Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Clarence Irving Lewis

First published Tue Sep 25, 2007

Clarence Irving (C.I.) Lewis was perhaps the most important American academic philosopher active in the 1930s and 1940s. He made major contributions in epistemology and logic, and, to a lesser degree, ethics. Lewis was also a key figure in the rise of analytic philosophy in the United States, both through the development and influence of his own writings and through his influence, direct and indirect, on graduate students at Harvard, including some of the leading analytic philosophers of the last half of the 20th century.

1. Brief Biography

C.I. Lewis was born on April 12, 1883 in Stoneham, Massachusetts and died on February 2, 1964 in Menlo Park, California. He was an undergraduate at Harvard from 1902–1906, where he was influenced principally by the pragmatist, William James, and the idealist, Josiah Royce. Royce also supervised Lewis's 1910 Harvard Ph.D. dissertation “The Place of Intuition in Knowledge”. While serving as Royce's teaching assistant in logic, Lewis read Whitehead's and Russell's Principia Mathematica, a book he both admired and criticized. Later, while teaching at the University of California at Berkeley from 1911-1920, his principal research interests switched to logic. He wrote a series of articles on symbolic logic culminating in his 1918 monograph A Survey of Symbolic Logic (SSL) in which Lewis (1918) both surveyed developments in logic up to his day and concluded with his own modal system of strict implication. However, in response to criticism, Lewis deleted these chapters from reprints of SSL and revised his treatment of their topics for his co-authored 1932 book Symbolic Logic (SL) (Lewis and Langford 1932) — “the first comprehensive treatment of systems of strict implication (or indeed of systems of modal logic at all)”, according to Hughes and Cresswell (1968, 216).

Lewis returned to Harvard in 1920, where he taught until his retirement in 1953, becoming Edgar Peirce Professor of Philosophy in 1948. At Harvard, Lewis' major research interest switched back to epistemology. Starting with his much reprinted 1923 article, “A Pragmatic Conception of the A Priori” (Lewis 1923), he developed a distinctive position of his own which he labeled “conceptual pragmatism” and which he presented in a systematic way in his 1929 book Mind and the World Order (MWO) (Lewis 1929). MWO established Lewis as a major figure on the American philosophical scene. In the 1930s and 1940s, partly in response to the challenge of positivism, the form more than the substance of Lewis' views changed. In his 1946 book Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation (AKV), based on his 1944 Carus lectures, Lewis (1946) provided a systematic and carefully analytic presentation of his mature philosophical views. The first two thirds of the book consist of a thorough refinement and more precise representation of his theory of meaning and his epistemological views, and the last third consists of a presentation of his theory of value.

After retirement from Harvard, Lewis taught and lectured at a number of universities, including Princeton, Columbia, Indiana, Michigan State, and Southern California, but principally at Stanford. His 1954 Woodbridge Lectures at Columbia and 1956 Mahlon Powell Lectures at Indiana resulted in two last short books in ethics, The Ground and the Nature of the Right (Lewis 1955) and Our Social Inheritance (Lewis 1957). Lewis was the subject of a posthumously published “Library of Living Philosophers” volume (Schilpp 1968), an honour that indicates his standing in and perceived significance for American philosophy in the 1950s.

In his over thirty years at Harvard, Lewis taught some of the most eminent American philosophers of the last half of the twentieth century as graduate students, including W.V. Quine, Nelson Goodman, Roderick Chisholm, Roderick Firth, and Wilfrid Sellars. Although only Chisholm and Firth of these five were supervised by Lewis, and Sellars left Harvard after two years of graduate study to take up a Rhodes Scholarship at Oxford, all five refer occasionally to Lewis in their writings, usually critically, and their own views sometimes developed in reaction to his. (Baldwin (2007) has an excellent discussion of the influence of Lewis on Quine, and of Lewis's philosophy generally.)

2. Overview of Conceptual Pragmatism

In MWO, Lewis (1929, Chp. 1) argued that the proper method of philosophy isn't transcendental but rather reflective. Philosophy seeks the criteria or principles of the real, the right, the beautiful, and the logically valid that are implicit in human experience and activity. Lewis (1929, 37-8) thought that, on reflection and analysis, we can distinguish three elements in empirical knowledge: the given or immediate data of sense about which we can not be mistaken; the act of interpreting the given as an experience of one sort of thing as opposed to another; and the concept by which we so interpret the given by relating it to other possibilities of experience. Our experience of the real is not given to us in experience but is constructed by us from the data of sense through acts of interpretation. So when I know that I am looking at a table and reflect on my experience, I realize, on analysis, that there are certain highly specific sensuous qualities presented to me that I am immediately aware of, and, in the light of this and other recalled experiences, I expect that I would likely have certain other experiences, e.g., those of feeling something apparently hard, were I to perform certain acts, e.g., reaching out with my hand. In doing so, it is the concept of seeing a table that I am applying to my experience rather than that of seeing a horse or that of hallucinating a table, either of which would have involved different expectations of experience consequent upon action. Only an active being can therefore have knowledge, and the principal function of empirical knowledge “is that of an instrument enabling transition from the actual present to a future which is desired and which the present is believed to signalize” (Lewis (1946), 4).

Statements expressing our beliefs about reality are equivalent in meaning to, and thus entail and are entailed by, an indefinitely large set of counterfactual statements about what experiences we would have or would be likely to have, were we to be presented with certain sensory cues and to carry out further tests (Lewis 1929, 142). The idea of a reality neither confirmable nor disconfirmable in principle by experience was thus for Lewis without meaning. What he thought distinguished his view from the superficially similar verification principle of meaning of the logical positivists was his emphasis on the role of agency (Lewis 1941, in Lewis 1970, 94). In any case, the experiences I now have don't guarantee the satisfaction of my expectations. My interpretations of experience are fallible and subject to revision in the light of action and future experience. Yet, despite their lack of certainty, the beliefs I form by applying concepts to experience may count as knowledge so long as they are true and are warranted or justified by my present or past experience.

