Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Oct 17, 2007

Seneca is a major philosophical figure of the Roman Imperial Period. As a Stoic philosopher writing in Latin, Seneca makes a lasting contribution to Stoicism. He occupies a central place in the literature on Stoicism at the time, and shapes the understanding of Stoic thought that later generations were to have. Seneca's philosophical works played a large role in the revival of Stoic ideas in the Renaissance. Until today, many readers approach Stoic philosophy through Seneca, rather than through the more fragmentary evidence that we have for earlier Stoics. Seneca's writings are stunningly diverse in their generic range. More than that, Seneca develops further and shapes several philosophical genres, most important, the letter and so-called “consolations”; his essay On Mercy is considered the first example of what came to be known as the “mirror of the prince” literature.

After several centuries of relative neglect, Seneca's philosophy has been rediscovered in the last few decades, in what might be called a second revival of Senecan thought. In part, this renewed interest is the result of a general reappraisal of Roman culture. It is also fuelled by major progress that has been made in our understanding of Greek Hellenistic philosophy. And finally, scholars have found, in the wake of Foucault's reading of Seneca, that Seneca speaks to us ‘moderns’ much more directly than we might have previously thought.

1. Life and Works

Lucius Annaeus Seneca (c. 1 BCE – CE 65) was born in Corduba (Spain) and educated—in rhetoric and philosophy—in Rome. Seneca had a highly successful, and quite dramatic, political career. Even a brief (and by necessity incomplete) list of events in his life indicates that Seneca had ample occasion for reflection on violent emotions, the dangers of ambition, and the ways in which the life of politics differs from the life of philosophy—among the topics pursued in his writings. He was accused of adultery with the Emperor Caligula's sister and therefore exiled to Corsica in 41; having been Nero's “tutor” in his adolescent years, he was among Nero's advisors after his accession in 54, and continued to be an advisor in times that became increasingly difficult for anyone in the close proximity of Nero, in spite of requests from his side to be granted permission to retire; he was charged with complicity in the Pisonian conspiracy to murder Nero, and compelled to commit suicide in 65 (on Seneca's life, see Griffin 1992; Maurach 2000; Veyne 2003).

Seneca's philosophical writings have often been interpreted with an eye to his biography: how could his discussions of the healing powers of philosophy not reflect his own life? However, as personal as Seneca's style often is, his writings are not autobiographical (Edwards 1997). Seneca creates a literary persona for himself. He discusses the questions that occupy him in a way that invites his readers to think about issues in their own life, rather than in Seneca's life.

The writings that we shall primarily be concerned with are: the Moral Letters to Lucilius (Ad Lucilium epistulae morales), the Moral Essays (‘dialogi’ or dialogues is the somewhat misleading title given in our principal manuscript, the Codex Ambrosianus, to the twelve books making up ten of these works, including three “consolatory” writings; among the Essays are two further works that came down to us in other manuscripts), and the Natural Questions (Naturales quaestiones) (on the full range of Seneca's writings, see Volk and Williams 2006, “Introduction,” and Ker 2006).

A brief note is in order here on the relative chronology of Seneca's works, which is hard to establish given that we know so little about Seneca's life. The Consolation to Marcia is probably the earliest surviving piece of Seneca's work. Similarly, the Consolation to His Mother Helvia and the Consolation to Polybius are considered early (perhaps dating to 43 or 44), the former actually being composed on the occasion of Seneca's banishment to Corsica. All other surviving works seem to be written later, mostly after Seneca's return to Rome in 49 from his Corsican exile. Among the Moral Essays, the only one we can date with some certainty is On Mercy, an essay in which Seneca directly addresses Nero in the early days of his reign (55 or 56). The Moral Letters to Lucilius as well as the Natural Questions are the product of the last years of Seneca's life, the brief period (62-65) that Seneca spent in retirement before following Nero's order to commit suicide (on the dating of Seneca's writings see the introductions in Cooper/Procopé 1995, and Griffin 1992).

