's De natura hominis. In Latin two separate works were produced, namely the so-called Metaphysics (Liber de philosophia prima sive scientia divina) and De anima (Liber de anima seu sextus de naturalibus), though the Arabic original is one very large work, the encyclopedic Kitâb al-shifâ’ (The Book of Healing). Gerard of Cremona and Gundisalvi from Gundissalinas translated them around 1150.

The Latin translation of the part of Avicenna's al-Shifâ concerned with the soul, which for some time was viewed as a commentary on Aristotle's De anima, was extraordinarily influential. But perhaps its most profound influence was on terminology. Even though some dismissed Avicenna's faculty psychology, everyone was influenced by his terminology and especially by his association of representations in the soul with our internal senses, that is, with fantasy, imagination, and memory.

Avicenna's psychology is a faculty psychology. Now according to the philosophers, there are five internal senses or faculties, whereas according to the medical tradition, there are only three. In the front ventricle of the brain humans have two senses, namely the common sense, which receives all sense impressions, and phantasia, which retains them. The third faculty is located in the middle ventricle of the brain and is called the imaginative faculty, though it is also called cogitative when the intellect makes use of it. Its job is to combine the forms or images stored in phantasia. The fourth faculty is not in any part of the brain, which is why it is not recognized by the physicians. This is the estimative faculty, a kind of instinctual understanding shared by humans and brute animals. It is with this faculty that, for example, the lamb knows that the wolf is dangerous. The fifth and last faculty is memory, in the back ventricle of the brain (Harvey 1975).

Representation in Avicenna is associated with all five faculties. Forms received through the common sense and stored in phantasia are called representations. In Avicenna's terminology they are representations of perceived objects, so that he speaks of:

… the acts of the imagination and its representations (isti'râdât) … (Liber de anima, IV, cap. 3, p. 42.)

… representations (tamaththul) in the imagination are made stronger with the help of the intellect. (Ibid., V, cap. 3, pp. 104-105.)

The imaginative or cogitative faculty combines and divides representations collected in the phatasia to make new representations, which might not have any real object corresponding to them. But these representations are still images of some sort:

… the imaginative represents (hakâ) the forms that the soul is apt to choose and to mix together … (Ibid., IV, cap. 2, p. 30.)

The senses apprehend the sensible forms of the objects we perceive and the estimative faculty apprehends the ‘intentio or ‘ma'na’ of the perceived object. Avicenna's example is again the lamb perceiving the wolf. It is the apprehension of the wolf's intentio of the wolf that makes the lamb flee. The internal faculties are all involved in this process and the notion of representation plays an absolutely crucial role in explaining how it happens.

The intentio of the wolf is also remembered, so that the next time the lamb sees a wolf its response is much more automatic. The memory retains the representation of the wolf together with the estimation of that representation and thus whenever the representation is recalled the estimation comes with it:

[A memory representation] that is created with the estimation converts to its [corresponding representation] in the imaginative faculty and represents (ja'ala) whichever of the forms are in the imagination… (Ibid., IV, cap. 1, p. 9)

Representations in the imagination are also the basis for intellectual activity:

The sense represents (arada) [an object] to the imagination through some form and the imagination [represents] it to the intellect… (Ibid., V, cap. 5, p. 129)

According to Avicenna, thinking is always universal, but whatever is represented in the imagination is singular; hence, the intellect must extract the intention from whatever is presented or represented to it. If a form of the same species is presented to the intellect, it obviously does not extract another intention, or universal, from it. This process is explained in the Metaphysics:

In the intellect, the form of animal is of the sort that agrees with one and the same definition of many particular [things]. Thus, one form in the intellect will be related to many things, and it is in this respect that it is universal, because it is one intention in the intellect … which is evident since, of those [things] represented by the form in the imagination, the intellect has plundered the intention of its accidents [and] acquired the form in the intellect. (Liber de philosophia prima sive scientia divina, V, cap. 1, p. 237)

Here he describes the process of abstraction, or how the representation in the imagination of particular kinds of things gets to be universal in the intellect. The universal forms are abstracted from representations in the imagination and flow from the active intellect into the passive, and since there is no storage facility in the intellect this process needs to be carried out from scratch each time there is intellectual activity. Note, however, that the terminology of representation is never used in relation to the intellect. It is always the internal senses that represent in Avicenna and not the intellect or the external senses (see Lagerlund, forthcoming b, for a table of the whole range of terms translated by ‘representation’.)

