Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Sat Aug 16, 2008

Pragmatism was a philosophical tradition that originated in the United States around 1870. The most important of the ‘classical pragmatists’ were Charles Sanders Peirce (1839–1914), William James (1842–1910) and John Dewey (1859-1952). The influence of pragmatism declined during the first two thirds of the twentieth century, but it has undergone a revival since the 1970s with philosophers being increasingly willing to use the writings and ideas of the classical pragmatists, and also a number of thinkers, such as Richard Rorty, Hilary Putnam and Robert Brandom developing philosophical views that represent later stages of the pragmatist tradition. The core of pragmatism was the pragmatist maxim, a rule for clarifying the contents of hypotheses by tracing their ‘practical consequences’. In the work of Peirce and James, the most influential application of the pragmatist maxim was to the concept of truth. But the pragmatists have also tended to share a distinctive epistemological outlook, a fallibilist anti-Cartesian approach to the norms that govern inquiry.

1. ‘Pragmatism’ and pragmatism

When William James published a series of lectures on ‘Pragmatism: A New Name for an Old way of Thinking’ in 1907, he began by identifying ‘The Present Dilemma in Philosophy’ (1907: 9ff), a fundamental and apparently irresoluble clash between two ways of thinking about things. He promised that pragmatism would show us the way to overcome this dilemma and, having thus shown us its importance, he proceeded, in the second lecture, to explain ‘What Pragmatism Means’.  

James's dilemma is a familiar one: it is a form of the question of how we can reconcile the claims of science, on the one hand, with those of religion and morality on the other. James introduces it by observing that the history of philosophy is ‘to a great extent that of a certain clash of human temperaments’, between the ‘tough minded’ and the ‘tender minded’. The tough minded have an empiricist commitment to experience and going by ‘the facts’, while the tender-minded have more of a taste for a priori principles which appeal to the mind. The tender minded tend to be idealistic, optimistic and religious, while the tough minded are normally materialist, pessimistic and irreligious. The tender-minded are ‘free-willist’ and dogmatic; the tough minded are ‘fatalistic’ and sceptical.

By the early twentieth century, ‘never were so many men of a decidedly empiricist proclivity’: ‘our children … are almost born scientific’ (1907: 14f). But this has not weakened religious belief. People need a philosophy that is both empiricist in its adherence to facts yet finds room for religious belief. But all that is on offer is ‘an empirical philosophy that is not religious enough and a religious philosophy that is not empirical enough for your purpose’ (1907: 15f). The challenge is to show how to reconcile ‘the scientific loyalty to facts’ with ‘the old confidence in human values and the resultant spontaneity, whether of the religious or of the romantic type.’ We must reconcile empiricist epistemic responsibility with moral and religious optimism. Pragmatism is presented as the ‘mediating philosophy’ that enables us to overcome the distinction between the tender-minded and the tough-minded: we need to show how adherence to tough-minded epistemic standards does not prevent our adopting the kind of worldview to which the tender-minded aspire. Once we use what he introduced as the ‘pragmatic method’ to clarify our understanding of truth, of free will, or of religious belief the disputes—which we despaired of settling intellectually—begin to dissolve. For James, then, Pragmatism is important because it offers a way of overcoming the dilemma, a way of seeing that, for example, science, morality and religion are not in competition.

William James thus presented pragmatism as a ‘method for settling metaphysical disputes that might otherwise be interminable.’ (1907: 28) Unless some ‘practical difference’ would follow from one or the other side's being correct, the dispute is idle.

[T]he tangible fact at the root of all our thought-distinctions, however subtle, is that there is no one of them so fine as to consist in anything but a possible difference of practice. To attain perfect clearness in our thoughts of an object, then, we need only consider what conceivable effects of a practical kind the object may involve—what sensations we are to expect from it, and what reactions we must prepare. (1907: 29)

The lectures explained this with a memorable illustration of pragmatism in action.  This shows how the maxim enables us to defuse an apparently insoluble (albeit ‘trivial’) dispute. On a visit to the mountains, his friends engage in a ‘ferocious metaphysical dispute’ about a squirrel that was hanging on to one side of a tree trunk while a human observer was standing on the other side:

This human witness tries to get sight of the squirrel by moving rapidly round the tree, but no matter how fast he goes, the squirrel moves as fast in the opposite direction, and always keeps the tree between himself and the man, so that never a glimpse of him is caught. The resultant metaphysical problem now is this: Does the man go round the squirrel or not? (1907: 27f)

James proposed to solve the problem by pointing out that which answer is correct depends on what you ‘practically mean’ by ‘going round’. If you mean passing from north of him to east, then south, then west, then the answer to the question is ‘yes’. If, on the other hand, you mean first in front of him, then to his right, then behind him, and then to his left, before returning to being in front of him again, then the answer is ‘no’. Pragmatic clarification disambiguates the question, and once that is done, all dispute comes to an end. The ‘pragmatic method’ promises to eliminate all apparently irresoluble metaphysical disputes.

So James offers his pragmatism as a technique for clarifying concepts and hypotheses. He proposed that if we do this, metaphysical disputes that appear to be irresoluble will be dissolved. When philosophers suppose that free will and determinism are in conflict, James responds that once we compare the practical consequences of determinism being true with the practical consequences of our possessing freedom of the will, we find that there is no conflict.

As James admitted, he explained the pragmatic method though examples rather than by giving a detailed analysis of what it involves. He did very little to explain exactly what ‘practical consequences’ are. He made no claim to originality: ‘Pragmatism represents a perfectly familiar attitude in philosophy, the empiricist attitude’, although he acknowledged that it did so ‘in a more radical and in a less objectionable form than it has ever yet assumed’ (1907: 31). It shared with other forms of empiricism an ‘anti-intellectualist tendency’ (ibid), and it recognized that theories (and presumably concepts) should be viewed as ‘instruments, not answers to enigmas’. We identify the ‘practical consequences’ of a theory, concept or hypothesis by describing its role as an instrument in thought, in inquiry and in practical deliberation.