In the Imperial Period, Stoicism had significant influence on Roman literature, and Seneca's tragedies are of particular interest here. In Seneca's case, we do not see a poet appropriating or integrating Stoic ideas, but actually a Stoic philosopher writing poetry himself. The precise way in which Seneca's Stoicism is relevant to his tragedies is controversial. Traditionally scholars debated whether and why a philosopher like Seneca would write poetry at all—to some this seemed so unlikely that prior to Erasmus it was thought that there were two ‘Senecas,’ the philosopher and the tragedian (cf. Fantham 1982, 15). Today it is widely assumed that some of the themes in Seneca's tragedies are at least related to his philosophical views. Seneca's interest in ethics and psychology—first and foremost perhaps the destructive effects of excessive emotion—seems to figure in his plays, and perhaps his natural philosophy plays an equally important role (cf. Fantham 1982, 15-19; Gill 2003, 56-58; Rosenmeyer 1989; Volk 2006; on the range of Seneca's writings, see Volk and Williams 2006). In this article, we do not consider his tragedies, but only his prose writings.

2. Seneca's Stoicism

2.1 Philosophy as a Practice

Readers who approach Seneca as students of ancient philosophy—having acquired a certain idea of what philosophy is by studying Plato, Aristotle, or Chrysippus—often feel at a loss. To them, Seneca's writings can appear lengthy and merely admonitory. Partly, this reaction may reflect prejudices of our training. The remnants of a Hegelian (and Nietzschean, and Heideggerean) narrative for philosophy are deeply ingrained in influential works of scholarship. On this account, the history of ancient philosophy is a history of decline, the Roman thinkers are mediocre imitators of their Greeks predecessors, and so on (Long 2006). Such prejudices are hard to shake off; watered-down versions of them have shaped the way students learnt Latin and Greek for a long time. In recent years, however, many scholars have come to adopt a different view. They find in Seneca a subtle author who speaks very directly to modern concerns of shaping ourselves and our lives.

Seneca does not write as a philosopher who creates or expounds a philosophical theory from the ground up. Rather, he writes within the track of an existing system that he is largely in agreement with. A reconstruction of Seneca's philosophy, if it aimed at some kind of completeness, would have to be many-layered. At several points, it would have to include accounts of earlier Stoic philosophy, and discuss which aspects of these earlier theories become more or less prominent in Seneca's thought. At times Seneca's own contribution consists in developing further a Stoic theory and adding detail to it. At other times, Seneca dismisses certain technicalities and emphasizes the therapeutic, practical side of philosophy.

Seneca thinks of himself as the adherent of a philosophical system—Stoicism—and speaks in the first person plural (‘we’) in order to refer to the Stoics. Rather than call Seneca an orthodox Stoic, however, we might want to say that he writes within the Stoic system. Seneca emphasizes his independence as a thinker. He holds Stoic views, but he does not see himself as anyone's disciple or chronicler. In On the Private Life, he says: “Surely you can only want me to be like my leaders? Well then, I shall not go where they send me but where they lead” (1.5, tr. Cooper and Procopé). Seneca sees himself as a philosopher like the older Stoics. He feels free, however, to disagree with earlier Stoics, and is not concerned with keeping Stoicism ‘pure’ from non-Stoic ideas. Seneca integrates ideas from other philosophies if these seem helpful to him. As he explains, he likes to think of philosophical views as if they were motions made in a meeting. One often asks the proponent of the motion to split it up in two motions, so that one can agree with one half, and vote against the other (Letter 21.9). For example, Seneca thinks that there is something salutary in Platonic metaphysics. While he dismisses the theory of Forms, he still holds that studying it can make us better. It acquaints us with the thought that the things which stimulate and enflame the senses are not among the things that really are (Letter 58.18 and 26). Seneca also adopts metaphors or images that are associated with other philosophical schools, such as Platonically inspired images of the body as prison of the soul (e.g., NQ I.4 and 11). But invoking such images need not commit Seneca to holding the theories in which they originate.

Another side of Seneca's independence has been emphasized by Inwood (2005 [1], 18-22): Seneca, educated by Roman philosophers, is genuinely thinking in Latin. In order to see the force of this point, let us compare Seneca to Cicero. Cicero conscientiously tells his readers which Greek term he translates by which Latin term. It is thus possible to read Cicero's Latin philosophy with the Greek terminology in mind; at least for the most part, we can think about his arguments in the terms of the Greek debates. Seneca is, at many points, not interested in mapping his terminology directly onto the Greek philosophical vocabulary. Rather, he thinks in his own language (see Long 2003, who situates Seneca vis-à-vis other Roman philosophers), and he expects to be read by people who do their philosophizing in Latin, as well.