What is certain, however, is our a priori knowledge of the logical relationships among our concepts, and of the principles explicating our concepts and providing the criteria for applying them to experience and determining what is real and what isn't (Lewis 1929, 23-2). What is tested by experience is the interpretation of experience in the light of our concepts, ordinary empirical concepts like dog as well as more abstract categories like causality or the concepts of logic. What isn't tested by experience is the validity of the concepts themselves, or the logical relationships amongst them, or the principles for applying them, all of which are equally valid thanks to the very definitions of the concepts. Agents bring them to experience and the only criteria they answer to are pragmatic ones of utility or convenience (Lewis 1929, 271-2).

Right at the heart of Lewis' philosophical system, then, are several theses that weren't original to Lewis, but the critical discussion (and sometimes rejection) of which, often in the form Lewis gave to them, was central to much analytic philosophy in the last half of the twentieth century. Among them are: (1) a sharp analytic/synthetic, a priori/ a posteriori distinction, (2) reductionism concerning the meaning of a physical object statement to the actual and possible sense experiences that would confirm the statement, (3) a foundation for all empirical knowledge in our direct apprehension or immediate awareness of the given character of experience, and (4) the division of experience into its given content or character, on the one hand, and the form we impose on it, or the concepts in the light of which we interpret it, on the other. (Quine (1953) famously called (1) and (2) the “two dogmas of empiricism”, Sellars (1963) called (3) the “myth of the given”, and Davidson (1984) called (4) the “third dogma of empiricism”, although in Lewis' mind (4) may owe more to Kant—on whom Lewis taught a course regularly at Harvard—than to the empiricists.)

At the same time, Lewis (1946, 9-11, 254-9) also laid down a framework of assumptions, most explicitly in AKV, within which analytic epistemology flourished in the last half of the 20th century: (1) knowledge is justified (warranted, rationally credible) true belief , (2) a belief may be justified without being true and true without being justified, and (3) epistemology seeks to elicit criteria or principles of justification or rationally credibility.

3. Logic and Language

Lewis was dissatisfied with the extensional truth functional logic of Principia Mathematica, and with its understanding of implication as material implication, according to which the truth of the if-then conditional pq expressing the material implication of q by p is a function just of the truth or falsity of p and q. pq is equivalent to ~(p & ~q) and is true just in case it isn't the case both that p is true and q is false. As a result, among the theses of Principia Mathematica are p ⊃ (qp) and not-p ⊃ (pq). In other words, a true proposition, whatever it happens to be, is implied by any proposition whatsoever, true or false, and a false proposition, whatever it happens to be, implies any proposition whatsoever, true or false. Lewis didn't deny these theses, properly understood relative to the definition of material implication. However, he did think that these so-called “paradoxes of material implication” meant that material implication doesn't provide a proper understanding of any ordinary notion of implication, according to which one proposition implies another just in case the latter logically follows from and is deducible from the former.

To explicate this notion he defined strict implication, according to which the if-then conditional p strictly implies q expressing the strict implication of q by p is equivalent to ~◊(p & ~q), and is true just in case it is not possible that p is true and q is false. Strict implication is an intensional notion, and the logic of strict implication is a form of modal logic. The system of strict implication developed in SSL (Lewis (1918) was distinguished from earlier modal logics by its axiomatic presentation in the light of the work of Whitehead and Russell. However, Lewis faced a number of criticisms, including one by Emil Post that one of Lewis' postulates led to the result that it was indeed impossible that p just in case it was false that p, so that Lewis' SSL system reduced to an extensional one. Lewis (Lewis and Langford (1932) eliminated these problems in SL and provided distinct systems of strict implication or modal logic, S1–S5, each stronger than its predecessor (with S3 the system of SSL). S1 contained the following axioms:

S2 adds to S1 the consistency postulate

◊(p & q) strictly impliesp,

which allows one to show that if p strictly implies q is a theorem, then so is ~◊~p strictly implies ~◊~q, i.e., □p strictly impliesq, expressing the strict implication of the necessity of q by the necessity of p. S3 adds to S1 the postulate

(p strictly implies q) strictly implies (~◊q strictly implies ~◊p)

S4 adds to S1 the iterative axiom:

~◊~p strictly implies ~◊~~◊~p, i.e.,
p strictly implies □□p

S5 adds to S1 the iterative axiom:

p strictly implies ~◊~◊p, i.e.,
p strictly implies □◊p

Critics objected that strict implication posed its own alleged paradoxes. Within Lewis' systems S2–S5, a necessarily true proposition is strictly implied by any proposition whatsoever, and a necessarily false proposition strictly implies any proposition whatsoever. However, Lewis (Lewis and Langford 1932) replied in SL that these alleged paradoxes are simply the result of entirely natural assumptions about valid deductive inference and entailment quite apart from the systems of strict implication, and thus are not a problem for the claim that strict implication provides an explication of deducibility and entailment. (The presentation in this and the previous two paragraphs owes much to the excellent account and discussion of Lewis' systems of strict implication in Hughes and Cresswell 1968, Chapters 12–13. )

Lewis thought that there are an unlimited number of possible systems of logic. One example is the extensional propositional calculus of Principia according to which there are two truth values, true and false; other examples are the various systems of many valued logic that Lewis surveyed in SL, and, of course, Lewis' own various modal systems S1–S5. Lewis thought that all these systems are valid so long as they are all internally consistent. The principles of the various alternatives simply define the meaning of the logical concepts and operators such as negation, truth/falsity, disjunction, implication, and thus they are all true (Lewis 1932, in Lewis 1970, 401). Bivalent systems simply have a different notion of truth and falsity from non-bivalent ones. Nonetheless, some systems may accord better than others with notions of truth or implication or deduction that are implicit in our everyday reasoning. Logics can thus be assessed pragmatically by their sufficiency for the guidance and testing of our usual deductions, systematic simplicity and convenience, and accord with our psychological limitations and mental habits. However, Lewis denied that he was claiming that principles of logic could be true without being necessarily true, or necessarily true without being necessarily necessary. A logic in which □p strictly implies □□p holds simply operates with a different notion of necessity from one in which it doesn't.