Avicenna's profound influence on the medieval philosophical tradition can also be seen in Thomas Aquinas' writings on psychology. Aquinas uses the notion of representation in relation to phantasia whenever he considers the powers of the soul. He never or almost never uses this terminology in relation to the external senses and never in relation to a concept, or what he calls the mental word (verbum). Representation is always associated with the internal senses or the abstracted universal species that represents without material conditions, that is, the so-called sensible and intelligible species. This use of the terminology of representation in connection with intelligible species is again inspired by Avicenna.

1.3.3 Concepts as Representations (Mental Representation)

In contemporary philosophy of mind, the notion of mental representation is most often used in relation to concepts, which are assigned some sort of semantic function in virtue of which they can be signs of objects. Did medieval thinkers also use the terms ‘repraesentare’ and ‘repraesentatio’ in this way?

The first usage of representation relevant to this sense of the word can be found in eleventh- and twelfth-century logic. Garlandus Compotista's Dialectica (p. 17) and Abelard's Dialectica (II, p. 188) discuss a distinction between a word's signification by imposition and by representation. A denominative term such as ‘white’ signifies by imposition a substance that is white, but it signifies by representation the whiteness inhering in the substance. The white thing stands in for or is an instantiation of whiteness — white is re-presented in the object. Garlandus mentions the example of a traveler (viator) who can be said to represent a road (via). The term ‘traveler’ signifies by imposition the human being who is a traveler, but also represents the road the traveler travels on.

The same distinction can be found in the logic of the later Middle Ages, the 'New Logic' or Logica modernorum. An anonymous author explains it as follows:

One should, however, note that a name does not nominally signify the substance and the quality at the same time … but it always names the substance, since it was imposed to do so. The quality, however, is signified non-nominally. More correctly, it is a representation and a determination of a substance in accordance with which the signification of the substance was imposed. This is why every name has two significations: one by the imposition of the substance and another by the representation of the quality of the substance. (de Rijk, Logica modernorum, II.i, p. 228, nota 1)

It is not quite true as the author here suggests that every term (name) has two kinds of signification. Terms that have both are called appellative terms and should be distinguished from substance terms or natural kind terms, which have signification by imposition. William of Ockham calls such terms connotative and claims that their meaning is expressed by two kinds of signification, which he refers to as primary and secondary signification.

There was, however, no attempt to internalize this use of representation either in Abelard's time or during the period when Avicenna was being translated into Latin. This was done during the fourteenth and fifteenth centuries by nominalist thinkers interested in the hypothesis of a language of thought. Ockham is the first figure in this tradition, which includes thinkers such as John Buridan, Peter of Ailly, and later, John Mair. According to them, concepts function as signs of what is being thought about. These signs represent objects because they are caused by these objects, and they are mental simply because they are in the mind. Furthermore, a mental representation represents an object if it signifies that object. It therefore functions as a ‘word’ for that object in mental language. It should be stressed, however, that although both Ockham and Buridan use the terminology of representation in relation to the concept being caused by an external object (see for example Quodlibeta Septem 4.3), they do not use it very often when talking about a concept's signification. It has been argued that it was Albert of Saxony who first introduced this terminology (Fitzgerald 2002, 17-18), which became standard after the mid-fourteenth century (Ashworth 1974 and 1977).

2. The Different Theories of Mental Representation

In a forthcoming article, Peter King has outlined four basic ways in which the notion of mental representation was developed in medieval philosophy:

(R1) The mental representation and the thing represented have the same form.
(R2) The mental representation resembles, or is a likeness of, the thing represented.
(R3) The mental representation is caused by the thing represented.
(R4) The mental representation signifies the thing represented.

