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Theory and Observation in Science

First published Tue Jan 6, 2009

Scientists obtain a great deal of the evidence they use by observing natural and experimentally generated objects and effects. Much of the standard philosophical literature on this subject comes from 20th century logical positivists and empiricists, their followers, and critics who embraced their issues and accepted some of their assumptions even as they objected to specific views. Their discussions of observational evidence tend to focus on epistemological questions about its role in theory testing. This entry follows their lead even though observational evidence also plays important and philosophically interesting roles in other areas including scientific discovery and the application of scientific theories to practical problems.

The issues that get the most attention in the standard philosophical literature on observation and theory have to do with the distinction between observables and unobservables, the form and content of observation reports, and the epistemic bearing of observational evidence on theories it is used to evaluate. This entry discusses these topics under the following headings:

1. Introduction

Reasoning from observations has been important to scientific practice at least since the time of Aristotle who mentions a number of sources of observational evidence including animal dissection (Aristotle(a) 763a/30–b/15, Aristotle(b) 511b/20–25). But philosophers didn't talk about observation as extensively, in as much detail, or in the way we have become accustomed to, until the 20th century when logical empiricists and logical positivists transformed philosophical thinking about it.

The first transformation was accomplished by ignoring the implications of a long standing distinction between observing and experimenting. To experiment is to isolate, prepare, and manipulate things in hopes of producing epistemically useful evidence. It had been customary to think of observing as noticing and attending to interesting details of things perceived under more or less natural conditions, or by extension, things perceived during the course of an experiment. To look at a berry on a vine and attend to its color and shape would be to observe it. To extract its juice and apply reagents to test for the presence of copper compounds would be to perform an experiment. Contrivance and manipulation influence epistemically significant features of observable experimental results to such an extent that epistemologists ignore them at their peril. Robert Boyle (1661), John Herschell (1830), Bruno Latour and Steve Woolgar (1979), Ian Hacking (1983), Harry Collins (1985) Allan Franklin (1986), Peter Galison (1987), Jim Bogen and Jim Woodward (1988), and Hans-Jörg Rheinberger(1997), are some of the philosophers and philosophically minded scientists, historians, and sociologists of science who gave serious consideration to the distinction between observing and experimentation. The logical empiricists and positivists tended to ignore it.

A second transformation, characteristic of the linguistic turn in philosophy, was to shift attention away from things observed in natural or experimental settings and concentrate instead on the logic of observation reports. The shift was justified by appeal, first of all, to the assumption that a scientific theory is a system of sentences or sentence like structures (propositions, statements, claims, and so on) to be tested by comparison to observational evidence. Secondly it was assumed that the comparisons must be understood in terms of inferential relations. If inferential relations hold only between sentences or propositions, it follows that, theories must be tested, not against observations or things observed, but against sentences used to report observations. (Hempel 1935, 50–51. Schlick 1935)

Friends of this line of thought theorized about the syntax, semantics, and pragmatics of observation sentences, and inferential connections between observation and theoretical sentences. In doing so they hoped to articulate and explain the authoritativeness widely conceded to the best natural, social and behavioral scientific theories. Some pronouncements from astrologers, medical quacks, and other pseudo scientists gain wide acceptance, as do those of religious leaders who rest their cases on faith or personal revelation, and rulers and governmental officials who use their political power to secure assent. But such claims do not enjoy the kind of credibility that scientific theories can attain. The logical positivists and empiricists tried to account for this by appeal to the objectivity and accessibility of observation reports, and the logic of theory testing.

Part of what they meant by calling observational evidence objective was that cultural and ethnic factors have no bearing on what can validly be inferred about the merits of a theory from observation reports. So conceived, objectivity was important to the positivists' and empiricists' criticism of the Nazi idea that Jews and Aryans have fundamentally different thought processes such that physical theories suitable for Einstein and his kind should not be inflicted on German students. In response to this rationale for ethnic and cultural purging of the German education system the positivists and empiricists argued that observational evidence should be used to evaluate scientific theories because of its objectivity. (Galison 1990). Less dramatically, the efforts working scientists put into producing objective evidence attest to the importance they attach to objectivity. Furthermore it is possible, in principle at least, to make observation reports and the reasoning used to draw conclusions from them available for public scrutiny. If observational evidence is objective, it can provide people with what they need to decide for themselves which theories to accept without having to rely unquestioningly on authorities.

Although theory testing dominates much of the standard philosophical literature on observation, it is by no means the only use to which observational evidence is put. Francis Bacon argued long ago that the best way to discover things about nature is to use experiences (his term for observations as well as experimental results) to develop and improve scientific theories (Bacon1620 49ff). The role of observational evidence in scientific discovery was an important topic for Whewell (1858) and Mill (1872) among others in the 19th century. Recently, Judaea Pearl, Clark Glymour, and their students and associates addressed it rigorously in the course of developing techniques for inferring claims about causal structures from statistical features of the data they give rise to (Pearl, 2000; Spirtes, Glymour, and Scheines 2000). But such work is exceptional. For the most part, philosophers follow Karl Popper who maintained, contrary to the title of one of his best known books, that there is no such thing as a ‘logic of discovery’. (Popper 1959, 31) Drawing a sharp distinction between discovery and justification, the standard philosophical literature devotes most of its attention to the latter. Although most of what follows addresses questions about theory testing, some of it can be applied to questions about how observation figures in inventing, developing and modifying theories.