Lewis distinguished several modes of meaning in AKV (Lewis (1946, Chps. 3, 6). The denotation of a term is the class of actual things to which the term applies and is distinct from the comprehension — the class of possible or consistently thinkable things to which it applies. The signification of a term is the property the presence of which in a thing makes the term applicable, and the intension or connotation of a term is what is applicable to any possible thing to which the term is applicable. Intension can be linguistic intension or meaning, in which case it is the conjunction of terms each of which is applicable to any possible thing to which the term is applicable and thus substitutable for the term salva veritate , but since definitions must have criteria of application and these must ultimately be non-circular, the more basic dimension of intension is sense meaning. Sense meaning is the criterion in mind in terms of sense experience for classifying objects and applying a term, a schema or rule that speakers have in mind whereby a term applies to an actual or thinkable thing or signifies some property, and which would exist even if there were no linguistic expression for it. Since linguistic intension is implicitly holistic and verbal definition eventually circular, Lewis (1929, 107) said in MWO that logical analysis isn't reduction to primitive terms, but is a matter of relating terms to each other. Concepts consist in relational structures of meaning. They require criteria of application in experience and the total meaning of a term for an individual consists of the concept it expresses and the sensory criteria for its application. Yet, the latter needn't be identical across individuals for there to be common concepts, Lewis argued (1929, p. 115). Instead, common concepts just require shared structures of linguistic definition and common or congruent modes of behaviour, in particular co-operative behaviour that is guided by these concepts, a social achievement of a common world that Lewis thought our community of needs and interests produces. One problem with this suggestion was pointed out by Quine (1960) in Word and Object with his indeterminacy of translation argument. From the standpoint of an interpreter, there can be alternative translation manuals or schemes that are consistent with the total set of a speaker's verbal and other behavioural dispositions. This is a problem that Lewis (1946, 144-5, 164) may have been aware of in AKV. In any case, in AKV, Lewis seems to draw back from the discussion of common concepts in MWO and to rest content with pointing out that any attribution of linguistic meaning or sense meaning to another is inductive and thus only probable, and any attribution of linguistic or sense meaning similar to ours is likewise inductive, fallible, and problematic.

Lewis (1946, 84-5, 93-5) drew a sharp distinction between analytic and synthetic truth. Analytic (or analytically true) statements were true by virtue of the definition of the terms they contained, and had zero intension (and universal comprehension.). They were necessarily true, true in all possible worlds, no matter what else might be true of a world or thing, and yet were not equivalent in meaning to each other only due to the distinct intensions of their constituents. In MWO, Lewis occasionally claimed that we create necessary truth by adopting concepts and criterial principles; in AKV he was more circumspect. It is a matter of convention or legislation that a term has the meaning it does, including sense meaning, but Lewis (1946, 155-7) denied that analytic truth was truth by convention. “A dog is an animal” is analytically true by virtue of the sense meaning of “dog” and “animal”, in particular, the inclusion of the criterion for applying the latter in the criterion for applying the latter, and that isn't a matter of convention. However, Lewis never tried to define such inclusion further, and seems to have taken it to be simply an indisputable fact that we all could recognize and that didn't need any further explication. Quine (1953) explicitly criticized Lewis and the analytic/synthetic distinction in “Two Dogmas of Empiricism”, and would have objected to the idea of resting the analytic/synthetic distinction on an undefined notion of meaning inclusion. However, Lewis (1946, 154) thought that meaning inclusion is as unproblematic and recognizable a fact as the inclusion of one plan in another, e.g., a plan to visit France in a plan to visit Paris. Nonetheless, taking meaning inclusion to be a primitive fact also makes it more difficult to distinguish Lewis' analytic necessity from the rationalists’ synthetic necessity, despite his (Lewis (1946), 157) vigorous rejection of the latter. This is especially so since Lewis (1946, 129) denied that analytic truth is usefully elucidated as one that is reducible to logical truth with the substitution of definitions because he thought that the adequacy of a definition is a matter of analytic truth and that what makes a truth a logical truth is that it is an analytic truth concerning certain symbols.

4. The A Priori and the Analytic

Lewis (1946, 29-31) thought that necessary truths are both knowable a priori, i.e., knowable independently of experience, and knowable for certain. In applying concepts like those of red or apple to current experience, and so interpreting experience, we form expectations and make predictions about future experience, conditional on actions we might perform. Our beliefs constitute empirical knowledge in so far as past experience gives us good reason (largely inductive) for making these predictions. However, we aren't making predictions about future experience simply in stating what these concepts are, and what their definitions are, and what defining criteria they provide for applying them to experience. Such statements are explicative, not predictive, and so neither falsifiable by failed prediction nor verifiable by successful prediction nor justified by inductive evidence. The a priori is what we are prepared to accept, no matter what experience may bring, and in that sense, true no matter what, and in that sense necessary. However, a priori principles are neither principles that are universal nor ones that we have to accept. The acceptance of a set of concepts is a matter of decision or legislation, something for which there are alternatives, but for which the criteria are not empirical but pragmatic.