These are of course not independent of each other. R1 and R2, for example, usually go to together, as do R3 and R4. And there are theories of cognition that feature all four. (The subdivisions of R1-R4 below are also due to King forthcoming a.)

2.1 Conformality

2.1.1 The Simple Version (Thomas Aquinas)

R1 captures the essence of one of the most influential theories of thought ever developed, namely the idea that the mind takes on the form of the object of thought. This theory goes back at least to Aristotle, and its foremost medieval advocate was Thomas Aquinas. The idea is that the mental representation (the intelligible species in Aquinas's terminology) represents an object because it has the same form as the object. The reason my thoughts are about the mug on the table is that the mug and my thought of the mug have the same form. The mug represented in my mind and the mug on the table are one and the same thing under two different kinds of existence. It is obvious that the mug does not exist in my mind in the same way as it does outside it — the mind does not become a mug (except metaphorically) by its thinking of a mug — although the form is the same.

This 'conformality' account of mental representation is for Aquinas embedded in a much larger, causal theory of the reception of these forms into the mind or intellectual soul, according to which forms are transmitted through the intervening medium between subject and object (the doctrine of the species in medio or 'species in the medium') and received in the external sense-organs and sense-faculty, which leads to the production of phantasms or sensible species and ultimately to the creation by the active intellect of a mental representation or intelligible species in the passive intellect (for the precise details, see Tachau 1988 and Pasnau 1997).

One consequence of this theory of mental representation is that thinking in the first instance will always be universal because it involves abstraction from the particularizing, material conditions of the object of thought. But this creates some serious metaphysical problems for Aquinas. What is the individuating principle here? Why is my thought about the mug on the table a thought about the mug on the table and not about mugs in general? The form in my mind is general — a mug-form — and since the intellect or mind according to Aquinas is immaterial, matter cannot serve as its individuating principle. My thinking about the individual mug on the table is somehow mediated through the universal mug-form representing it. Aquinas never presents a satisfying answer to the question how thought is about individual objects.

Another famous problem has to do with the nature of conformality itself. Why does the mug outside my soul not represent my thought about the mug? The forms inside and outside my mind are the same, suggesting that mental representation is symmetrical. Aquinas has a famous answer to this problem, which is that the mug on the table does not represent my thought because of the mode of the form's presence in it. The form in the mug is really present (esse reale) whereas it in my mind is spiritually or intentionally present (esse spirituale sive intentionale).

The distinction between a form being really or spiritually present is central to Aquinas's physics or natural philosophy. A form may be present somewhere without literally making whatever substance it informs into something else. Colors in the air, for example, do not make it really colored: we see colors in the objects around us but not in the intervening air, although they must be there spiritually if sensation is to be a causal process. This means, of course, that the air, or whatever the intervening medium happens to be, must also represent the color, which entails that intentionality is not a mark of the mental for Aquinas. The air is not itself a mind (for discussion, see Pasnau 1997, Chapter 2.)

2.1.2 The Composite Version (John Duns Scotus)

Duns Scotus builds on Aquinas's theory of mental representation, taking the conformality view a step further by introducing a distinction between the thing representing and the thing represented. According to Aquinas, the form in the mind is both the representing thing and the thing represented, an assumption that eventually forces him to make a distinction between the real and spiritual modes of a form's existence (see Tweedale, forthcoming, for further discussion of the differences between Aquinas's and Duns Scotus's accounts of mental representation.) Of course, claiming that a mental representation represents because the object represented has intentional existence in the mind does not really lead to a satisfactory account of mental representation, but seems only to introduce a further element requiring explanation (see King forthcoming a).