James also admitted that he was not the first to defend ‘the principle of pragmatism.’ (1907: 29). The principle of pragmatism was ‘the principle of Peirce’ his friend and colleague of many years. Published in 1878 in a paper called ‘How to Make our Ideas Clear’ (EP2: 124-141), it ‘lay entirely unnoticed by anyone for twenty years’ until James defended it before the Philosophical Union in the University of California in 1898. If we want a detailed formulation of pragmatism, we must go back to Peirce's original formulation, although we must also be mindful that the differences between the pragmatisms of Peirce and James may be greater than James acknowledged. And although ‘the principle of Peirce’ was published in 1878, it didn't introduce the word ‘pragmatism;’ it was only after James's 1898 address that ‘pragmatism’ was used publicly in philosophy; and it was only after James's defence of pragmatism that it became famous.

Pragmatism had been born in the discussions at a ‘metaphysical club’ in Harvard around 1870 (see Menand 1998). Peirce and James participated in these discussions along with some other philosophers and philosophically inclined lawyers. As we have already noted, Peirce developed these ideas in his publications from the 1870s. And James's lectures in 1898 and later represented the next stages in the development of pragmatism. Both James and Peirce used ‘pragmatism’ as the name of a method, principle, or ‘maxim’ for clarifying concepts and hypotheses and for identifying empty disputes. As we shall see there were differences in how they understood the method and in their views of how it was to be applied.

Later thinkers, for example John Dewey and C.I.Lewis, developed pragmatism further. Although they continued to refer back to Peirce's 1878 paper as the source of pragmatism, and they continued to regard concepts and hypotheses as functioning as instruments, they did not always think of ‘pragmatism’ as denoting ‘the principle of Peirce’. Dewey once described pragmatism as the systematic exploration of what he called ‘the logic and ethics of scientific inquiry.’ (LW: 15.24) Both Peirce and James combined their pragmatism with a distinctive epistemological outlook, one which rejected the Cartesian focus upon the importance of defeating skepticism while endorsing the fallibilist view that any of our beliefs and methods could, in principle, turn out to be flawed. This was tied to the study of the normative standards we should adopt when carrying out inquiries, when trying to find things out. Inquiry is an activity, and this sort of approach, in Dewey's hands, led to a rejection of there being a sharp dichotomy between theoretical judgments and practical judgments. Thus while Peirce and James used ‘pragmatism’ in a narrow sense, as referring to Peirce's principle, others may have used it in a wide sense as standing for a particular approach to understanding inquiry and the normative standards that govern it. Sections 2 and 3 will be concerned, primarily, with pragmatism in the narrow sense. Then, in section 4, we shall explore some of the views that are associated with pragmatism in the wider sense.

2. The pragmatist maxim

As we have seen, the pragmatist maxim is a distinctive rule or method for becoming reflectively clear about the contents of concepts and hypotheses: we clarify a hypothesis by identifying its practical consequences. This raises some questions. First: what, exactly is the content of this maxim? What sort of thing does it recognize as a practical consequence of some theory or claim? Second, what use does such a maxim have? Why do we need it? And third, what reason is there for thinking that the pragmatist maxim is correct? In this section, I shall examine Peirce's answers to some of these questions but, as we proceed, we shall also compare Peirce's answers to these questions with those offered by James.

We can begin with Peirce's canonical statement of his maxim in ‘How to Make our Ideas Clear’.

Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then, our conception of those effects is the whole of our conception of the object. (EP1: 132)

William James cited this passage when introducing pragmatism in his 1906 lectures, and Peirce repeated it in his writings from after 1900.

For all his loyalty to it, Peirce acknowledged that this formulation was vague: it does not explain how we should understand ‘practical consequences’. We shall seek clarity by looking at one of Peirce's illustrative applications of his maxim, by noting some of his later reformulations, and by identifying the uses to which it was put in his writings.

Peirce's first illustrative example (‘the simplest one possible’ (EP1: 132) urges that what we mean by calling something hard is that ‘it will not be scratched by many other substances.’ I can use the concept hard in contexts when I am wondering what to do. Unless there are cases where something's being hard makes a difference to what we experience and what it is rational for us to do, the concept is empty. The principle has a verificationist character: ‘our idea of anything is our idea of its sensible effects’ (EP1: 132) but the use of the phrase ‘practical consequences’ suggests that these are to be understood as having implications for what we will or should do. This is clear from his later formulations, for example:

The entire intellectual purport of any symbol consists in the total of all general modes of rational conduct which, conditionally upon all the possible different circumstances and desires, would ensue upon the acceptance of the symbol. (EP2: 346).

We become clearer about the concept hard, for example, by identifying how there can be conceivable circumstances in which we have desires that would call for different patterns of action if some object were hard to from those it would call for if the object were not hard. If I want to break a window by throwing something through it, then I need an object which is hard, not one which is soft. It is important that, as Peirce hints here, the consequences we are concerned with are general ones: we are to look for the laws that govern the behaviour of hard things and for laws that show how such modes of behaviour on the part of things can make a difference to what it is rational for us to do.

James never worked out his understanding of ‘practical consequences’ as fully as Peirce did, and he does not share Peirce's restriction of these consequences to those that affect ‘intellectual purport’ or to general patterns of behaviour. Sometimes he writes as if the practical consequences of a proposition can simply be effects upon the believer: if religious belief makes me feel better, then that can contribute to the pragmatic clarification of ‘God exists’. It is connected to these differences that James looks upon Peirce's principle as a method for metaphysics: he hopes that the attempt to clarify metaphysical hypotheses will reveal that some propositions are empty or, more important, that, as in the squirrel example, some apparent disagreements are unreal.