At the same time, in MWO, Lewis (1929, 254) thought that the a priori extended to fundamental laws of nature defining basic concepts like mass or energy or simultaneity, and thus included some of what are typically regarded as the basic principles of a scientific theory. Further, besides criteria like convenience and conformity to human bent, pragmatic considerations mentioned in MWO (Lewis, 1929, 267) include factors like intellectual simplicity, economy, comprehensiveness, and thus the overall achievement of intellectual order. However, unlike Wilfrid Sellars and many others in the latter half of the 20th century, Lewis never recognized such factors as criteria of empirical justification. The reason seems to be that Lewis (1936, in Lewis 1970, 286) didn't think that these factors make a hypothesis any more probable, in contrast, presumably, to conformity to standard criteria of induction. Nor did he recognize the acceptance of scientific theories as entirely empirical. Pragmatic considerations might lead us, in the fact of a troubling experience, to abandon our concepts and a priori principles, but we could also, without inconsistency, maintain them in the face of any and all experience, unlike empirical generalizations (Lewis, 1929, 267).

However, there is a difference between a proposition's being falsifiable or not, and its being verifiable or not. Lewis had little positive to say about how we knew a proposition explicating our concepts to be true, and thus how a proposition could be known a priori. In MWO, he said the a priori is knowable by the reflective and critical formulation of our own principles of classification , and in AKV that a priori truths are certifiable by reference to meanings alone (and their relations like inclusion.) Nonetheless, he never explained how reflection on our categories, meanings, or the inclusion of one in another, could give us certainty, rather than warrant that is fallible and revisable through further reflection.

The most radical challenge to Lewis came from Quine. Quine (1953) argued that the distinction between so called a priori truths and a posteriori truths is just one of degree. Empirical hypotheses have implications for experience only in conjunction with various other background assumptions, e.g., about the circumstances of perception. Recalcitrant experience tells us only that some belief or assumption in the total set that implies a contrary experience is false, not which one, and thus any statement can be held true, no matter what experience brings, so long as we make enough adjustments to the rest of our beliefs and assumptions. (Quine is assuming that the statements we must hold true in order for other statements to have implications for experience are themselves never certain. This is something that Lewis arguably denied, as we shall see in the next two sections, by arguing that there can be conditionals about expected experience (constituting the empirical content of material object statements) the antecedents of which consist solely of statements about experience that can be given and thus certain for us.) Further, Quine argued that empirical hypotheses can't logically imply anything about experience except against a background of assumed laws of logic. Recalcitrant experience can, in principle, then, lead us to revise an assumed logical principle in our web of belief rather one of our other beliefs. Some philosophers might object that logic is part of the framework within which beliefs have logical implications and can't be part of the same system of belief itself. However, Lewis himself might have trouble with this suggestion, since he recognized the possibility of alternative logics, and presumably, any decision, even pragmatic, about the adoption or rejection of a logic must operate on some logical assumptions.

5. Empirical Knowledge

In AKV, Lewis distinguished three classes of empirical statements. First, there are expressive statements formulating what is presently given in experience and about the truth of which we can be certain. Second, there are terminating judgements and statements formulating and predicting what we would experience were we to be presented with some sensory cue and perform some action (in certain conditions). The form of terminating judgements is:

If (or given) S, then if A (and H), it would be the case that E, i.e. ((S & A (& H)) → E),

where S, A, H, and E all are formulated in expressive language and concern particular presentable experiences about which we can be certain, and “→” is neither logical entailment nor material implication but what Lewis called “real connection” that gives rise to subjunctive or counterfactual conditionals. Real connections (an example of which are causal connections) are inductively established correlations by virtue of which one observable item may indicate another. However, terminating judgements, Lewis claimed, although not decisively verifiable, are decisively falsifiable.

Third, there are non-terminating or objective judgments that are confirmable and disconfirmable by experience, thanks to their sense meaning, but are not decisively verifiable or falsifiable. These objective judgements include not only perceptual judgements like “There is a white piece of paper before me” in which we conceptualize and interpret a given experience by relating it to other possible experiences, but also a vast number of other beliefs about the material world supported by our perceptual beliefs, e.g., statements about the future outcome of space explorations, or generalizations like “All men have noses”, or non-analytic statements about theoretical entities. Although Lewis sometimes suggested that the sense meaning of all these objective judgements consists of an indefinitely (perhaps infinitely) large set of terminating judgments, his more considered view was that it consists of an indefinitely large set of conditional probability judgements of the form “If it were the case that S & A, then, in all likelihood, E” (Lewis, 1946, 235-53). A physical or objective judgement P thus analytically entails and is entailed by an indefinitely large set of hypothetical judgements of the form,

(S & A) → (h)E,
where (h)E means that in all probability, E,

none of which are decisively falsifiable by recalcitrant experience. However, as expressing real connections, they are nonetheless confirmable and disconfirmable by experience, as are the objective judgements whose sense meaning they constitute. (Strangely, Lewis sometimes persisted in calling (S & A) → (h)E a terminating judgement, despite the fact that it isn't decisively falsifiable.)

For example, suppose P is “a sheet of paper lies before me”. Then, its analytic entailments might include, “If S1 (I were to seem to see a sheet of paper before me) and A1 (I were to seem to move my eyes), then, probably, E1 (I would seem to see the sheet of paper displaced)”, as well as “If S2 (I were to seem to feel paper with my fingers), and A2 (I were to seem to pick it up and tear it), then, probably, E2 (I would seem to see or feel torn paper)”, and so on. On the other hand, suppose P is “There is a doorknob before me”. Its truth might then entail the truth of a complex set of conditionals like “If I were to seem to see a doorknob, and were to seem to reach out towards it and grasp it, then, probably, I would seem to feel something hard and round”, etc.