Scotus's idea is to treat the thing that does the representing as a mental act or concept, which ontologically speaking is an accident of the mind (a substantial form), and the thing represented as the form of the object thought about (which is why this is still a conformality account of mental representation). This is an important distinction, and to express it Scotus needed to develop a new terminology. He says that the accident or mental act is subjectively in the soul whereas the object being represented is present objectively, or has objective being in the mind. He also says that the object exists sub ratione cognoscibilis seu repraesentanti or 'in keeping with the nature of something cognizable or represented' (Ord. I, d. 3, pars 3, q. 1, n. 382) to express the content side of the mental representation. Scotus thus has a clear way of expressing what Brentano later called intentionality, i.e., the way the object of thought exists in the mind. It has objective existence in the mind on his view, which later came to be regarded as the mark of the mental (see Normore 1986, Pasnau 2003 and King forthcoming b.)

Although the advantages of this approach over Aquinas's are clear, problems remain concerning the ontological status of these mental contents. The medieval debate here is famous and features a wide variety of opinions (for a survey, see Tachau 1988 and the section on cognition and reality in the entry on Peter Auriol). Scotus himself says that thought objects have a diminished kind of being, which is supposed to be a state between real being and no being at all. Ockham would later subject this view to much criticism.

2.2 Likeness

It seems obvious to begin a theory of representation by saying that something is a representation of something else if it is like or similar to the thing it represents. A bust of Plato represents Plato if it is a likeness of Plato. R2 takes this to heart in saying that a mental representation represents by being a likeness of what it represents. This was a very common view among medieval philosophers and R2 was usually combined with R1. There are at least two distinct views on likeness in the medieval discussions, one that takes likeness literally and another, more sophisticated idea involving the notion of picturing.

2.2.1 A Literalist Proposal (William Crathorn)

A noteworthy defender of the literalist view of mental representation was William Crathorn, who argued that a mental representation must have the very same quality as the thing it represents. Accordingly, a mental representation of a red object must be actually red:

[I]f the aforesaid likeness of color were a true color, then a soul intellectively cognizing color would be truly colored, and one intellectively cognizing heat would be truly hot … [I]t has to be said that the argument's conclusion is true: a soul seeing and intellectively cognizing color is truly colored, not by any color existing outside the soul but by its likeness, which is a true color. And the same has to be said of a soul intellectively cognizing whenever the natural word of the color itself is formed in it. (William Crathorn, ISent. q. 1, concl. 7)

Starting from the assumption that mental representation requires likeness, Crathorn proceeds to show that such likenesses must be natural likenesses if they are to be representative at all, and a natural likeness must have the same qualities as the object it is a likeness of. There are several obvious problems with this view, however, and even Crathorn's contemporaries had difficulty taking him seriously. Robert Holcot even sarcastically comments that Crathorn's soul must be a chameleon (Pasnau 1997, 91).

2.2.2 Picturing

A more plausible account of mental representation in terms of likeness takes a less literal approach, arguing that a mental representation represents what it does by picturing it. Obviously, the notion of ‘picturing’ can also be taken more or less literally, but medieval philosophers seem to have helped themselves to this notion quite freely without bothering to distinguish between its different senses. Some authors imagined representation in terms of crude images whereas others seem to have had something more sophisticated in mind based on the notion of correspondence (see King forthcoming a). This has an obvious advantage over the literalist approach in that an image or picture does not need to look like its object in order to be a representation of it. A blueprint represents a building, but it certainly does not look like the building. Aquinas makes this point:

The likeness of any two things to each other can be considered in two ways. In one way, in terms of natural agreement, and such a likeness is not required between cognizer and cognized … In another way, as regards representation, and this likeness of cognizer to cognized is required. (De veritate 10)

On this view, then, although natural likeness is symmetrical (as was obvious in the case of Crathorn), representational likeness is typically not.

In combination with R1 the picturing approach was very important in medieval philosophy. A whole range of philosophers, including Thomas Aquinas, subscribed to the idea that in intellectual cognition, the form (intelligible species) intentionally present in the mind is similar to or representative of an object. The form's representational ability is explained by its similarity or likeness to the object it represents.