Theories are customarily represented as collections of sentences, propositions, statements or beliefs, etc., and their logical consequences. Among these are maximally general explanatory and predictive laws (Coulomb's law of electrical attraction and repulsion, and Maxwellian electromagnetism equations for example), along with lesser generalizations that describe more limited natural and experimental phenomena (e.g., the ideal gas equations describing relations between temperatures and pressures of enclosed gasses, and general descriptions of positional astronomical regularities). Observations are used in testing generalizations of both kinds.

Some philosophers prefer to represent theories as collections of ‘states of physical or phenomenal systems’ and laws. The laws for any given theory are

…relations over states which determine…possible behaviors of phenomenal systems within the theory's scope. (Suppe 1977, 710)

So conceived, a theory can be adequately represented by more than one linguistic formulation because it is not a system of sentences or propositions. Instead, it is a non-linguistic structure which can function as a semantic model of its sentential or propositional representations. (Suppe 1977, 221–230) This entry treats theories as collections of sentences or sentential structures with or without deductive closure. But the questions it takes up arise in pretty much the same way when theories are represented in accordance with this semantic account.

2. What do observation reports describe?

One answer to this question assumes that observation is a perceptual process so that to observe is to look at, listen to, touch, taste, or smell something, attending to details of the resulting perceptual experience. Observers may have the good fortune to obtain useful perceptual evidence simply by noticing what's going on around them, but in many cases they must arrange and manipulate things to produce informative perceptible results. In either case, observation sentences describe perceptions or things perceived.

Observers use magnifying glasses, microscopes, or telescopes to see things that are too small or far away to be seen, or seen clearly enough, without them. Similarly, amplification devices are use to hear faint sounds. But if to observe something is to perceive it, not every use of instruments to augment the senses qualifies as observational. Philosophers agree that you can observe the moons of Venus with a telescope, or a heart beat with a stethoscope. But minimalist empiricists like Bas Van Fraassen (1980, 16–17) deny that one can observe things that can be visualized only by using electron (and perhaps even) light microscopes. Many philosophers don't mind microscopes but find it unnatural at best to say that high energy physicists observe particles or particle interactions when they look at bubble chamber photographs. Their intuitions come from the plausible assumption that one can observe only what one can see by looking, hear by listening, feel by touching, and so on. Investigators can neither look at (direct their gazes toward and attend to) nor visually experience charged particles moving through a bubble chamber. Instead they can look at and see tracks in the chamber, or in bubble chamber photographs.

The identification of observation and perceptual experience persisted well into the 20th century—so much so that Carl Hempel could characterize the scientific enterprise as an attempt to predict and explain the deliverances of the senses (Hempel 1952, 653). This was to be accomplished by using laws or lawlike generalizations along with descriptions of initial conditions, correspondence rules, and auxiliary hypotheses to derive observation sentences describing the sensory deliverances of interest. Theory testing was treated as a matter of comparing observation sentences describing real world observations to observation sentences that should be true according to the theory to be tested. This makes it imperative to ask what observation sentences report. Even though scientists often record their evidence non-sententially, e.g., in the form of pictures, graphs, and tables of numbers, some of what Hempel says about the meanings of observation sentences applies to non-sentential observational records as well.

According to what Hempel called the phenomenalist account, observation reports describe the observer's subjective perceptual experiences.

…Such experiential data might be conceived of as being sensations, perceptions, and similar phenomena of immediate experience. (Hempel 1952, 674)

This view is motivated by the assumption that the epistemic value of an observation report depends upon its truth or accuracy, and that with regard to perception, the only thing observers can know with certainty is how things appear to them. This means that we can't be confident that observation reports are true or accurate if they describe anything beyond the observer's own perceptual experience. Presumably one's confidence in a conclusion should not exceed one's confidence in one best reasons to believe it. For the phenomenalist it follows that reports of subjective experience can provide better reasons to believe claims they support than reports of other kinds of evidence. Furthermore, if C.I. Lewis was right to think that probabilities cannot be established on the basis of dubitable evidence, (Lewis 1950, 182) observation sentences have no evidential value unless they report the observer's subjective experiences.[1]

But given the expressive limitations of the language available for reporting subjective experiences we can't expect phenomenalistic reports to be precise and unambiguous enough to test theoretical claims whose evaluation requires accurate, fine- grained perceptual discriminations. Worse yet, if the experience an observer describes is directly available only to the observer there is room to doubt whether different people can understand the same observation sentence in the same way. Suppose you had to evaluate a claim on the basis of someone else's subjective report of how a litmus solution looked to her when she dripped a liquid of unknown acidity into it. How could you decide whether her visual experience was the same as the one you would use her words to report?

Such considerations lead Hempel to propose, contrary to the phenomenalists, that observation sentences report ‘directly observable’, ‘intersubjectively ascertainable’ facts about physical objects

…such as the coincidence of the pointer of an instrument with a numbered mark on a dial; a change of color in a test substance or in the skin of a patient; the clicking of an amplifier connected with a Geiger counter; etc. (ibid.)