Like other late Stoics, Seneca is first and foremost interested in ethics. Although he is well versed in the technical details of Stoic logic, philosophy of language, epistemology, and ontology, he does not devote any significant time to these fields (Cooper 2004). However, we should not let the old prejudices about Roman versus Greek thought influence our interpretation of Seneca's interest in practical questions. As Veyne puts it, “Seneca practiced neither a debased nor a vulgarized philosophy aimed at the supposed ‘practical spirit’ of the Romans” (2003, ix). Rather, it is Seneca's very conception of philosophy as a salutary practice that makes the ethical dimension of his thought so prominent (on philosophy as therapy, see Nussbaum 1994).

Seneca's writings usually have an addressee—someone who is plagued by a ‘sickness of the soul’ (On Peace of Mind begins with a full diagnosis of the addressee's state of mind—first by the patient, and then by the insightful therapist Seneca). Seneca steps back from a format in which a philosopher justifies a theory in a step-by-step argument (Long 2003, 204; on the question of why Seneca chooses to write letters, see Inwood 2007, xiv-xv). Discussion proceeds from a (perhaps merely presumed) situation in the addressee's life, meandering back and forth between more general and more specific considerations, arguments, side-issues, and sometimes consolation. This engaging style views the reader as a participant in philosophical thought. Seneca thinks that one cannot passively adopt insights. One must appropriate them as an active reader, thinking through the issues for oneself, so as then to genuinely assent to them (Letter 84.5-10; Wildberger 2006).

It has often been noted that later Stoics, including Seneca, seem to lose interest in the ideal agent—the sage or wise person—who figures so prominently in early Stoic ethics. Rather than assume that the later Stoics are “disillusioned” or “more realistic,” we should note that Seneca's focus on the progressor (proficiens)—the person who is seriously trying their best to move forward in their way of life toward that ideal—is part and parcel of his own, specific way of doing philosophy. The early Stoics' sage may, first and foremost, be a tool for developing theories. The early Stoics spell out what knowledge or wisdom is by explaining what a knowledgeable or wise person would do (how she assents, how she acts, etc.). But Seneca's philosophy is a practice of training ourselves to appreciate to the fullest the truths of Stoicism. In this practice, accounts of, for example, the wise person's assent, can only play a limited role. We need precisely what Seneca offers: someone who takes us through the various situations in life in which we tend to lose sight of our own insights, and fall victim to the allurements of money and fame, or to the violence of emotions evoked by the adversities of life. We need to learn how to overcome our own residual tendencies, despite our better intentions, to suffer such failures.

Three of Seneca's writings bear the title ‘consolatio’—consolation. They, too, are letters, and, as Williams argues, Seneca in them transforms the genre of philosophical consolation into his own mode of therapy (2006). In the ad Heluiam (To His Mother Helvia), Seneca consoles his mother for his absence and exile. Seneca uses his exile as a metaphor, and ultimately addresses what he takes to be a many-faceted condition in human life: any kind of alienation from one's immediate community, any enforced detachment from it, raises the issues that political exile raises. As this example shows, his consolations are thus rather independent of his particular situation, and of the particular addressee. Still, we might want to note that at times, in consoling his mother for his exile, or, in ad Marciam (To Marcia), a woman for the loss of her child, Seneca discusses virtue with a view to gender. In her life up to now, he tells his mother, she has moved beyond the ordinary faults of women; her virtue was her only ornament. In accordance with this, she should now try not to fall into grief in the way women tend to—excessively. By holding on to virtue, it seems, his mother can transcend typical, yet merely contingent features of female life. (On Seneca's depiction of female virtue, cf. ad Heluiam 14-18 and ad Marciam 1 and 16; Harich 1993).