No number of successful or failed tests will render the objective judgement true or false with theoretical certainty. However, Lewis thought the principle of inverse probabilities meant that the judgement can be practically certain or very close to certain in so far the probability of P when S and A and E obtain may approach certainty as the improbability of E approaches certainty when S and A and not P obtain. In this way, gaining assurance that P by testing a few predictions may also give us assurance that the indefinitely many further predictions entailed by P that haven't (yet) been tested will nonetheless also be borne out.

Although objective judgements or beliefs can never be certain for us, they can nonetheless be empirical knowledge in so far as experiences that we already have make the truth of the judgment or beliefs probable, and are grounds or evidence which warrant or justify the degree of assurance with which they are held. The empirical justification we have for objective beliefs is ultimately inductive for Lewis, but it can't rest on current sense experience alone and requires evidence concerning the past. However, what is given to us isn't the past itself about which we can never be certain but just current sense presentation and current recollection or sense of past experience. Lewis appreciated the problem memory posed for his epistemology much more clearly in AKV than in MWO. In AKV, Lewis (1946, 334) argued that whatever we ostensibly remember, whether as explicit recollection or merely in our sense of the past, is prima facie credible just because so remembered. Further, the credibility of these beliefs based on memory can be increased, together with the whole range of empirical beliefs more or less dependent on them, through the mutual support or congruence of the whole, or can be diminished through incongruence. A set of beliefs is congruent for Lewis (1946, 338) when the antecedent probability of each is increased by the assumption of the truth of the rest. However, congruence by itself isn't sufficient to render a set of beliefs rationally credible. At least some of the members of the set have to possess some degree of credibility or justification independent of the rest and thus by relation to direct experience, sensory or memorial. The improbability of these members being true, were others to be false despite their degree of probability, makes it more likely that the former are true, and so on for other members of the congruent set.

The principle of the prima facie credibility of mnemic presentation of past experience can't itself be justified inductively for Lewis, on pain of circularity. Nor did he think it is simply a postulate — something we have to assume for empirical knowledge to be possible. Instead, he argued that it is constitutive of the lived world of experience and something for which there is no meaningful alternative. Sceptical alternatives designed to undermine the principle are ones that are inaccessible to knowledge and thus ones for which there is no criterion in experience. So it is an analytic statement that the past is knowable and the memory principle is indispensable as a criterion of the knowable past. (Lewis (1946, 311) A similar claim was made for the knowability of empirical reality and the relevance of past experience to the future. In MWO, he defended induction in more detail by arguing that not every prediction is compatible with an evidence base, and that successive revision of one's predictions in the light of new experience can't help but make for more successful predictions (Lewis 1929, 367, 386). Nelson Goodman's well known “grue” example (Goodman 1955) poses problems for the relevance of the first claim and the force of the second. At other times, Lewis simply followed Hans Reichenbach in claiming that we can be assured only that if any procedures will achieve success in prediction, inductive ones will, without clearly distinguishing that claim from any attempt at an analytic justification of induction.

Rational credibility, or belief that is warranted or justified, Lewis thought, is probable on the evidence, but the presentation of his views on probability was complex and sometimes confusing. In AKV, Lewis defended an a priori account of probability or what he sometimes called “expectation”. The expectation a/b or probability of a proposition P is always relative to some set of empirical data or premises D, and corresponds to an a priori valid estimate of the frequency of some property mentioned in P in some reference class mentioned in P derived from some data or premises D, given the a priori valid principles of inductive or probabilistic inference. Hypothetical or conditional probability statements that are a priori valid license valid probabilistic inferences from premises about evidence or data to probabilistic conclusions. However, for Lewis, both hypothetical and categorical probability are always relativized to an evidence base, despite his occasional talk of a priori valid probability statements as licensing inferences to a conclusion “Probably, P” from evidence.

Lewis rejected the view that probabilities are empirically based estimates of the limiting value of the frequency of instances of a property in a population, and thus expressed in non-terminating judgments, for two reasons. First, he thought any attempt to define probabilities as the ratio of instances of one property among instances of another property as the latter approaches infinity would make probability judgments empirically untestable. Second, he argued that, if probability judgements were empirical frequency claims, then the probability judgements would themselves only be probable, something that can't be coherently accounted for. Nonetheless, Lewis recognized the need to assure ourselves rationally that the frequency as validly estimated from the data is closely in accord with the actual frequency and that there is nothing in the case at hand affecting the occurrence of the property which isn't taken into account in the specification of the reference class. Lewis dubbed this the “reliability” of the determination of probability or expectation, and thought that reliability is a function of the adequacy of data (e.g., size of sample), the uniformity with which the frequency of some property in the data as a whole also holds for subsets of the data, and the proximateness or degree of resemblance between the data and the case at hand in P, all of which he also thought are logical relations.