A significant problem with this approach is that its defenders never seem to say what the similarity consists in. But it is important for a theory of mental representation to be clear about this. In particular, these philosophers failed to explicate what Peter King (forthcoming) describes as the transformation-rules that show how object and representation are related. Without such rules, they have no account of representation.

Despite this, the notion of picturing or likeness had a certain amount of intuitive appeal as an account of mental representation. Those who disagreed, such as William of Ockham, argued that pictorial resemblance cannot account for singular thought (see, for example, Reportatio 2, qq. 12-3; OTh 5). A picture or image does not by its very nature represent one individual more than any other, and since Ockham takes it to be obvious that we do think about individuals — indeed, thought is for a nominalist always about individuals in the first instance — there must be more to mental representation than mere pictorial resemblance. He proposed a different account, which changed the course medieval philosophical psychology.

2.3 Covariance and Linguistic Role (William Ockham)

R3 holds that a mental representation represents an object if it is caused by that object. The object and the representation ‘co-vary’, meaning that the one is present if the other one is and not if not. On the other hand, R4 gives representation a linguistic role such that a mental representation functions as the mental word for the object it represents or signifies. It represents whatever it stands for. And just as R1 and R2 are usually found together, the same is true of R3 and R4.

Ockham is the best known medieval defender of a theory of mental representation based on R3 and R4. In his view, a mental representation or concept is caused by an intuitive cognition:

Intuitive cognition is the proper cognition of a singular not because of its greater likness to one thing more than another but because it is naturally caused by one thing and not by another; nor can it be caused by another. If you object that it can be caused by God alone, I reply that this is true: such a visual apprehension is always apt to be caused by one created object and not by another; and if it is caused naturally, it is caused by one thing and not by another, and it is not able to be caused by another. (Quodlibeta Septem 1.13)

As we saw above, Ockham thinks that images or liknesses are general and can never be about just one thing. According to his metaphysics, however, there are only individuals in the world so that when an individual causes a concept to exist in the mind, it causes an individual concept or a singular conception of itself. Nothing else can cause that concept (except perhaps God). The singular concept functions as the word of the object that caused it in our language of thought. It is an atomic constituent that can then be combined to form more complex concepts or sentences in the language. In this way, one can say that Ockham develops a kind of medieval functionalism, since the determinate content of a concept is fully specified by the input (covariance) and the output (linguistic role) (see King forthcoming a).

Ockham's notion of concept aquisition and mental representation is developed as part of a very sophisticated theory of thought involving not only a theory of signification, but also a whole range of logico-semantic properties such as connotation and supposition. It explains how concepts, which in turn are the direct objects of belief and knowledge, are assembled into mental sentences describing the world (for the details, see Panaccio, 1999).

The early fourteenth century witnessed a definite change in the way the problem of mental representation was approached. The older Aristotelianism of Aquinas characterized by R1 and R2 above was replaced by Ockham's theory, which emphasizes R3 and R4. Both traditions continued into the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries, of course. Thus, Descartes first considers an approach similar to that of Aquinas, but ends up presenting a theory much more reminiscent of Ockham (see Alanen 2003).

3. Conclusion

Once the terminology of internal representation was introduced to Western philosophy through the Latin translation of Avicenna, it did not take long until it was at the heart of most scholastic accounts of cognition and intentionality. The debate centered on two fundamentally different theories of thought, namely the ‘Aristotelian’ or conformality view and the non-Aristotelian inherence view. According to the former, the mind takes on the form of the object and represents it by virtue of being its likeness or picture. On the latter, thinking is simply having a concept in mind. The concept is caused by the object it represents and functions as its sign in mental sentences or thoughts.

The medieval tradition of philosophical psychology had a profound and still largely unappreciated effect on the development of early modern thought. In terms of sophistication, medieval theories are more than a match for anything advanced by the most important modern philosophers.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Aristotle, General Topics: psychology | Auriol [Aureol, Aureoli], Peter | Buridan, John [Jean] | intentionality | intentionality: in ancient philosophy | intentionality: medieval theories of | mental representation | Ockham [Occam], William