2.2 The World of Philosophy: Seneca's Cosmopolitanism

Seneca tells us that there is a much-debated choice between three kinds of life—the life of theory, the life of politics (or practice), and the life of pleasure. This is not a Stoic distinction. Rather, it is (by Seneca's time) a conventional division, going back, on the one hand, to Aristotle's discussion of the life of theoria (‘contemplation’) as compared to the life of politics, and on the other hand to Plato's and Aristotle's engagement with prominent views about the good (the good is pleasure, the good is honor, the good is wisdom). Seneca is not committed to the view that the life of theory is a different life from the life of practice. But the Aristotelian way of framing the question helps him describe choices which he and some of his addressees face in life: whether to retire, or to single-mindedly pursue one's political career (for a discussion of traditional interpretations, which aim to explain Seneca's views on retirement in the context of his biography, see Williams 2003).

In On the Private Life and in On Peace of Mind, Seneca addresses this very question of how to choose between the active life of politics, and a life devoted to philosophy. The choice is, for Seneca, partly about the right kind of balance. How much do we need to retreat in order to be at peace with ourselves? Philosophy has two functions. We need philosophical insight on which to base our actions. But we also need to devote time specifically to reflecting on such truths as that only virtue is good, and thus restore our peace of mind (cf. On Peace of Mind 2.4 for a description of tranquility).

Both philosophy and politics are spheres in which we can benefit others (On Peace of Mind 3.1-3). The contrast between the life of theory and the life of politics helps Seneca spell out his version of Stoic cosmopolitanism. We should not think of the choice between philosophy and politics as a choice between theory and practice. Rather, philosophy and politics represent two worlds that we simultaneously belong to. The world of politics is our local world; the world of philosophy is the whole world. By pursuing an active career in politics, we aim to do good to the people in our vicinity. By retreating into philosophy we choose to live, for a while, predominantly in the world at large. By studying, teaching, and writing philosophy, Seneca thinks, we help others who are not necessarily spatially close to us. Philosophical study is beneficial (or ‘of benefit’), it is of use to others, in the world-wide community to which we all belong (On the Private Life 3.4-4.2).

While Seneca takes it for granted that cosmopolitanism is concerned with the idea that it is good to benefit others, he does not seem to think that cosmopolitanism burdens us with the unfeasible task of helping everyone. Rather, cosmopolitanism liberates us. As things may play out in our individual lives, we may be in a better position to benefit others as philosophers than as Roman senators; and since both are good things to do, we can in fact be content with our lives either way. Cosmopolitanism creates a beneficial form of life that a narrower political picture may not accommodate: not only those who happen to be appreciated in their own states can benefit others (cf. Letter 68.2; cf. Williams 2003, 10-11 and 19-24). In On the Private Life 3.5, Seneca says: “What is required, you see, of any man is that he should be of use to other men—if possible, to many; failing that, to a few; failing that, to those nearest him; failing that, to himself.”

3. Philosophical Psychology

3.1 The Stoic Account of the Soul

The two most prominent features of the Stoic account of the soul are these: first, the soul is corporeal; second, the adult human soul is rational (in the sense that all its operations involve the use of reason) and one (psychological monism). Although Seneca appreciates Platonic imagery that presents the soul as ‘loftier’ than bodily things, he is fully committed to the Stoic view that the soul is a body. Discussion of this issue is, to his mind, somewhat academic, and thus not as salutary as the elevating themes about virtue that he often prefers. But Letter 106 explains why we must think of the soul as a body. Only bodies act on anything, cause effects; therefore, the soul must be a body (cf. Letter 117 on the good being a body).

Traditionally, Stoic philosophy is considered to have three phases: early (Zeno, Cleanthes, Chrysippus, et al.), middle (Panaetius, Posidonius, et al.), and late (Seneca, Epictetus, et al.). This periodization importantly hangs on a possible development in the philosophical psychology of the Stoics—the question of whether Panaetius and Posidonius move away from so-called psychological monism. According to psychological monism, there is no non-rational part or power of the soul. Rather, the soul is one insofar as its commanding faculty is one, and rational. According to psychological monism, motivational conflict and irrational action do not result from a ‘struggle’ between the rational and the non-rational aspects of the soul; what we call irrational must be understood as (bad) states of the rational soul. Psychological monism is thus a counterposition to Plato's and Aristotle's account of the soul, and has major implications for the theory of action, ethics, and the theory of emotion. It is a difficult question whether middle Stoicism departs from psychological monism. The view that it did was for a long time widely accepted. However, this traditional picture has recently been contested in influential studies (Cooper 1999; Tieleman 2003). Perhaps early and middle Stoicism are more in agreement than it was previously thought. Accordingly, some recent studies of Seneca proceed on the assumption that we need not attempt to figure out whether Roman Stoicism agrees with monistic early or with pluralistic middle Stoicism (Inwood 2005).