Observers do sometmes have trouble making fine pointer position and color discriminations but such things are more susceptible to precise, intersubjectively understandable descriptions than subjective experiences. How much precision and what degree of intersubjective agreement it takes in any given case depends on what is being tested and how the observation sentence is used to evaluate it. But all things being equal, we can't expect data whose acceptability depends upon delicate subjective discriminations to be as reliable as data whose acceptability depends upon facts that can be ascertained intersubjectively. And similarly for non-sentential records; a drawing of what the observer takes to be the position of a pointer can be more reliable and easier to assess than a drawing that purports to capture the observer's subjective visual experience of the pointer.

The fact that science is seldom a solitary pursuit suggests that one might be able to use pragmatic considerations to finesse questions about what observation reports express. Scientific claims—especially those with practical and policy applications—are typically used for purposes that are best served by public evaluation. Furthermore the development and application of a scientific theory typically requires collaboration and in many cases is promoted by competition. This, together with the fact that investigators must agree to accept putative evidence before they use it to test a theoretical claim, imposes a pragmatic condition on observation reports: an observation report must be such that investigators can reach agreement relatively quickly and relatively easily about whether it provides good evidence with which to test a theory (Cf. Neurath 1913). Feyerabend took this requirement seriously enough to characterize observation sentences pragmatically in terms of widespread decidability. In order to be an observation sentence, he said, a sentence must be contingently true or false, and such that competent speakers of the relevant language can quickly and unanimously decide whether to accept or reject it on the basis what happens when they look, listen, etc. in the appropriate way under the appropriate observation conditions (Feyerabend 1959, 18ff).

The requirement of quick, easy decidability and general agreement favors Hempel's account of what observation sentences report over the phenomenalist's. But one shouldn't rely on data whose only virtue is widespread acceptance. Presumably the data must possess additional features by virtue of which it can serve as an epistemically trustworthy guide to a theory's acceptability. If epistemic trustworthiness requires certainty, this requirement favors the phenomenalists. Even if it trustworthiness doesn't require certainty, it is not the same thing as quick and easy decidability. Philosophers need to address the question of how these two requirements can be mutually satisfied.

3. Is observation an exclusively perceptual process?

Many of the things scientists investigate do not interact with human perceptual systems as required to produce perceptual experiences of them. The methods investigators use to study such things argue against the idea—however plausible it may once have seemed—that scientists do or should rely exclusively on their perceptual systems to obtain the evidence they need. Thus Feyerabend proposed as a thought experiment that if measuring equipment was rigged up to register the magnitude of a quantity of interest, a theory could be tested just as well against its outputs as against records of human perceptions (Feyerabend 1969, 132-137).

Feyerabend could have made his point with historical examples instead of thought experiments. A century earlier Helmholtz estimated the speed of excitatory impulses traveling through a motor nerve. To initiate impulses whose speed could be estimated, he implanted an electrode into one end of a nerve fiber and ran current into it from a coil. The other end was attached to a bit of muscle whose contraction signaled the arrival of the impulse. To find out how long it took the impulse to reach the muscle he had to know when the stimulating current reached the nerve. But

[o]ur senses are not capable of directly perceiving an individual moment of time with such small duration…

and so Helmholtz had to resort to what he called ‘artificial methods of observation’ (Olesko and Holmes 1994, 84). This meant arranging things so that current from the coil could deflect a galvanometer needle. Assuming that the magnitude of the deflection is proportional to the duration of current passing from the coil, Helmholtz could use the deflection to estimate the duration he could not see (ibid). This ‘artificial observation’ is not to be confused e.g., with using magnifying glasses or telescopes to see tiny or distant objects. Such devices enable the observer to scrutinize visible objects. The miniscule duration of the current flow is not a visible object. Helmholtz studied it by looking at and seeing something else. (Hooke (1705, 16-17) argued for and designed instruments to execute the same kind of strategy in the 17th century.) The moral of Feyerabend's thought experiment and Helmholtz's distinction between perception and artificial observation is that working scientists are happy to call things that register on their experimental equipment observables even if they don't or can't register on their senses.

Some evidence is produced by processes so convoluted that it's hard to decide what, if anything has been observed. Consider functional magnetic resonance images (fMRI) of the brain decorated with colors to indicate magnitudes of electrical activity in different regions during the performance of a cognitive task. To produce these images, brief magnetic pulses are applied to the subject's brain. The magnetic force coordinates the precessions of protons in hemoglobin and other bodily stuffs to make them emit radio signals strong enough for the equipment to respond to. When the magnetic force is relaxed, the signals from protons in highly oxygenated hemoglobin deteriorate at a detectably different rate than signals from blood that carries less oxygen. Elaborate algorithms are applied to radio signal records to estimate blood oxygen levels at the places from which the signals are calculated to have originated. There is good reason to believe that blood flowing just downstream from spiking neurons carries appreciably more oxygen than blood in the vicinity of resting neurons. Assumptions about the relevant spatial and temporal relations are used to estimate levels of electrical activity in small regions of the brain corresponding to pixels in the finished image. The results of all of these computations are used to assign the appropriate colors to pixels in a computer generated image of the brain. The role of the senses in fMRI data production is limited to such things as monitoring the equipment and keeping an eye on the subject. Their epistemic role is limited to discriminating the colors in the finished image, reading tables of numbers the computer used to assign them, and so on.