So, in AKV, Lewis (1946, 305) claimed that the full statement of a probability judgement should be of the form “That c, having property F, will also have property G, is credible on data D, with expectation a/b and reliability R”, and is assertable in whatever sense D is. The judgement is valid when, in accordance with the a priori rules of probability and the correct rules of judging reliability, D gives the estimate a/b of the frequency of Gs among Fs, and D's adequacy, uniformity, and proximateness to the case in point, yields reliability R. A valid probability judgement is true when D is true, and is a categorical rather than hypothetical judgement when D is categorically asserted as true. Nonetheless, the assertion of the empirical data D is the only empirical element in the probability judgement, which otherwise has no testable implications for experience. However, the belief P, e.g., that c which has F is also G, is an empirical belief that may be rationally credible, empirically justified and warranted, in so far as D is given and the degree of assurance or belief corresponds to an a priori degree of probability (expectation) of P on D that is sufficiently reliable. Further, acceptance of P counts as empirical knowledge in so far as, firstly, the degree of probability or expectation of P on D is sufficiently high as to approach practical certainty, and, secondly, D consists of all relevant data (Lewis, 1946, 314-25).

It is important to distinguish counterfactual statements of the form (S & A) → (h)E from a priori probability statements of the form “ Prob (E, on S and A) > .5”. Both express conditional probabilities. However, the former express ‘real’ connections knowable by induction from past experience. They constitute the analytically entailed consequences of an objective material objective statement P, but can't themselves be analytic truths. The latter, on the other hand, if true, are analytically true, knowable a priori, with zero intension, and entailed by any statement whatsoever, and so can hardly constitute the empirical meaning of contingently true material object statements. Yet, apart from denying that “→” can be understood either as material implication or strict implication, Lewis had little to say in print about what the truth conditions of subjunctive or counterfactual conditionals are. (Murphey (2005, 332) quotes correspondence from Lewis complaining that Goodman and Chisholm in their writings miss the obvious interpretation of “If A were the case, then B would be the case”, namely that A plus other premises of the (actual or hypothetical) case inductively justify the conclusion B. The problem is to interpret the remark so as to avoid turning counterfactuals into analytic truths.) Nonetheless, Lewis emphasized their importance, and the importance of the real connections they express, for the possibility of realism about the material world and the rejection of any sort of idealism or view that physical objects are simply mind-dependent collections of experiences (Lewis 1955, in Lewis 1970). The conditionals (S & A) → E and (S & A) → (h)E can be true, as can the material object statement P that entails them, quite apart from the truth of the expressive statements S and A, or indeed, the presence of any empirical data warranting their assertion.

Chisholm (1948) raised the most important challenge to Lewis’ claim that a physical object statement P entails and is entailed by a set of counterfactual statements expressing claims about what experiences one would have were one to (seem to) carry out certain tests upon being presented with certain sensory cues. Chisholm argued that material object statements can't entail these experiential conditionals. If P entails T, then for any Q consistent with P, P and Q also entail T. However, for any material object statement P and for any sensory conditional (S & A) → (h)E, there will be some other material object statement M about the circumstances of perception that is consistent with P, such that P and M can both be true while (S & A) → (h)E is false. For example, suppose P is “There is a doorknob before one” and (S & A) → (h)E is “If one were to seem to see a doorknob and have the experience of reaching out with one’s hand, then, in all likelihood, one would seem to feel something hard and round”, and M is “One's fingertips have been permanently anaesthetized”. Instead of Lewis' empiricism about the meaning and justification of material object statements, Chisholm proposed that our spontaneous perceptual beliefs about the world, e.g., that one is seeing a doorknob, are prima facie justified just by virtue of being such spontaneous perceptual beliefs, quite apart from any inferential justification from the given that might be reconstructed. Lewis' own defence of the prima facie credibility of memory, Chisholm thought, prepared the way for his alternative. Quine (1969), on the other hand, thought that Chisholm's problem just shows that what have consequences for experience and are tested by experience aren't individual material object statements in isolation from each other but only sets of them or theories. Quine saved empiricism by drawing a holistic moral from the sort of problem Chisholm posed.

In a rare reply to critics, Lewis (1948) responded that Chisholm had misunderstood the implication of the probability qualifier. The familiar rule “If P entails T, then for any Q, P and Q entail T” doesn't apply when T is any kind of probability statement. E being improbable on P and M and S and A is perfectly consistent with E being probable on P and S and A, and so presumably doesn't undermine the claim that (S & A) → (h)E. However, this leaves the character of Lewis' empiricism puzzling. If the relative probability statements in question are the subjunctive conditionals, “(P and S and A) →(h)E” and “it is false that ((P and S and A and M) → (h)E)”, then the statements in question are empirical propositions justified by induction. The justification for them thus will presuppose prior knowledge of the truth of material object statements like P and M, perhaps in the way Chisholm suggests, rather than explain how we can know such propositions solely on the basis of present and past experience of the given. On the other hand, if the relative probability statements are supposed to be a priori analytic statements, then it is the total set of such statements that constitutes the empirical meaning of P, statements like “Prob (E, given P and S and A and M) < .5” as much as “Prob (E, given P and S and A) > .5”. Even when the relativization to other background material object statements isn't explicit, the probability statement would seem to be implicitly relative to some background assumption of material normality. In other words, Lewis would have to abandon his reductionism and agree with Quine's holistic conclusion that material object statements have “no fund of experiential implications to call their own” (Quine 1969, 79).

6. The Given

Reflection on ordinary empirical knowledge of the real, according to Lewis, reveals two elements: the given content of experience and our conceptual interpretation of the given. The given consists of specific sensuous qualities that I am immediately aware of when I take myself to seeing or hearing or tasting or smelling or touching something, or even to be hallucinating or dreaming instead. These distinct qualities or qualia (singular quale) are the repeatable felt characters of experience, and include the felt goodness or felt badness of particular experiences or stretches of experience, as well as qualities of sight, sound, taste, smell, touch, motion, and other familiar modes of experience. However, the repeatability, or the similarity of current instances to past instances, isn't something that is given to us. (Our immediate recollection or sense of past experience as having been so and so, however, is given to us.) When we conceptually interpret the given, we form hypothetical expectations and make predictions in the light of past experience, usually automatically and without conscious reflection, concerning what other experiences we would have were we to engage in specific actions, and so, in applying concepts, as Kant suggests, we relate our experiences to each other. The given, unlike our conceptual interpretation of it, isn't alterable by our will. It consists of what remains when we subtract from ordinary perceptual cognition all that could conceivably be mistaken. (Lewis (1946), 182-3) Our apprehension of the given isn't, therefore, subject to any error and isn't subject to correction or verification or disconfirmation from further experience.