Peirce sees uses for his maxim which extend beyond those that James had in mind. He insisted that it was a logical principle and it was defended as an important component of the method of science, his favoured method for carrying out inquiries. This is reflected in the applications of the maxim that we find in his writings. First, he used it to clarify hard concepts that had a role in scientific reasoning: concepts like probability, truth, and reality. We shall discuss his view of truth below. It also had a role in scientific testing. The pragmatist clarification of a scientific hypothesis, for example, provides us with just the information we need for testing it empirically. Pragmatism, described by Peirce as a ‘laboratory philosophy’, shows us how we test theories by carrying out experiments (performing rational actions) in the expectation that if the hypothesis is not true, then the experiment will fail to have some predetermined sensible effect. In later work, Peirce insisted that the maxim revealed all the information that was need for theory testing and evaluation (EP2: 226ff). The pragmatist clarification revealed all the information we would need for testing hypotheses and theories empirically.

Peirce's description of his maxim as a logical principle is reflected in passages where he presents it as a development of  a distinction that had been a staple of traditional logic texts, the distinction, familiar to readers of Descartes, between ideas that are clear and ideas that distinct (EP1: 126f). As Peirce described contemporary versions of this distinction, the highest grade of clarity, distinctness is obtained when we can analyze a concept (for example) into its elements by providing a verbal definition. Peirce complained that ‘nothing new is ever learned by analyzing definitions’, and we can learn from a definition only if we already have a really clear understanding of the defining terms. He announced that a higher grade of ‘perspicuity’ was possible, one that supplemented the verbal definition with a detailed description of how the concept is employed in practice. This was provided by applying the pragmatist maxim.

As well as treating the pragmatist maxim as part of a constructive account of the norms that govern inquiry, Peirce, like James, gave it a negative role. The maxim is used as a tool for criticism, demonstrating the emptiness of a priori ‘ontological metaphysics’. In section 3.1 we shall see how the pragmatic clarification of reality could be used to undermine the flawed ‘nominalistic’ conception of reality that led to the ‘copy theory of truth’, to Cartesian strategies in epistemology and the Kantian assumption that we can possess the concept of a ‘thing in itself’. Such applications reflect Peirce's concern with logic: he uses the maxim to criticize concepts whose use can be an impediment to effective inquiry. A more vivid non-logical example of using the concept to undermine spurious metaphysical ideas was in showing that the Catholic understanding of transubstantiation was empty and incoherent (EP1: 131f). All we can mean by wine is something that has certain distinctive effects upon the senses, ‘and to talk of something as having all the sensible characters of wine, yet being in reality blood, is senseless jargon.’

Why should the pragmatist maxim be accepted? Here another difference between James and Peirce emerges. James made no concerted attempt to show or prove that the principle of pragmatism was correct. In his lectures, he put it into practice, solving problems about squirrels, telling us the meaning of truth, explaining how we can understand propositions about human freedom or about religious matters. But in the end, inspired by these applications, we are encouraged to adopt the maxim and see how well things work out when we do so.

Since Peirce presented the maxim as part of the method of science, as a logical or, perhaps better, methodological principle, he thought that it was important to argue for it. Indeed, after 1900, he devoted much of his energy to showing that the maxim could receive a mathematical proof. He used several strategies for using this. In 1878, he relied upon the idea that beliefs are habits of action: when we form a belief, we acquire a disposition to act in some distinctive way. Applying the pragmatist maxim to the clarification of a proposition, he argued, involved describing the habits of action we would acquire if we believed it (EP1: 127f). In the lectures on pragmatism which he delivered at Harvard in 1903, he adopted a different strategy. He offered a detailed account of the cognitive activities we carried out when we used the method of science: these consisted in the three kinds of inference, inductive, deductive and abductive. His strategy then was to argue that the pragmatist clarifications brought to the surface all the information that was required for responsible abductive reasoning, and that our use of inductive and deductive arguments made no use of conceptual resources that could show that pragmatism was mistaken. (EP2: 225-241; Hookway 2005) None of these arguments fully satisfied him, and the task of fine tuning these arguments and seeking for alternatives was his major philosophical concern of the last ten years of his life. Although he remained optimistic of success in this, he was never satisfied with his results.

3. Pragmatist theories of truth

These differences in motivation become clearest when we consider how both Peirce and James applied their pragmatist maxims to the clarification of the concept of truth. Peirce's account of truth is presented as a means to understanding a concept that was important for the method of science: reality (3.1); while James was ready to use his account to defend the pluralist view that there can be different kinds of truths (3.2).

3.1 Peirce on truth and reality

The final section of ‘How to Make our Ideas Clear’ promises to ‘approach the subject of logic’ by considering a fundamental logical conception, reality. It possesses an form of unreflective clarity: ‘every child uses it with perfect confidence, never dreaming that he does not understand it.’ An abstract definition is also readily forthcoming: ‘we may define the real as that whose characters are independent of what anybody may think them to be.’ But, he announces, we shall need to apply the pragmatic maxim if our idea of reality is to be ‘perfectly clear’. It is at this stage that the concept of truth enters the discussion: Peirce's strategy for clarifying the concept of reality is, first, to give an account of truth, and, then, to observe that ‘the object represented in [a true proposition] is the real’. So we have to turn to his remarks about truth to see how the kind of mind-independence captured in the abstract definition of reality is to be understood from a pragmatist perspective.