If fMRI images record observations, it's hard to say what was observed—neuronal activity, blood oxygen levels, proton precessions, radio signals, or something else. (If anything is observed, the radio signals that interact directly with the equipment would seem to be better candidates than blood oxygen levels or neuronal activity.) Furthermore, it's hard to reconcile the idea that fMRI images record observations with the traditional empiricist notion that much as they may be needed to draw conclusions from observational evidence, calculations involving theoretical assumptions and background beliefs must not be allowed (on pain of loss of objectively) to intrude into the process of data production. The production of fMRI images requires extensive statistical manipulation based on theories about the radio signals, and a variety of factors having to do with their detection along with beliefs about relations between blood oxygen levels and neuronal activity, sources of systematic error, and so on.

In view of all of this, functional brain imaging differs, e.g., from looking and seeing, photographing, and measuring with a thermometer or a galvanometer in ways that make it uninformative to call it observation at all. And similarly for many other methods scientists use to produce non-perceptual evidence.

Terms like ‘observation’ and ‘observation reports’ don't occur nearly as much in scientific as in philosophical writings. In their place, working scientists tend to talk about data. Philosophers who adopt this usage are free to think about standard examples of observation as members of a large, diverse, and growing family of data production methods. Instead of trying to decide which methods to classify as observational and which things qualify as observables, philosophers can then concentrate on the epistemic influence of the factors that differentiate members of the family. In particular, they can focus their attention on what questions data produced by a given method can be used to answer, what must be done to use that data fruitfully, and the credibility of the answers they afford.

It is of interest that records of perceptual observation are not always epistemically superior to data from experimental equipment. Indeed it is not unusual for investigators to use non-perceptual evidence to evaluate perceptual data and correct for its errors. For example, Rutherford and Pettersson conducted similar experiments to find out if certain elements disintegrated to emit charged particles under radioactive bombardment. To detect emissions, observers watched a scintillation screen for faint flashes produced by particle strikes. Pettersson's assistants reported seeing flashes from silicon and certain other elements. Rutherford's did not. Rutherford's colleague, James Chadwick, visited Petterson's laboratory to evaluate his data. Instead of watching the screen and checking Pettersson's data against what he saw, Chadwick arranged to have Pettersson's assistants watch the screen while unbeknownst to them he manipulated the equipment, alternating normal operating conditions with a condition in which particles, if any, could not hit the screen. Pettersson's data were discredited by the fact that his assistants reported flashes at close to the same rate in both conditions (Steuwer 1985, 284-288).

Related considerations apply to the distinction between observable and unobservable objects of investigation. Some data are produced to help answer questions about things that do not themselves register on the senses or experimental equipment. Solar neutrino fluxes are a frequently discussed case in point. Neutrinos don't have enough mass to interact directly with the senses or with measuring equipment. Fluxes in their emission were studied by trapping the neutrinos and allowing them to interact with chlorine to produce a radioactive argon isotope. Experimentalists could then calculate fluxes in solar neutrino emission from Geiger counter measurements of radiation from the isotope. The epistemic significance of the neutrinos' unobservability depends upon factors having to do with the reliability of the data the investigators managed to produce, and its validity as a source of information about the fluxes. It's validity will depend, among many other things, on the correctness of the investigators ideas about how neutrinos interact with chlorine (Pinch 1985). But there are also unobservables that cannot be detected, and whose features cannot be inferred from data of any kind. These are the only unobservables that are epistemically unavailable. Whether they remain so depends upon whether scientists can figure out how to produce data to study them.

4. How observational evidence might be theory laden

Thomas Kuhn, Norwood Hanson, Paul Feyerabend, and others cast suspicion on the objectivity of observational evidence by challenging the assumption that observers can shield it from biases imposed by their “paradigm” and theoretical commitments. Even though some of the examples they use to present their case feature equipment generated evidence, they tend to talk about observation as a perceptual process. As Hanson (1958,19) put it, ‘seeing is a “theory laden” undertaking.’

Kuhn's writings contain three different versions of this idea.

K1. Perceptual Theory Loading. Perceptual psychologists, Bruner and Postman, found that subjects who were briefly shown anomalous playing cards, e.g., a black four of hearts, reported having seen their normal counterparts. e.g., a red four of hearts. It took repeated exposures to get them to say the anomalous cards didn't look right, and eventually, to describe them correctly. (Kuhn 1962, 63). Kuhn took such studies to indicate that things don't look the same to observers with different conceptual resources. If so, black hearts didn't look like black hearts until repeated exposures somehow allowed the subjects to acquire the concept of a black heart. By analogy, Kuhn supposed, when observers working in conflicting paradigms look at the same thing, their conceptual limitations should keep them from having the same visual experiences (Kuhn 1962, 111, 113-114, 115, 120-1). This would mean, for example, that when Priestley and Lavoisier watched the same experiment, Lavioisier should have seen what accorded with his theory that combustion and respiration are oxidation processes, while Priestley's visual experiences should have agreed with his theory that burning and respiration are processes of phlogiston release.

K2. Semantical Theory Loading: Kuhn argued that theoretical commitments exert a strong influence on observation descriptions, and what they are understood to mean (Kuhn 1962, 127ff). If so, proponents of a caloric account of heat won't describe or understand descriptions of observed results of heat experiments in the same way as investigators who think of heat in terms of mean kinetic energy or radiation. They might all use the same words (e.g., ‘temperature’) to report an observation without understanding them in the same way.