The given is, therefore, that in experience about which we are certain and which is indubitable for us. Lewis claimed that our apprehension of the given is not to be called “knowledge” because it doesn't have error as an opposite. Yet, since he does call “knowledge” what we are a priori certain of, his denial of the label to our apprehensions of the given in experience may seem a bit ad hoc. A better reason, perhaps, for denying the label to our apprehensions of the given, but not to our a priori beliefs, is that the former, unlike the latter, don't involve concepts or judgement. Indeed, Lewis (1929, 53) in MWO claimed that the given is ineffable because our grasp of it, as opposed to our objective interpretation of it, doesn't involve conceptualization. However, this poses some problems for him. How can what is ineffable even be true, and how can what is neither true nor false serve as the premises of a priori probability inferences and thus as evidence for the truth or falsity of the interpretative claims we make? In AKV, Lewis introduced a category of expressive statements like “It seems as though I am seeing a red round thing” that serve to convey or express or formulate our apprehensions of the given without conceptualizing or interpreting it. They are true when they express our apprehension of the given, and yet might be false when they aren't simply expressing what we apprehend, e.g., in lies or play acting or counterfactual supposition.

Lewis' views about the given are at once among his best known and among his most criticized. Sellars (1963, 132) thought the classical empiricist given was an inconsistent triad of three claims: (1) being appeared to as if there were something red entails non-inferentially knowing that one is appeared red to, (2) the ability to be appeared to is unacquired, and (3) the ability to know facts of the form x is F is acquired. Lewis clearly denied (1), but to make this denial not seem ad hoc, given his claims about direct apprehension, immediate awareness, and certainty, he needed to say more about the logic of “apprehend” and “aware”. Lewis' defense of the certainty of the given rests on two claims. First, it is just an undeniable fact, apparent to anyone who reflects on experience, that there is a sensuous character of experience that we are aware of and can't be mistaken about and that isn't in need of any further confirmation. Second, unless there are certain data, nothing can be probable. The probability of a proposition is always relative to premises or data, and the supposition that probability is always relative to something else that is itself only probable means that probabilities can never get off the ground and so is incompatible with the justifiable assignment of any probability at all. In a symposium on the given with Lewis (1952a) and Reichenbach (1952), Goodman (1952) argued that the premises relative to which other statements are credible or probable just have to be initially credible on their own to some degree, not certain. This is a view that attracted many epistemologists after Lewis in some form or other.

7. Action, the Good, and the Right

In contrast with those logical positivists who thought that statements of value merely express attitudes, pro or con, to objects, persons, or situations, but are neither true nor false, Lewis (1946, 396-98) thought that statements of value were as true or false as other empirical statements, and every bit as empirically verifiable or falsifiable, confirmable or disconfirmable. True, felt value qualia, felt goodness and badness, are given to us and directly apprehended in experience or stretches of experience, and “expressive” statements must be used to indicate or convey them. However, such statements, like Lewis’ other “expressive” statements, may be true or false (see previous section), and simply convey the occurrence of given qualia in experience and no more, instead of indicating the existence of objects, situations, or persons, and expressing our attitudes to them. Moreover, there are also for Lewis terminating judgments of value concerning what the felt value of some experiences indicates about the felt value of further experiences. Finally, there are “objective” judgements of value: judgements attributing value to persons, objects, and objective situations, in so far as they have the potential, depending on circumstances, to produce felt goodness or badness in us or others. These are non-terminating judgements of value and are empirically confirmable or disconfirmable by induction just like any other objective empirical judgement. Lewis thus claims that his theory of value is thoroughly naturalistic and humanistic, rather than transcendental, but still objectivist.

The felt goodness of experience is what is intrinsically good or valuable for its own sake. It is only experience in so far as it has such value quality that is intrinsically good rather than merely extrinsically valuable for its contribution to something else that is intrinsically valuable. Value and disvalue are modes or aspects of experience to which desire and aversion are “addressed” (Lewis 1946, 403). Lewis denies that “pleasure” is adequate to the wide variety of what is found directly good in experience, and thus thinks it inadequate as a synonym for “good”. However, as Frankena (1964) argues, for Lewis directly found goodness still seems to be as natural a quality or property of certain experiences as any other qualia directly apprehended in experience. Nonetheless, the value of a stretch of experience, indeed a whole life, isn't just the value (and disvalue) of the parts, and in AKV, Lewis criticized Bentham’s attempt at a calculus of values. For Lewis, the intrinsic value found in the experience of a symphony isn't just the sum of the intrinsic value of the movements taken individually, but reflects the character of the symphony as a temporal Gestalt. What is ultimately good for Lewis is the quality of a life found good in the living of it. (Lewis 1952b in Lewis 1970, 179) The constituent experiences thus might have value for their own sake, but also value for their contribution to the value of the whole life of which they are parts.

However, Lewis thought that judgements about how a valued experience contributes to the value of a life as a whole, unlike some terminating judgements about how one valued experience will yield another valued experience, are not decisively verifiable or falsifiable. First, any attempt to apprehend a life as a whole and the value of it as experienced goes beyond the specious present of experience and relies on memory and expectation of past and future experience and their values, and thereby leaves room for error. Second, any attempt to simplify the problem by breaking a whole life into parts and apprehending their value, and then calculating the probability of their contributing to a good life as a whole, also leaves room for error.