Peirce's motivations are evident when he says that ‘the ideas of truth and falsehood, in their full development, appertain exclusively to the scientific (in a later revision he altered this to ‘experiential’) method of settling opinion’. This reflects a law which is evident from scientific experience: when different people use different methods to identify, for example, the velocity of light, we find that all tend to arrive at the same result:

So with all scientific research. Different minds may set out with the most antagonistic views, but the progress of investigation carries them by a force outside of themselves to one and the same conclusion. This activity of thought by which we are carried, not where we wish, but to a foreordained goal, is like the operation of destiny. No modification of the point of view taken, no selection of other facts for study, no natural bent of mind even, can enable a man to escape the predestinate opinion. (EP1: 138)

In the 1878 paper, his pragmatic clarification is quite tersely expressed:

The opinion which is fated to be ultimately agreed to by all who investigate, is what we mean by the truth, and the object represented in this opinion is the real. That is the way I would explain reality. (EP1: 139)

Peirce had presented this way of thinking about reality seven years earlier when he described it as the ‘realist conception of reality’ (EP1:88-9). In doing this, he contrasts it with another ‘nominalist’ conception of reality, which he thinks is flawed, but which many earlier philosophers had accepted. In a review of a new edition of the writings of Berkeley—a philosopher who, according to Peirce, was in the grip of this misleading picture—Peirce asks ‘where the real is to be found’, observing that there must be such a ‘real’ because we find that our opinions (the only things of which we are immediately aware) are constrained. While acknowledging that there is ‘nothing immediately present to us but thoughts’, he continues:

These thoughts, however, have been caused by sensations, and those sensations are constrained by something out of the mind. This thing out of the mind, which directly influences sensation, and through sensation thought, because it is out of the mind, is independent of how we think it, and is, in short, the real. (EP1: 88)

We can then think of the real only as the cause of the (singular) sensations which, in turn, provide our sole evidence for beliefs about the external world, and this naturally leads to both nominalism about universals and skepticism about empirical knowledge. Peirce's pragmatist clarification of truth offers an alternative conceptualization of ‘being constrained by reality’. It is explained in terms of this fated agreement of convergence through the process of inquiry rather than in terms of an independent cause of our sensations. Although the nominalist theory is not clearly worked out here, it is clearly related to the ‘intellectualist’ or ‘copy’ theory of truth attacked by other pragmatists. It articulates a metaphysical picture that all pragmatists tried to combat.

3.2 James on truth

Claims about truth had a much more central role in James's work and he was even prepared to claim that pragmatism was a theory of truth. And his writings on this topic rapidly became notorious. They are characteristically lively, offering contrasting formulations, engaging slogans, and intriguing claims which often seem to fly in the face of common sense. We can best summarize his view through his own words:

The true is the name of whatever proves itself to be good in the way of belief, and good, too, for definite assignable reasons. (1907: 42)

The true’, to put it very briefly, is only the expedient in the way of our thinking, just as ‘the right’ is only the expedient in the way of our behaving. Expedient in almost any fashion; and expedient in the long run and on the whole, of course. (1907: 106)

Other formulations fill this out by giving a central role to experience:

Ideas … become true just in so far as they help us to get into satisfactory relations with other parts of our experience. (1907: 34)

Any idea upon which we can ride …; any idea that will carry us prosperously from any one part of our experience to any other part, linking things satisfactorily, working securely, saving labor; is true for just so much, true in so far forth, true instrumentally. (1907: 34)

This might be taken to suggest that beliefs are made true by the fact that they enable us to make accurate predictions of the future run of experience, but other passages suggest that the ‘goodness of belief’ can take other forms. James assures us that it can contribute to the truth of a theological proposition that it has ‘a value for concrete life’ (1907: 40); and this can occur because the idea of God possesses a majesty which can ‘yield religious comfort to a most respectable class of minds’ (1907: 40). This suggests that a belief can be made true by the fact that holding it contributes to our happiness and fulfilment.

The kind of passages just noted may lend support to Bertrand Russell's famous objection that James is committed to the truth of ‘Santa Claus exists’ (Russell 1949: 772). This is unfair; at best, James is committed to the claim that the happiness that belief in Santa Claus provides is truth-relevant. James could say that the belief was ‘good for so much’ but it would only be ‘wholly true’ if it did not ‘clash with other vital benefits’. It is easy to see that, unless it is somehow insulated from the broader effects of acting upon it, belief in Santa Claus could lead to a host of experiential surprises and disappointments.

4. The pragmatist tradition

So far, we have concentrated on the pragmatist maxim, the rule for clarifying ideas that, for both Peirce and James, was the core of pragmatism. When we think of pragmatism as a philosophical tradition rather than as a maxim or principle, we can identify a set of philosophical views and attitudes which are characteristic of pragmatism, and which can lead us to identify as pragmatists many philosophers who are somewhat sceptical about the maxim and its applications. Some of these views may be closely related to the maxim and its defence, but we shall now explore them rather as distinctive characteristics of the pragmatist tradition. The first of the themes that we shall consider is epistemological, and it picks up on Hilary Putnam's claim that one mark of pragmatism is the combination of anti-skepticism and fallibilism.

Like some other philosophers, the pragmatists saw themselves as providing a return to common sense and the facts of experience and, thus, as rejecting a flawed philosophical heritage which had distorted the work of earlier thinkers. The errors to be overcome include Cartesianism, Nominalism, and the ‘copy theory of truth’: these ‘errors’ are all related.

4.1 Skepticism and fallibilism

The roots of the anti-sceptical strain can be found in an early paper of Peirce's, ‘Some Consequences of Four Incapacities’ (EP1: 28-30). He identifies ‘Cartesianism’ as a philosophical pathology that lost sight of the insights that were both fundamental to scholastic thought and also more suited than Cartesianism to the philosophical needs of his own time. The paper begins by identifying four characteristics of the sort of modern philosophy that is exemplified by Descartes' writings. In each case, Descartes self-consciously made a break with the scholastic tradition, and, in each case, the outlook that he rejected turns out to be the outlook of the successful sciences and to provide the perspective required for contemporary philosophy. The first, and most important, of these characteristics was the ‘method of doubt’: ‘[Cartesianism] teaches that philosophy must begin with universal doubt’. We are to try to doubt propositions and we should retain them only if they are absolutely certain and we are unable to doubt them. The test of certainty, as Peirce next points out, lies in the individual consciousness: trial through doubt is something that everyone must do for him or her self. And the examination of our beliefs is guided by reflection on hypothetical possibilities: we cannot trust our perceptual beliefs, for example, because we cannot rule out the possibility that they are produced by a dream or by wicked scientists manipulating our brains.    