K3. Salience: Kuhn claimed that if Galileo and an Aristotelian physicist had watched the same pendulum experiment, they would not have looked at or attended to the same things. The Aristotelian's paradigm would have required the experimenter to measure

…the weight of the stone, the vertical height to which it had been raised, and the time required for it to achieve rest (Kuhn 1992, 123)

and ignore radius, angular displacement, and time per swing (Kuhn 1962, 124).

These last were salient to Galileo because he treated pendulum swings as constrained circular motions. The Galilean quantities would be of no interest to an Aristotelian who treats the stone as falling under constraint toward the center of the earth (Kuhn 1962, 123). Thus Galileo and the Aristotelian would not have collected the same data. (Absent records of Aristotelian pendulum experiments we can think of this as a thought experiment.)

5. Salience and theoretical stance

Taking K1, K2, and K3 in order of plausibility, K3 points to an important fact about scientific practice. Theoretical commitments sometimes lead investigators to produce unilluminating data by attending to the wrong things. Fortunately, this doesn't always happen, and when it does, investigators can sometimes come to appreciate the significance of data that had not originally been salient to them. Thus paradigms and theoretical commitments actually do influence saliency, but their influence is neither inevitable nor irremediable.

6. Semantic theory loading

With regard to semantic theory loading (K2), it's important to bear in mind that observers don't always use declarative sentences to report observational and experimental results. They often draw, photograph, make audio recordings, etc. instead or set up their experimental devices to generate graphs, pictorial images, tables of numbers, and other non-sentential records. Obviously investigators' conceptual resources and theoretical biases can exert epistemically significant influences on what they record (or set their equipment to record), which details they include or emphasize, and which forms of representation they choose (Daston and Galison 2007,115–190 309–361). But disagreements about the epistemic import of a graph, picture or other non-sentential bit of data often turn on causal rather than semantical considerations. Anatomists often have to decide whether a dark spot in a micrograph was caused by a staining artifact or by light reflected from an anatomically significant structure. Physicists may wonder whether a blip in a Geiger counter record reflects the causal influence of the radiation they wanted to monitor, or a surge in ambient radiation. Chemists may worry about the purity of samples used to obtain data. Such questions are not, and are not well represented as, semantic questions to which K2 is relevant. Late 20th century philosophers may have ignored such cases and exaggerated the influence of semantic theory loading because they thought of theory testing in terms of inferential relations between observation and theoretical sentences.

With regard to sentential observation reports, the significance of semantic theory loading is less ubiquitous than one might expect. The interpretation of verbal reports often depends on ideas about causal structure rather than the meanings of signs. Rather than worrying about the meaning of words used to describe their observations, scientists are more likely to wonder whether the observers made up or withheld information, whether one or more details were artifacts of observation conditions, whether the specimens were atypical, and so on.

Kuhnian paradigms are heterogeneous collections of experimental practices, theoretical principles, problems selected for investigation, and approaches to their solution, etc. Connections between their components are loose enough to allow investigators who disagree profoundly over one or more theoretical claims to agree about how to design, execute, and record the results of their experiments. That is why neuroscientists who disagreed about whether nerve impulses consisted of electrical currents could measure the same electrical quantities, and agree on the linguistic meaning and the accuracy of observation reports including such terms as ‘potential’, ‘resistance’, ‘voltage’ and ‘current’.

7. Operationalization and observation reports

The issues this section touches on are distant, linguistic descendents of issues that arose in connection with Locke's view that mundane and scientific concepts (the empiricists called them ideas) derive their contents from experience (Locke 1700, 104–121,162–164, 404–408).

Looking at a patient with red spots, a fever, etc., an investigator may report having seen the spots and the thermometer reading, or measles symptoms, or a patient with measles. Watching an unknown liquid dripping into a litmus solution an observer might report seeing a change in color, a liquid with a PH of less than 7, or an acid. The appropriateness of a description of a test outcome depends on how the relevant concepts were operationalized. What justifies an observer to report having observed a case of measles according to one operationalization might require her to say no more than that she had observed symptoms according to another.

In keeping with Percy Bridgman's view that

…in general, we mean by a concept nothing more than a set of operations; the concept is synonymous with the corresponding sets of operations. (Bridgman 1927, 5)

one might suppose that operationalizations are definitions or meaning rules such that it is analytically true, e.g., that every liquid that turns litmus red in a properly conducted test is acidic. But it is more faithful to actual scientific practice to think of operationalizations as defeasible rules for the application of a concept such that both the rules and their applications are subject to revision on the basis of new empirical or theoretical developments. So understood, to operationalize is to adopt verbal and related practices for the purpose of enabling scientists to do their work. Operationalizations are thus sensitive and subject to change on the basis of findings that influence their usefulness (Feest, 2005).

Definitional or not, investigators in different research traditions may be trained to report their observations in conformity with conflicting operationalizations. Thus instead of training observers to describe what they see in a bubble chamber as a whitish streak or a trail, one might train them to say they see a particle track or even a particle. This may reflect what Kuhn meant by suggesting that some observers might be justified or even required to describe themselves as having seen oxygen, transparent and colorless though it is, or atoms, invisible though they are. (Kuhn 1962, 127ff) To the contrary, one might object that what one sees should not be confused with what one is trained to say when one sees it, and therefore that talking about seeing a colorless gas or an invisible particle may be nothing more than a picturesque way of talking about what certain operationalizations entitle observers to say. Strictly speaking, the objection concludes, the term ‘observation report’ should be reserved for descriptions that are neutral with respect to conflicting operationalizations.