But Seneca may agree with psychological monism insofar as he does not distinguish between rational and non-rational powers of the soul, and still modify a related aspect of the early Stoic account of the soul. Psychological monism implies that there is no distinction between practical and theoretical reason. Knowledge bears directly on action. Indeed, all philosophical knowledge is needed for good decision-making. There is thus, according to Stoic “orthodoxy,” no real distinction between theorizing and aiming to lead a good life (I. Hadot 1969, 101). Seneca brings to bear this aspect of Stoic thought in his own way. For him, studying the arguments for a particular claim will not bring us peace of mind. At the outset of Letter 85, Seneca goes so far as to swear that he does not take pleasure in producing proofs for a piece of doctrine that looms large in his Letters: that virtue alone brings happiness (85.1). His addressee, Lucilius, urges him to present all arguments and objections that are relevant to this issue, and in response, Seneca discusses some of them in Letter 85. But ultimately—and this is evident throughout his writings—this is not enough. Rather, it is important to think through the implications of the Stoic thesis in a variety of practical contexts, so as then to be able to live by it, for example, when one is or is not elected to office, has more or less money than others, and so on. One needs to think one's way through these issues repeatedly—and ultimately, thinking about them in the right way must become a way of life.

But is not this conception of philosophy as a practice in tension with the Stoic conception of reason? Strictly interpreted, this conception might imply that whatever is once understood has become a piece of knowledge, and thus guides our action (see I. Hadot 1969, 106). Seneca, however, assumes that it is one thing to know something, and another to “feel” its truth and relevance to one's own life. Here is one of his examples: he knows that it does not matter whether he travels in a fashionable or in a humble carriage, but he blushes if people see him in a humble one (Letter 87.4). Why should this be so? Why does Seneca suggest, in Platonic fashion, that one's desires for fame and money are going to raise their heads if they are not constantly kept down? Second, why should not the complete system of philosophical knowledge, including the study of rigorous dialectical argument, be relevant to leading one's life well? In these respects, Seneca seems to weaken the earlier Stoic identification of virtue and knowledge—or perhaps, depending on the view we take, he remedies some of the starkness of this identification (on Seneca's dismissive attitude toward the syllogisms of “dialecticians,” and on how this differs from early Stoic thought on the value of knowledge for a good life, see Cooper 2004, 314-320).

3.2 The Will and the Self

The Stoic understanding of the soul further involves core epistemological ideas. Human beings have “impressions” (imprints or alterations of the soul). We acquire the views we hold by assenting to impressions; in every given case, we can assent to an impression, negate it, or withhold judgment. Since this is in our power, it is in our power to become wise (by assenting only to cognitive impressions, which represent things precisely as they are). Human action is generated through “assent” to practical impressions; such assent sets off impulse (hormê). If there is no external impediment, impulse leads to action. It is in our power to become virtuous, because assent is in our control; we decide how we act. Seneca discusses these and related issues with the help of a term that has no equivalent in Greek Stoicism: voluntas.

Traditionally, Seneca was seen either as the discoverer of the will, or, at least, a major stepping-stone towards St. Augustine (for detailed discussion of the literature, see Inwood 2005 [5]; key contributions are: I. Hadot 1969, Voelke 1973, Dihle 1982, Donini 1982, Kahn 1988; for the view that already Aristotle has a conception of the will, see Irwin 1992; for a critique of the traditional view see Rist 1969, and, recently, Inwood 2005 [5]).