The initial pragmatist response to this strategy has several strands. It is a strategy that we cannot carry out effectively, and there is no reason to adopt it anyway. Peirce begins his response by claiming that any attempt to adopt the method of doubt will be an exercise in self-deception because we possess a variety of certainties which ‘it does not occur to us can be questioned.’ What is produced will not be a ‘real doubt’ and these beliefs will lurk in the background, influencing our reflection when we are supposed to be suspending judgment in them. Peirce urges that we should not ‘pretend to doubt in philosophy what we do not doubt in our hearts’. We should doubt propositions only if we have a real reason to do so. It is necessary to separate some different threads here.

First, there is something unnatural about the Cartesian strategy. Inquiries normally occur within a context: we address particular issues, relying on a body of background certainties that it does not occur to us to question. The Cartesian suggestion that we should begin by trying to doubt everything appears to be an attempt to step outside this context, relying upon no beliefs that we have not ratified though reflective inquiry. Sometimes we may have to question some of our assumptions, but our practice is not to do so unless there is a positive reason for this. Second, the Cartesian strategy requires us to reflect upon each of our beliefs and ask what reason we have for holding it—the sceptical challenges are then used to question the adequacy of these reasons. This is at odds with our normal practice. Many of our familiar certainties are such that we cannot offer any concrete reason for believing them, certainly not one that is wholly convincing. We tend to treat our established beliefs as innocent until ‘proved guilty’. We need reasons for our beliefs when we propose to change them, or when they have been challenged. It is doubt that needs a reason, and we trust our everyday beliefs until given a positive reason for doubting them. The mere lack of a conclusive reason for belief does not itself provide us with a reason for doubt. The Cartesian strategy adopts an unorthodox, revisionary understanding of reason for belief and reason for doubt.

Descartes, of course, might have conceded this, but responded that the revision is required because, once we allow error to enter our corpus of beliefs, we may be unable to escape from its damaging effects. His was a time of controversy about how we should go about fixing our opinions, and he was sensitive to the number of false beliefs he had acquired from his teachers. The pragmatist response here is to question some of his assumptions about how we reason and form our beliefs. First, Descartes' picture is too individualist and ‘to make single individuals absolute judges of truth is most pernicious’:

In sciences in which men come to agreement, when a theory has been broached, it is considered to be on probation until this agreement has been reached. After it is reached, the question of certainty becomes an idle one, because there will be no one left who doubts it. We individually cannot reasonably hope to attain the ultimate philosophy which we pursue; we can only seek it, therefore, for the community of philosophers. (EP1: 29)

Peirce also questions Descartes' understanding of reasoning, suggesting that he holds that we must rely on ‘a single thread of inference’ that is no stronger than its weakest link:

Philosophy ought to imitate the successful sciences in its methods, so far as to proceed only from tangible premises which can be subjected to careful scrutiny, and to trust rather to the multitude and variety of its arguments than to the conclusiveness of any one. Its reasoning should not form a chain which is no stronger than its weakest link, but a cable whose fibres may be ever so slender, provided they are sufficiently numerous and intimately connected. (EP1: 29)

Where the Cartesian begins from the concern that unless we begin from premises of which we can be absolutely certain we may never reach the truth, the pragmatist emphasises that, when we do go wrong, further discussion and investigation can hope to identify and eliminate errors. The possibility of error provides us with reason to be ‘contrite fallibilists’, aware that any of our opinions may, for all we know, require revision in the future, but it does not provide us with any reason for skepticism. The focus of epistemological inquiry should not be on showing how we can possess absolute certainty; instead, we need to understand how we can possess methods of inquiry that contribute to our making fallible progress. Inquiry is a community activity, and the method of science has a self-correcting character. Such are the checks and balances that we can be confident in our cognitive activities.

William James makes similar observations. In ‘The Will to Believe’, he reminds us that we have two cognitive desiderata: we want to obtain truth; and we want to avoid error (James 1879: 30). The harder we try to avoid error, the more likely it is that we will miss out on truths; and the more strenuous we are in searching for truths, the more likely we are to let in errors. The method of doubt may make sense in the special case where an enormous weight is given to avoiding error, even if that means loss of truth. Once we recognize that we are making a practical decision about the relative importance of two goods, the Cartesian strategy no longer appears to be the only rational one. What reason is there to give primary weight to reducing the risk of error?

In his lectures on Pragmatism, James defends a kind of epistemic conservativism that accords with the idea that we do not need reasons for our beliefs when there are no challenges to them to be defeated. He describes how, in the normal case, we have an established body of views and opinions, and issues about what to believe arise when a new experience puts them under strain. We will accept a new opinion when ‘it preserves the older stock of truths with a minimum of modification, stretching them just enough to make them admit the novelty, but conceiving that in ways as familiar as the case leaves possible.’ Thus a true idea ‘marries old opinion to new fact so as ever to a show a minimum of jolt, a maximum of continuity.’ (1907: 34-5) Once again, our beliefs possess a kind of inertia: we need positive reasons to disturb them; but in order to preserve them, all that is required is that we have no reason to abandon them.