If observational data are just those utterances that meet Feyerabend's decidability and agreeability conditions, the import of semantic theory loading depends upon how quickly, and for which sentences reasonably sophisticated language users who stand in different paradigms can non-inferentially reach the same decisions about what to assert or deny. Some would expect enough agreement to secure the objectivity of observational data. Others would not. Still others would try to supply different standards for objectivity.

8. Is perception theory laden?

The example of Pettersson's and Rutherford's scintillation screen evidence (above) attests to the fact that observers working in different laboratories sometimes report seeing different things under similar conditions. It's plausible that their expectations influence their reports. It's plausible that their expectations are shaped by their training and by their supervisors' and associates' theory driven behavior. But as happens in other cases as well, all parties to the dispute agreed to reject Pettersson's data by appeal to results of mechanical manipulations both laboratories could obtain and interpret in the same way without compromising their theoretical commitments.

Furthermore proponents of incompatible theories often produce impressively similar observational data. Much as they disagreed about the nature of respiration and combustion, Priestley and Lavoisier gave quantitatively similar reports of how long their mice stayed alive and their candles kept burning in closed bell jars. Priestley taught Lavoisier how to obtain what he took to be measurements of the phlogiston content of an unknown gas. A sample of the gas to be tested is run into a graduated tube filled with water and inverted over a water bath. After noting the height of the water remaining in the tube, the observer adds “nitrous air” (we call it nitric oxide) and checks the water level again. Priestley, who thought there was no such thing as oxygen, believed the change in water level indicated how much phlogiston the gas contained. Lavoisier reported observing the same water levels as Priestley even after he abandoned phlogiston theory and became convinced that changes in water level indicated free oxygen content (Conant 1957, 74–109).

The moral of these examples is that although paradigms or theoretical commitments sometimes have an epistemically significant influence on what observers perceive, it can be relatively easy to nullify or correct for their effects.

9. How do observational data bear on the acceptability of theoretical claims?

Typical responses to this question maintain that the acceptability of theoretical claims depends upon whether they are true (approximately true, probable, or significantly more probable than their competitors) or whether they “save” observable phenomena. They then try to explain how observational data argue for or against the possession of one or more of these virtues.

Truth. It's natural to think that computability, range of application, and other things being equal, true theories are better than false ones, good approximations are better than bad ones, and highly probable theoretical claims deserve to take precedence over less probable ones. One way to decide whether a theory or a theoretical claim is true, close to the truth, or acceptably probable is to derive predictions from it and use observational data to evaluate them. Hypothetico-Deductive (HD) confirmation theorists propose that observational evidence argues for the truth of theories whose deductive consequences it verifies, and against those whose consequences it falsifies (Popper 1959, 32–34). But laws and theoretical generalization seldom if ever entail observational predictions unless they are conjoined with one or more auxiliary hypotheses taken from the theory they belong to. When the prediction turns to be false, HD has trouble explaining which of the conjuncts is to blame. If a theory entails a true prediction, it will continue to do so in conjunction with arbitrarily selected irrelevant claims. HD has trouble explaining why the prediction doesn't confirm the irrelevancies along with the theory of interest.

Ignoring details, large and small, bootstrapping confirmation theories hold that an observation report confirms a theoretical generalization if an instance of the generalization follows from the observation report conjoined with auxiliary hypotheses from the theory the generalization belongs to. Observation counts against a theoretical claim if the conjunction entails a counter-instance. Here, as with HD, an observation argues for or against a theoretical claim only on the assumption that the auxiliary hypotheses are true (Glymour 1980, 110–175).

Bayesians hold that the evidential bearing of observational evidence on a theoretical claim is to be understood in terms of likelihood or conditional probability. For example, whether observational evidence argues for a theoretical claim might be thought to depend upon whether it is more probable (and if so how much more probable) than its denial conditional on a description of the evidence together with background beliefs, including theoretical commitments. But by Bayes' theorem, the conditional probability of the claim of interest will depend in part upon that claim's prior probability. Once again, one's use of evidence to evaluate a theory depends in part upon one's theoretical commitments. (Earman 1992, 33–86. Roush 2005, 149-186)

Francis Bacon (Bacon1620, 70) said that allowing one's commitment to a theory to determine what one takes to be the epistemic bearing of observational evidence on that very theory is, if anything, even worse than ignoring the evidence altogether. HD, Bootstrap, Bayesian, and related accounts of conformation run the risk of earning Bacon's disapproval. According to all of them it can be reasonable for adherents of competing theories to disagree about how observation data bear on the same claims. As a matter of historical fact, such disagreements do occur. The moral of this fact depends upon whether and how such disagreements can be resolved. Because some of the components of a theory are logically and more or less probabilistically independent of one another, adherents of competing theories can often can find ways to bring themselves into close enough agreement about auxiliary hypotheses or prior probabilities to draw the same conclusions from a bit of observational evidence.