It is a difficult question what precisely would count as the discovery of the will. Clearly, voluntas and velle (‘willing’, ‘wanting’) figure prominently in many of Seneca's arguments. Does Seneca think there is a separate faculty of the will, thus modifying psychological monism? Or is he interested in exploring the phenomenology of decision-making and self-improvement, and this leads him to describe certain mental acts as acts of willing (velle)? This second suggestion seems more persuasive, and seems to capture much of what is important to the traditional interpretation: that Seneca keeps discussing how we must be continually committed to self-improvement (cf. Letters 34.3 and 71.36). Perhaps Seneca's depictions of the mental act that the Greek Stoics call assent appear in some sense richer than those of the earlier Stoics (without changing the substance of the theory), because Seneca likes to use metaphorical language. Rather than stick with the abstract description that, in deciding what to do, we assent to a practical impression, Seneca envisages us as judges, passing judgment over what we should be doing, and issuing commands to ourselves (cf. Inwood 2005, [5] and [7]). With respect to the emotions, Seneca distinguishes between involuntary reactions (what earlier Stoics call “proto-emotions” or propatheiai) and full-blown emotions, which involve assent and thus are voluntary (On Anger II; see below). They are voluntary in the sense that assent is in the agent's power. This is a key piece of Stoic doctrine—that, whether we are foolish or wise, it is in our power to assent or not assent to impressions. But at other times, Seneca employs a normative notion of voluntariness. Only virtuous action is free in the sense of being fully reasonable, while other actions spring from irrational movements of the mind such as emotions; in this sense, only virtuous action is voluntary (Letter 66.16).

Seneca's discussions of self-improvement raise a further question: Does Seneca discover the self (or, as Veyne puts this question, “the I”; Veyne 2003)? In a famous passage of On Anger (III 36.3-4) Seneca tells his readers how he, every evening, examines himself. Does Seneca's emphasis on reflection involve a turn to the self, as it has seemed to many recent readers inspired by Foucault's discussions of these matters? Is Seneca concerned with a practice of self-shaping? In order to think about the question of whether Seneca discovers or even invents the self, we might distinguish different versions of it. First, we may ask whether Seneca modifies psychological monism, so as to make room for a self reflecting upon itself (in a way which makes the self have a complex structure that the Greek Stoics would not have envisaged for the rational soul of human beings). Second, we might think that what readers, in the wake of Foucault's influential studies, have found modern about Seneca is simply his therapeutic concern with fashioning one's own life. This second view is much weaker, and is by now widely accepted (Long 2006, 362). The first view is forcefully critiqued by Inwood (2005 [12]). While Seneca invites us to engage reflectively with our lives, this does not revise basic Stoic assumptions about the soul. But we might also raise a third question: Can we acceptably, to borrow a term from Veyne, “abuse” Seneca for our own purposes, knowing full well that we are reading a certain kind of concern with the self into his works which has more to do with out own times than with a precise interpretation of his work? This is Veyne's suggestion: “Stoicism has thus become, for our use, a philosophy of the active turning in on itself of the I […]. It was nothing of the kind in its own day, but the Letters permit us to view it as such.” (2003, x).

When Seneca discusses how we must hold on to the insight that only virtue is good, in order to improve ourselves, it may sometimes seem as if he blamed the world (competition, superficial lifestyles, etc.) for the difficulty of the task. But ultimately, Seneca argues that we are standing in our own way. He tells his addressees that, by living in such-and-such a way, they weigh themselves down (‘tibi gravis eris’; On Peace of Mind 3.6), or become a problem to themselves (‘tu tibi molestus es’; Letter 21.1). It is with a view to this reflective engagement with one's thought that Hadot finds ‘spiritual exercises’ in Roman Stoic philosophy (P. Hadot 1995, 79-144; cf. Letter 6.1 on self-transformation).

Care for one's soul involves the Socratic project of aiming to know oneself. In the Natural Questions, Seneca says that nature has given us mirrors so that we may know ourselves (ut homo ipse se nosset). Even this external means of seeing ourselves—which, Seneca deplores, is mostly put to less than virtuous uses—serves a purpose; for example, the young see the bloom of their youth, thus being reminded that this is the time for study and bravery (NQ 1.16.1-17.10; cf. Williams 2005). Ultimately, however, coming to know oneself is a matter of reflective self-examination and philosophical study.