James's remarks lead on to the views defended by Dewey in The Quest for Certainty. In developing his views about truth, James saw his antagonist as the ‘rationalist’ or intellectualist. The rationalist seeks substantive a priori knowledge of the nature of truth or of reality, knowledge that is cut off from the exigencies of practice. The traditional distinction between knowledge and opinion suggested that opinion, the useful guide to conduct and practice, is second rate when compared with the secure certainties provided by the philosophers. Rational certainties are supposedly risk-free: untainted by the contingencies of experience, such knowledge is testament to our capacity to grasp the necessary structure of the world. The desire for certainty is part of a perspective that gives little weight to the needs of practice. For the rationalist, ‘the operation of inquiry excludes any element of practical activity that enters into the construction of the object known.’ For the pragmatist, the needs of practice are allowed to contribute to the constitution of objects.

4.2 Inquiry

As has already been suggested, pragmatist accounts of the normative standards we should follow in arriving at beliefs about the world are cast in terms of how we can carry out inquiries in a disciplined, self-controlled way. They provide rich accounts of the capacities we must possess in order to inquire well and the rules, or guiding principles, that we should adopt. A canonical statement of this is found in Peirce's classic paper ‘The Fixation of Belief’. Inquiry is a ‘struggle’ to replace doubt with ‘settled belief’ and Peirce argues that the only method of inquiry that can make sense of the fact that we are disturbed by inconsistent beliefs and that we should reflect upon which methods are correct is the ‘Method of Science’. The method of science is an experimental method, and the application of the pragmatist maxim reveals how hypotheses can be subject to experimental test. A knower is an agent, who obtains empirical support for her beliefs by making experimental interventions in her surroundings and learning from the experiences that her actions elicit. Peirce's writing provide a sophisticated and historically informed account of just how the method of science can work.

Dewey's conception of inquiry, found in his Logic: the Theory of Inquiry is richer and more radical (ED2: 169-79). He sees inquiry as beginning with a problem; we are involved in ‘an indeterminate situation’. And inquiry aims for ‘the controlled or directed transformation of an indeterminate situation into one that is so determinate in its constituent distinctions and relations as to convert the elements of the original situation into a unified whole.’ (ED2: 171)  As John E Smith has put it, ‘Peirce aimed at “fixing” belief, whereas Dewey aimed at “fixing” the situation.’ (1978:98) It is important here that it is the situation that is objectively indeterminate, and it is the situation that is transformed during the course of the inquiry; Dewey is rejecting the common assumptions that all that change are our beliefs about the situation, and that describing the situation as problematic or indeterminate is simply a way of saying that we do not have a clear grasp of it. We begin in a situation where we don't know our way around, and inquiry comes to an end when we do. The ‘pattern of inquiry’ that he describes is common to practical problem solving, common sense investigations of our surroundings, scientific inquiry, the information gathering of animals and so on. Dewey recognizes that when we first face a problem, our first task is to understand our problem through describing its elements and identifying their relations. Identifying a concrete question that we need to answer is a sign that we are already making progress. And the ‘logical forms’ we use in the course of inquiry are understood as ideal instruments, tools that help us to transform things and resolve our problem. The continuities he finds between different kinds of inquiry is evidence of his naturalism and of his recognition that forms of scientific investigation can guide us in all areas of our lives. All the pragmatists, but most of all Dewey, challenge the sharp dichotomy that other philosophers draw between theoretical beliefs and practical deliberations. In some sense, all inquiry is practical, concerned with transforming and evaluating the features of the situations in which we find ourselves.

4.3 The pragmatist conception of experience

As is evident from the pragmatist maxim, pragmatism is a form of empiricism. Our ability to think about external things and to steadily improve our understanding of them rests upon our experience. However, the pragmatists all adopted accounts of experience and perception that were radically different from the views of most earlier modern philosophers such as David Hume and Descartes (see, for example, Smith 1978: chapter three). The established view linked experience to what is sometimes called ‘the given’: we are the passive recipients of atomistic, determinate and singular sensory contents, the kinds of things that are sometimes called sense data. Experience provides the material for knowledge and conceptualization, but it does not itself have a content that is informed by concepts, practical needs, or anything else non-sensory. Our only contact with the external world is through receiving such experiences that, we suppose, are caused by external things; but since these sensory inputs are our only source of knowledge of the external world, we have no direct sensory awareness of external things. It is no surprise that this way of thinking about experience can easily lead to skepticism about the external world.

In different ways, Peirce, James, and Dewey all argued that experience is far richer than the tradition had supposed, and that earlier philosophers were mistaken in their belief that we could identify ‘experiences’ or ‘sense data’ as separable constituents of cognition. We can begin with James's ‘radical empiricism’, of which he said that ‘the establishment of the pragmatist theory of truth [was] a step of first-rate importance in making [it] prevail’ (1909: 6f). The connection with pragmatism is evident from the fundamental ‘postulate’ of radical empiricism: ‘the only things that shall be debatable among philosophers shall be things definable in terms drawn from experience’. But this requires that experience be far richer than earlier philosophers had supposed. First, he announced that ‘the relations between things, conjunctive as well as disjunctive, are just as much matters of direct experience, neither more nor less so, than the things themselves.’ And, second, he concludes that ‘the parts of experience are held together from next to next by relations that are themselves parts of experience. The directly apprehended universe needs, in short, no extraneous trans-empirical connective support, but possesses in its own right a concatenated or continuous structure.’

This suggestion is echoed in Peirce's account of perception. He too emphasizes the continuous character of perceptual experience, and also adds that we directly perceive external things as external, as ‘other’, that we can perceive necessary connections between events, and that experience contains elements of generality. As with James, this is supported by a phenomenological account of our experience, and, again as with James, it is supported by a system of pragmatist metaphysics, a general account of the sorts of things and features that the universe contains.