Saving observable phenomena. Theories are said to save observable phenomena if they satisfactorily predict, describe, or systematize them. How well a theory performs any of these tasks need not depend upon the truth or accuracy of its basic principles. Thus according to Osiander's preface to Copernicus' On the Revolutions, a locus classicus, astronomers ‘…cannot in any way attain to true causes’ of the regularities among observable astronomical events, and must content themselves with saving the phenomena in the sense of using

…whatever suppositions enable …[them] to be computed correctly from the principles of geometry for the future as well as the past…(Osiander 1543, XX)

Theorists are to use those assumptions as calculating tools without committing themselves to their truth. In particular, the assumption that the planets rotate around the sun must be evaluated solely in terms of how useful it is in calculating their observable relative positions to a satisfactory approximation.

Pierre Duhem's Aim and Structure of Physical Theory articulates a related conception. For Duhem a physical theory

…is a system of mathematical propositions, deduced from a small number of principles, which aim to represent as simply and completely, and exactly as possible, a set of experimental laws. (Duhem 1906, 19)

‘Experimental laws’ are general, mathematical descriptions of observable experimental results. Investigators produce them by performing measuring and other experimental operations and assigning symbols to perceptible results according to pre-established operational definitions (Duhem 1906, 19). For Duhem, the main function of a physical theory is to help us store and retrieve information about observables we would not otherwise be able to keep track of. If that's what a theory is supposed to accomplish, its main virtue should be intellectual economy. Theorists are to replace reports of individual observations with experimental laws and devise higher level laws (the fewer, the better) from which experimental laws (the more, the better) can be mathematically derived (Duhem 1906, 21ff).

A theory's experimental laws can be tested for accuracy and comprehensiveness by comparing them to observational data. Let EL be one or more experimental laws that perform acceptably well on such tests. Higher level laws can then be evaluated on the basis of how well they integrate EL into the rest of the theory. Some data that don't fit integrated experimental laws won't be interesting enough to worry about. Other data may need to be accommodated by replacing or modifying one or more experimental laws or adding new ones. If the required additions, modifications or replacements deliver experimental laws that are harder to integrate, the data count against the theory. If the required changes are conducive to improved systematization the data count in favor of it. If the required changes make no difference, the data don't argue for or against the theory.

10. Data and phenomena

It is an unwelcome fact for all of these ideas about theory testing that data are typically produced in ways that make it all but impossible to predict them from the generalizations they are used to test, or to derive instances of those generalizations from data and non ad hoc auxiliary hypotheses. Indeed, it's unusual for many members of a set of reasonably precise quantitative data to agree with one another, let alone with a quantitative prediction. That is because precise, publicly accessible data typically cannot be produced except through processes whose results reflect the influence of causal factors that are too numerous, too different in kind, and too irregular in behavior for any single theory to account for them. When Bernard Katz recorded electrical activity in nerve fiber preparations, the numerical values of his data were influenced by factors peculiar to the operation of his galvanometers and other pieces of equipment, variations among the positions of the stimulating and recording electrodes that had to be inserted into the nerve, the physiological effects of their insertion, and changes in the condition of the nerve as it deteriorated during the course of the experiment. There were variations in the investigators' handling of the equipment. Vibrations shook the equipment in response to a variety of irregularly occurring causes ranging from random error sources to the heavy tread of Katz's teacher, A.V. Hill, walking up and down the stairs outside of the laboratory. That's a short list. To make matters worse, many of these factors influenced the data as parts of irregularly occurring, transient, and shifting assemblies of causal influences.

With regard to kinds of data that should be of interest to philosophers of physics, consider how many extraneous causes influenced radiation data in solar neutrino detection experiments, or spark chamber photographs produced to detect particle interactions. The effects of systematic and random sources of error are typically such that considerable analysis and interpretation are required to take investigators from data sets to conclusions that can be used to evaluate theoretical claims.

This applies as much to clear cases of perceptual data as to machine produced records. When 19th and early 20th century astronomers looked through telescopes and pushed buttons to record the time at which they saw a moon pass a crosshair, the values of their data points depended, not only upon light reflected from the moon, but also upon features of perceptual processes, reaction times, and other psychological factors that varied non-systematically from time to time and observer to observer. No astronomical theory has the resources to take such things into account. Similar considerations apply to the probabilities of specific data points conditional on theoretical principles, and the probabilities of confirming or disconfirming instances of theoretical claims conditional on the values of specific data points.

Instead of testing theoretical claims by direct comparison to raw data, investigators use data to infer facts about phenomena, i.e., events, regularities, proesseses, etc. whose instances, are uniform and uncomplicated enough to make them susceptible to systematic prediction and explanation (Bogen and Woodward 1988, 317). The fact that lead melts at temperatures at or close to 327.5 C is an example of a phenomenon, as are widespread regularities among electrical quantities involved in the action potential, the periods and orbital paths of the planets, etc. Theories that cannot be expected to predict or explain such things as individual temperature readings can be evaluated on the basis of how well they explain phenomena and predict instances of them. The same holds for the action potential as opposed to the electrical data from which its features are calculated, and the orbits of the planets in contrast to the data of positional astronomy. It's reasonable to ask a genetic theory how probable it is (given similar upbringings in similar environments) that the offspring of a schizophrenic parent or parents will develop one or more symptoms the DSM classifies as indicative of schizophrenia. But it would be quite unreasonable to ask it to predict or explain one patient's numerical score on one trial of a particular diagnostic test, or why a diagnostician wrote a particular entry in her report of an interview with an offspring of a schizophrenic parents (Bogen and Woodward, 1988, 319–326).