Like St. Augustine, whose “turn inside” is as much debated by scholars as Seneca's “turn to the self,” Seneca seems to think that turning to one's soul is not enough—we need to further turn to God. However, for Seneca, the study of nature and God seems to be motivated by care for one's soul (rather than, say, by love for God). In the Natural Questions, Seneca suggests that the reflective engagement with our own soul is but the first step. Even if we escape the violent emotions and disruptions of a public life, we might not yet have escaped from ourselves, that is, from an excessive concern with our own particular situation and needs. We must turn into ourselves (in se recedendum), but then we must also retreat from ourselves (a se recedendum) (NQ 4.20). From a care of ourselves that revolves around ethical questions, we must turn to the study of nature and theology (NQ 1.1-8). How does such study liberate us? By removing us from our localized concerns, and offering us a distanced, disengaged perspective on them. The study of nature is an attempt at overcoming one's mortality (NQ 1.17). More than that, the ideal of virtue that is at issue in taking care of one's soul is, ultimately, the ideal of becoming like God (Russell 2004). This is a thought that perhaps is rather foreign to modern psychotherapeutic techniques, and to Foucaultian ideas about self-care.

3.3 The Therapy of the Emotions

Questions relating to Stoic psychological monism have been most widely discussed with a view to the theory of the emotions—here, it makes a great difference whether we think that irrational desires can overcome reason, or are irrational acts of the rational soul. Seneca's treatment of the emotions has been scrutinized for indications of both points of view. Sorabji interprets Seneca as situating his account of the emotions vis-à-vis early and middle Stoic theories that differ from his own (1989); Fillon-Lahille studies On Anger with source-critical methods (1984). According to others, On Anger can be studied as a treatise on emotion that is basically in agreement with Stoic psychological monism, and appreciated for the detailed treatment that Seneca devotes to this, as he sees it, particularly violent emotion (Cooper 1999; Vogt 2006).

According to the Stoics, the ideal agent has no emotions. Stoic theory of the emotions does not aim at moderation or “adequate” emotional responses. Rather, it aims at a life without emotions. However, the Stoics do not suggest that the perfect agent is affectively inert. Rational affective reactions and dispositions replace emotion. The ideal agent has “good feelings” of wishing (which replaces desire), caution (which replaces fear), and joy (which replaces pleasure) (Graver 2007, 51-55). Further, the ideal agent has proto-emotions, that is, initial affective and physiological reactions that do not depend on assent (On Anger 2.1-4; 1.16.7).

The conceptions of good or rational feelings (i.e., the affective dispositions and reactions of the wise person) and proto-emotions render Stoic thought on the emotions less implausible than it is sometimes taken to be. But still, students of ancient theories of emotion have often felt that one simply must side with an Aristotelian position—with the view that there are adequate, measured emotions. Suppose someone commits a crime; are not we justly angry, and should we not react to the crime? As Seneca puts it, will the ideal agent not be angry if he sees his father murdered and his mother raped? Yes, he argues, we should react, but not with emotions and emotional action (revenge), no matter how curbed they might be through reflection. The idea of “moderate emotions,” says Seneca, is about as absurd as the idea of “moderate insanity” (Letter 85.9). Emotions are irrational (85.8); there is no taming of the irrational, precisely because it is irrational. Emotions thus cannot be moderated—they must be replaced with rational responses. The ideal agent will avenge and defend others out of duty (quia oportet) (On Anger 1.12), not out of anger or lust for revenge.

Seneca's detailed analysis of anger adds in interesting ways to our knowledge of how, precisely, the Stoic claim that emotions are opinions plays out. According to the early Stoics, there are four generic emotions: pleasure (in the sense of being pleased about something), pain (in the sense of being distressed or feeling displeased), desire, and fear. Pleasure is directed at a presumed good that is present; pain at a presumed bad that is present; desire at a presumed good in the future; fear at a presumed bad in the future. Since emotions are impulses, they result in action (if there is no external impediment). Anger counts as a kind of desire. In anger, the agent assents to the impression that she should take revenge. But the judgment that first generates anger is something like ‘He wronged me’. On Anger thus helps shed light on the way in which several judgments can figure in one emotion, and how emotion is tied up with irrational action (Vogt 2006).

Next to anger, Seneca pays most attention to fear and grief, emotions that tend to dominate human life due to human mortality (NQ 6.1.1-4.2; 32.1-12; on grief, see esp. Letters 26, 63, 77). Fear of death is paradoxical: It wants to preserve life, but it spoils life (6.32.9). It is one of the key tasks for the progressor to come to terms with death (Mann 2006; Letters 1.2 and 4.3-9). Fear makes us “lose our minds,” and thus literally removes rationality (NQ 6.29). It is through changing our views regarding the presumed badness of death that we can overcome fear and grief. Death is a natural event, and understanding death is part of the study of nature. We fear most what we do not understand; knowledge cures fear (NQ 6.3.4).