The value of an object consists in its potentiality for conducing to intrinsically valuable experiences, and is thus a real connection between objects, persons, and the character of experience, which we can be empirically warranted in accepting on the basis of the empirical evidence and the probability on the evidence of such objects yielding such intrinsically valuable experiences. For Lewis (1946, 432), therefore, no object has intrinsic value. Nonetheless, objects can have inherent value in so far as the good which they produce is disclosable in the presence or observation of the object itself rather than some other object. Lewis (1946, Ch. 14) contrasted aesthetic value with cognitive and moral value, not by virtue of distinctive characters of their felt goods, but chiefly by distinctive attitudes to experience. The aesthetic attitude is one of disinterested interest in the presented, attentiveness to the given in its own right, as opposed to the cognitive attitude's concern with prediction and significance for future experience, and the concern on the part of the attitude of action or morality with the pursuit of absent but attainable goods. Thanks to these differences, aesthetic values in experience tend to be of high degree and long lasting and don't require exclusive possession, and aesthetic values in objects are inherent ones.

Lewis recognized that potentialities are in various ways relative to particular circumstances and manners of observation. There is thus a plurality of judgements of the value of objects, of the various ways in which they can contribute and fail to contribute to intrinsically valuable experiences, and an apparent contradictory nature to incomplete verbal statements of them (e.g., “X is good”, “X isn't good”). For Lewis (1946, 528), issues about the relativity or subjectivity of judgements of the value of objects aren't issues about the empirical truth of attributions of value to objects, but just issues about whether the conditions under which an object produces directly apprehended value are peculiar to the nature and capacities of a particular person and thus not indicative of the possibility of similar value finding on the part of other persons. Quine (1981) argued that variation within and among individuals and societies, and the variable and open ended character of what they find valuable, means that predicates like “pleases” or “ feels good” don't support inductive inferences from case to case in the way that “green” or “conducts electricity” do. Skepticism concerning the prospects for empirical content and empirical truth of attributions of value to objects is thus in order. Lewis (1946, 323), on the other hand, seems to have thought that this contention implies that no one could ever act with empirical warrant to improve his own lot in life or do any others good, an absurdity in his view. Lewis argued at length for the possibility of empirically warranted judgements of the social or impersonal value of objects. The key is that “value to more than one person is to be assessed as if their several experiences were to be included in that of a single person” (Lewis (1946, 550). Rawls (1971, 188-90) criticized Lewis for mistaking impersonality for impartiality, and denied the relevance of Lewis' account of impersonal value for questions of justice, at least, for which impartiality is key.

An action, for Lewis (1955, 49), is subjectively right, and one we are not to be blamed for doing, if we think it objectively right. An action is objectively right if it is correctly judged on the evidence that its consequences are such as it will be right to bring about. That requires that their pursuit violates no categorical rational imperative or principle.

Lewis (1952b, 1952c, 1955, Chapter 5) outlines categorical rational imperatives of doing and thinking, or versions of one rational imperative, in various ways, formulations, and detail. The general idea is laid out briefly in AKV (Lewis (1946, 480-82). To be subject to imperatives is to find a constraint of action or thought in what is not immediate. To be rational is to be capable of constraint by prevision of some future good or ill, and subjection to imperatives is simply a feature of living in human terms. Rationality turns on consistency, and the logical is derivative from the rational. Indeed consistency of thought is for the sake of and aimed at consistency in action, which in turn derives from consistency in willing, i.e., of purposing and setting a value on. Logical consistency turns on nowhere repudiating that to which we anywhere commit ourselves to in our thought, and consistency in general consists in not accepting now what we are unwilling to commit to elsewhere or later. Consistency in what we think and do requires and is required by conformity to principles.

So there is a categorical rational imperative of consistency, “Be consistent in valuation and in thought and action” (Lewis 1946, 481) the basis of which is simply a datum of human nature, and a broader imperative of cogency or basing one's beliefs on cogent reasoning from evidence (Lewis 1952b, 1952c), an imperative of prudence, “Be concerned about yourself in future and on the whole”, and an imperative of justice, “No rule of action is right except one which is right in all instances and therefore right for everyone” (Lewis 1946, 481-2). These principles are simply a priori explications of the rational or moral sense possessed by most humans. Certainly, this might be challenged. In any case, Lewis thinks that where that sense is lacking, argument for the principles is pointless, and he concludes AKV by claiming that “valuation is always a matter of empirical knowledge” but “what is right and what is just can never be determined by empirical facts alone” (Lewis 1946, 554).

The problem remains of reconciling the imperatives of prudence and (social) justice in practice, of reconciling the good for oneself with the good for others in our self-directed, principled, thinking and doing. What aids us is that, through language and civilization, humans remember as a species and not merely as individuals. What we are justified in thinking thereby is that human achievement and social progress require autonomous, self-criticizing and self-governing individuals, and that individual achievement and realization of cherished goods requires membership in a social order of individuals co-operating in the pursuit of values cherished in common. The contrast between individual prudence and social justice seems fundamental, Lewis concludes, perhaps rather optimistically, only by forgetting this (Lewis 1952b).


Primary Sources

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

analytic/synthetic distinction | a priori justification and knowledge | Chisholm, Roderick | cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism, moral | conditionals: counterfactual | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | logic: inductive | logic: modal | logical consequence | logical positivism | naturalism: moral | pragmatism | probability, interpretations of | qualia | Quine, Willard van Orman | value: intrinsic vs. extrinsic