The fact that theories are better at predicting and explaining phenomena than data isn't such a bad thing. For many purposes, theories that predict and explain phenomena would be more illuminating, and more useful for practical purposes than theories (if there were any) that predicted or explained members of a data set. Suppose you could choose between a theory that predicted or explained the way in which neurotransmitter release relates to neuronal spiking (e.g., the fact that on average, transmitters are released roughly once for every 10 spikes) and a theory which explained or predicted the numbers displayed on the relevant experimental equipment in one, or a few single cases. For most purposes, the former theory would be preferable to the latter at the very least because it applies to so many more cases. And similarly for theories that predict or explain something about the probability of schizophrenia conditional on some genetic factor or a theory that predicted or explained the probability of faulty diagnoses of schizophrenia conditional on facts about the psychiatrist's training. For most purposes, these would be preferable to a theory that predicted specific descriptions in a case history.

In view of all of this, together with the fact that a great many theoretical claims can only be tested directly against phenomena, it behooves epistemologists to think about how data are used to answer questions about phenomena. Lacking space for a detailed discussion, the most this entry can do is to mention two main kinds of things investigators do in order to draw conclusions from data. The first is causal analysis carried out with or without the use of statistical techniques. The second is non-causal statistical analysis.

First, investigators must distinguish features of the data that are indicative of facts about the phenomenon of interest from those which can safely be ignored, and those which must be corrected for. Sometimes background knowledge makes this easy. Under normal circumstances investigators know that their thermometers are sensitive to temperature, and their pressure gauges, to pressure. An astronomer or a chemist who knows what spectrographic equipment does, and what she has applied it to will know what her data indicate. Sometimes it's less obvious. When Ramon y Cajal looked through his microscope at a thin slice of stained nerve tissue, he had to figure out which if any of the fibers he could see at one focal length connected to or extended from things he could see only at another focal length, or in another slice.

Analogous considerations apply to quantitative data. It was easy for Katz to tell when his equipment was responding more to Hill's footfalls on the stairs than to the electrical quantities is was set up to measure. It can be harder to tell whether an abrupt jump in the amplitude of a high frequency EEG oscillation was due to a feature of the subjects brain activity or an artifact of extraneous electrical activity in the laboratory or operating room where the measurements were made. The answers to questions about which features of numerical and non-numerical data are indicative of a phenomenon of interest typically depend at least in part on what is known about the causes that conspire to produce the data.

Statistical arguments are often used to deal with questions about the influence of epistemically relevant causal factors. For example, when it is known that similar data can be produced by factors that have nothing to do with the phenomenon of interest, Monte Carlo simulations, regression analyses of sample data, and a variety of other statistical techniques sometimes provide investigators with their best chance of deciding how seriously to take a putatively illuminating feature of their data.

But statistical techniques also required for purposes other than causal analysis. To calculate the magnitude of a quantity like the melting point of lead from a scatter of numerical data, investigators throw out outliers, calculate the mean and the standard derivation, etc., and establish confidence and significance levels. Regression and other techniques are applied to the results to estimate how far from the mean the magnitude of interest can be expected to fall in the population of interest (e.g., the range of temperatures at which pure samples of lead can be expected to melt).

The fact that little can be learned from data without causal, statistical, and related argumentation has interesting consequences for received ideas about how the use of observational evidence distinguishes science from pseudo science, religion, and other non-scientific cognitive endeavors.First, scientists aren't the only ones who use observational evidence to support their claims; astrologers and medical quacks use them to. To find epistemically significant differences, one must carefully consider what sorts of data they use, where it comes from, and how it is used. The virtues of scientific as opposed to non-scientific theory evaluations depends not only on its reliance on empirical data, but also on how the data are produced, analyzed and interpreted to draw conclusions against which theories can be evaluated. Secondly, it doesn't take many examples to argue against the notion that adherence to a single, universally applicable “scientific method” differentiates the sciences from the non-sciences, and accounts. Data are produced, and used in far to many different ways to treat informatively as instance of any single method. Thirdly, it is usually, if not always, impossible for investigators to draw conclusions to test theories against observational data without explicit or implicit reliance on theoretical principles. This means that counterparts to Kuhnian questions about theory loading and its epistemic significance arise in connection with the analysis and interpretation of observational evidence. For the most part, such questions must be answered by appeal to details that vary from case to case.

11. Conclusion

Grammatical variants of the term ‘observation’ have been applied to impressively different perceptual and non-perceptual process and records of the results they produce. Their diversity is a reason to doubt whether general philosophical accounts of observation, observables, and observational data can tell epistemologists as much as local accounts grounded in close studies of specific kinds of cases. Furthermore, scientists continue to find ways to produce data that can't be called observational without stretching the term to the point of vagueness.

It's plausible that philosophers who value the kind of rigor, precision, and generality to which logical positivists, logical empiricists, and other exact philosophers aspired could do better by examining and developing techniques and results from logic, probability theory, statistics, machine learning, and computer modeling, etc. than by trying to construct highly general theories of observation and its role in science. Logic and the rest seem unable to deliver satisfactory, universally applicable accounts of scientific reasoning. But they have illuminating local applications, some of which can be of use to scientists as well as philosophers.


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Bacon, Francis | Bayes' Theorem | constructive empiricism | Duhem, Pierre | empiricism: logical | epistemology: Bayesian | Lewis, Clarence Irving | Locke, John | logical positivism | physics: experiment in | science and pseudo-science