Dewey's account of experience contributes an additional twist. Like Peirce, he thought that experience was ‘full of inference’. Experience is a process through which we interact with our surroundings, obtaining information that helps us to meet our needs. What we experience is shaped by our habits of expectation and there is no basis for extracting from this complex process the kind of ‘thin given’ beloved of sense datum theorists. We experience all sorts of objects, events and processes, and we should not follow philosophers who seek to impose a distinction between the thin uninterpreted data of experience and the inferential processes which lead us to interpret what we experience as books, people and so on. The dichotomy between the passive given of experience and the rich results of our active conceptualization is not supported by our experience. It is yet another of the philosophers’ distortions.

4.4 Representations

Having discussed pragmatist emphases upon the activity of inquiry and the richness of experience, we should turn to their views about the nature of thought. It has been common for philosophers to assume that the content of a thought, judgment, or other mental state is a kind of intrinsic property that it possesses. Perhaps it offers a ‘picture’ or ‘idea’ of some state of affairs, and we can identify this content simply by reflecting upon the thought itself. All pragmatists have rejected this idea, and all have held that the content of a thought or judgment is a matter of the role it fills in our activities of inquiry. The content of a thought or belief is to be explained by reference to what we do with it or how we interpret it. I shall illustrate this by considering three particular pragmatist views.

First, all of the classic pragmatists identified beliefs and other mental states as habits. According to Peirce, our beliefs ‘Guide our desires and shape our actions’ (EP1: 114). The content of a belief is not determined by its intrinsic phenomenal character; rather, it is determined by its role in determining our actions. This was reflected in Peirce's formulations of his pragmatist maxim. In order to be clear about the content of a concept or hypothesis, we must reflect upon its role in determining what we should do in the light of our desires and our background knowledge. In Robert Brandom's happy form of words, the philosopher ‘makes explicit’ aspects of our practice that are implicit in our habits and dispositions. The role of tacit habits of reasoning and acting in fixing our beliefs and guiding our actions is a theme that recurs in the work of all of the pragmatists.

The second illustration concerns a passage in which James defended his account of truth by urging that it was the concept used in successful science. He identified the ‘traditional view’ that, for early scientists, the ‘clearness, beauty and simplification’ provided by their theories led them to think that they had deciphered authentically the eternal thoughts of the Almighty. By contrast, contemporary scientists held that ‘no theory is absolutely a transcript of reality, but that any of them may from some point of view be useful …’. A scientific theory was to be understood as ‘an instrument: it is designed to achieve a purpose—to facilitate action or increase understanding’ (James 1907: 33). For James and Dewey, this holds of all our concepts and theories: we treat them as instruments, as artefacts to be judged by how well they achieve their intended purpose. The content of a theory or concept is determined by what we should do with it.

The third illustration comes from Peirce's general theory of signs, which offers an account of the contents of thoughts as well as of public signs and language. Peirce insisted that the sign-relation was triadic: a sign or thought is about some object because it is understood, in subsequent thought, as a sign of that object. The subsequent thought is its interpretant. In understanding or interpreting a sign, we will probably draw inferences from it, or undertake actions that are rational in the light of the sign and the other information we possess. Interpretation is generally a goal directed activity. In such cases, our action or the conclusion of our inference is the interpretant; interpretation is not primarily a matter of intellectual recognition of what a sign means. The theory is complex and I will not explore it further here, beyond emphasizing, once again, that the content of a thought is determined by the ways in which we can use it in inference and the planning of action.

5. Other pragmatists

It would be wrong to conclude that pragmatism was restricted to the United States or that the only important pragmatist thinkers were Peirce, James and Dewey. As is documented by Thayer, there were pragmatists in Oxford, in France and, especially, in Italy in the early years of the twentieth century (Thayer 1968, part III, Baldwin 2003: 88-9). Moreover we can mention several other important American pragmatists, for example Josiah Royce. Commonly thought to be an idealist opponent of James and a critic of pragmatism, Royce increasingly came to be influenced by Peirce's work on signs and on the community of inquirers and was acknowledged as a fellow pragmatist by Peirce himself. C.I.Lewis, the teacher of Quine and of several generations of Harvard philosophers developed a philosophy that was a sort of pragmatist Kantianism. Murray Murphey has identified him as ‘the last great pragmatist’ (Murphey 2005). In books such as Mind and the World Order (1929), he defended a pragmatist conception of the a priori, holding that our choices of laws of logic and systems of classification were to be determined by pragmatic criteria (Lewis 1923, 1929; Murphey 2005: chapters four and five). Of comparable importance was George Herbert Mead (see Mead 1934). Close to Dewey, Mead contributed to the social sciences, developing pragmatist perspectives upon the relations between the self and the community.

Dewey's longevity meant that pragmatism remained a philosophical force in the United States well into the twentieth century. The influx of philosophers from Europe in the late 1930s and early 1940s—logical empiricists, members of the Frankfurt School, and others—led to Pragmatist ideas becoming marginalized in the mid-century by providing new and exciting ideas when the pragmatist tradition may have begun to grow stale. Even then it retained some force. The work of Frank Ramsey at Cambridge (Ramsey 1926) in the 1920s developed Peirce's views on statistical reasoning and on inquiry in ways that provided fertile research programmes through much of the century, for example in the work of Isaac Levi at Columbia (Levi 1999). As Russell Goodman has documented (2002), Wittgenstein's later thought acquired a pragmatist flavour though his reading of James's Varieties of Religious Experience (1902). And there was always a relatively small but lively group of scholars who strove to maintain the values of what was championed as a distinctive American philosophical tradition even when this tradition was largely ignored by the philosophical establishment.

In the last few decades of the twentieth century, scholarly work on pragmatist philosophy increased in both quantity and quality, making possible an appreciation of the sophistication of the pragmatist philosophers and enabling readers to escape from the of familiar caricatures of the position. Lacking the space to discuss all aspects of these developments, I shall comment on just two or three leading philosophers who have allowed their reading of the pragmatists to shape their conception of philosophy (Misak (ed) 1999 passim; Haack 1993).

Richard Rorty has described his philosophy as ‘pragmatist’ on a number of occasions. Where Peirce and Dewey—and even perhaps James—were engaged in working out systematic philosophical visions, Rorty treated ‘pragmatism’ as something more negative. What pragmatists teach us about truth, he tells us, is that there is nothing very systematic or constructive to say about truth at all. In particular, this concept does not capture any systematic or metaphysical relation between our beliefs and utterances, on the one hand, and reality on the other. We can describe what we do with the word ‘true’: we use it to express our endorsement of beliefs and sentences, and sometimes we might find it useful to express our fallibility by saying that some of our beliefs may not be true. But, beyond talking about the rather trivial formal properties of the concept, there is nothing more to be said. He also uses what he describes as a ‘pragmatist’ principle to show that the truth cannot be our aim when we inquire. This principle holds that we can only adopt something as an aim when we are able to recognize that it has been achieved: it must thus make a practical difference whether a proposition is true or not. And since we are fallible, we are never in a position to recognize that one of our beliefs is actually true—all we can recognize is that it meets standards of acceptance that are endorsed, for the time being, in our community (Rorty 1991a: chapter one; 2000; Davidson 2005: 7; Hookway 2007). The consequentialist character of pragmatist ideas is also reflected in his account of how we can criticize and revise our view of the world. We should be free to propose new ‘vocabularies’—systems of classification and description. We do not test these vocabularies by seeing whether they enable us to discover truths or by showing that they can be read off the nature of reality. Instead, we evaluate them by seeing how they enable us to achieve our goals and formulate better and more satisfying goals (Rorty 1995).

Hilary Putnam denies that he is a pragmatist because he does not think that a pragmatist account of truth can be sustained. Indeed, he shows little sympathy for the pragmatist maxim. However he has written extensively on James, Peirce, and Dewey—often in collaboration with Ruth Anna Putnam—and he has provided insightful accounts of what is distinctive about pragmatism and about what can be learned from it (See Putnam 1994a). He has identified four characteristics of pragmatism: the rejection of skepticism; the willingness to embrace fallibilism; the rejection of sharp dichotomies such as those between fact and value, thought and experience, mind and body, analytic and synthetic etc; and what he calls ‘the primacy of practice’ (1994c). He appears to count as a pragmatist in the wider sense but not as a pragmatist in the narrow sense that requires acceptance of the pragmatist maxim. With the turn of the twenty first century, he has made ambitious claims for the prospects of a pragmatist epistemology. After surveying the apparent failures of the original enlightenment project, and attributing them to the fact that enlightenment philosophers were unable to overcome the fundamental dichotomies mentioned above, he expresses the hope that the future might contain a ‘pragmatist enlightenment’ (Putnam 2004: 89-108). The rich understanding of experience and science offered by pragmatists may show how to find an objective basis for the evaluation and criticism of institutions and practices. He is particularly struck by the suggestion that pragmatist epistemology, by emphasizing the communal character of inquiry and the need to take account of the experiences and contributions of other inquirers, provides a basis for a defence of democratic values (1993: 1180-202). This may be related to Rorty's suggestion that pragmatists insist upon the priority of democracy over philosophy (Rorty 1991b).

Another symptom of a pragmatist revival is found in the work of Robert Brandom, in books such as Making it Explicit, and Articulating Reasons. Brandom's philosophical interests are rather different from those of the classical pragmatists. Indeed, the classical pragmatists, of whom he is quite critical, do not evidently influence his work. It owes more to philosophers such as Wilfrid Sellars and Quine and his teacher Richard Rorty. His concerns are mostly with semantics and the philosophy of language, developing a version of inferential role semantics in order to construct accounts of our use of words like ‘true’ and ‘refers to’ which are liberated from the ‘representationalist’ idea that the function of thought and language is ‘to provide a transcript of reality’. The connection to pragmatism is that his approach to language is focused upon what we do with language, with our practices of making assertions and of challenging or evaluating the assertions of others. He joins the pragmatists in denying that truth is a substantial metaphysical property that can be possessed by some propositions and not be others, and in focusing upon how this kind of discourse has a role in our practices, upon how truth or reference makes a difference in practice.

6. Conclusion

We have examined pragmatism in the narrow sense (the pragmatist maxim as a rule for clarifying concepts and hypotheses) and pragmatism in a wider sense. The latter involves a range of approaches to problems in epistemology, metaphysics and many other areas of philosophy that tend to display a broad common pattern. When pragmatism began, in the work of Peirce and James, pragmatism in the narrow sense was most important; while more recent manifestations of pragmatism have tended to give most weight to pragmatism in the wider sense. Many recent pragmatists are doubtful that a defensible form of the maxim can be found. However the connections between the two are clear. The pragmatist maxim was first developed in the context of a fallibilist, broadly empiricist approach to the study of inquiry, and it is this approach to inquiry that is central to pragmatism in the wider sense.


As well as identifying some of the primary texts of pragmatism and listing works referred to in the article, the bibliography also contains some books which can be studied to supplement the current article.

Primary texts of the classical pragmatists

For both Peirce and Dewey, references are given to excellent two volume collections of their writings. This is because Peirce's philosophical writings consist of a great number of papers and manuscripts and because Dewey wrote so many books that it would be impossible to list all of them.

Collections of papers by classic and contemporary pragmatists.

Other references and supplementary reading

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Dewey, John | Dewey, John: aesthetics | Dewey, John: moral philosophy | Dewey, John: political philosophy | feminism, approaches to: pragmatism | James, William | Lewis, Clarence Irving | Peirce, Charles Sanders | Peirce, Charles Sanders: theory of signs | pragmatic arguments and belief in God | Rorty, Richard