In On Peace of Mind 15.1, Seneca raises an interesting question. Why does the ideal agent not deplore vice, and so feel in some way bad about it? This question bears on a key aspect of the Stoic theory. Although there are four generic emotions, there are only three rational feelings; they replace pleasure, desire, and fear. There is no rational correlate to pain or distress, i.e., to those emotions in which we judge something bad to be present. Of course, the wise person will not judge that illness or loss of money is bad; she knows that only vice is bad. But why does she not make precisely this judgment—that vice is bad—in such a way that an affective stance of ‘rational deploring’ goes along with it? Seneca gives an answer that is in agreement with the fundamental Stoic claim that virtue benefits. The sage puts on a smile, rather than being saddened, because his cheerfulness gives hope. This reply, brief as it is, perhaps contains the core of an argument relevant to the Stoic stance on (what we call) the ‘negative moral emotions’. Part of this argument might be that virtue does not allow for rational negative affective responses, since such responses would not benefit.

In his discussion of how the virtuous person responds to weaknesses in others, Seneca extends the Stoic spectrum of rational feelings to include mercy (clementia). Seneca's treatise On Mercy has puzzled historians: by praising the goodness of the young Nero as Emperor—his mercy, as opposed to cruelty, severity, and pity—Seneca creates the prototype of “advice to princes” literature (see Long 2003). We cannot here enter into the question of whether Seneca chooses to ignore or did not know of the murder Nero had recently committed. What matters from the point of view of philosophical thought on the emotions is that, in exploring mercy, Seneca devises a rational response to human failings that goes along with beneficial action.

4. Virtue

4.1 Appropriate and Correct Action

The Stoic distinction between valuable and good things is at the center of Seneca's Letters. So-called preferred indifferents—health, wealth, and so on—have value (their opposites, dispreferred indifferents, have disvalue). But only virtue is good. Again and again, Seneca discusses how health and wealth do not contribute to our happiness. Seneca approaches this issue not as an academic puzzle, as if we needed to be compelled by intricate proof to accept this point. He speaks very directly to his readers, and his examples grip us moderns as much as they gripped his contemporaries. We tend to think that life would be better if only we did not have to travel for the lowest fare, in the most uncomfortable fashion; we are disheartened when our provisions for dinner are no better than stale bread. By addressing these very concrete situations, Seneca keeps hammering home the core claim of Stoic ethics: that virtue alone is sufficient for happiness, and nothing else even makes a contribution.

A related and equally important aspect of Stoic ethics is the distinction between appropriate and correct action. Appropriate action takes indifferents adequately into account. Both fools and the wise can act appropriately. But only the wise act perfectly appropriately, or correctly: their action is based on their perfect deliberation, and reflects the overall consistency of their soul. Seneca explains matters in precisely this fashion: while we should take indifferents (health, illness, wealth, poverty, etc.) judiciously into account, as things of value or disvalue to us, the good does not reside in getting or avoiding them. What is good is that I choose well (Letter 92.11-12). In response to the question ‘What is virtue?’, Seneca says “a true and immovable judgment” (Letter 71.32; tr. Inwood). Attributing any real importance to indifferents, Seneca argues, is like preferring, among two good men, the one with the fancy haircut (Letter 66.25).

In appropriate action, the agent takes things of value into account. This, however, does not happen in the abstract—she does not weigh the value of wealth against the value of health in a general fashion. Rather, she thinks about the way in which a specific situation and the courses of action available in it involve indifferents—for example, putting on the appropriate clothes for a given occasion (Letter 92.11). Since the features of the situation in which one acts thus matter to appropriate action, the Stoics apparently wrote treatises (now lost) in which they discussed at length how this or that feature may bear on what one should be doing (Sedley 2001). Seneca's Letters 94 and 95 seem to be examples of this kind of treatise.

Since Kidd (1978), these letters have been read with a view to the question of whether rules figure in Stoic ethics (for a discussion of the letters that is not framed by this question, see I. Hadot 1969, 8-9). This question, in turn, is relevant to our interpretation of the Stoic conception of law. The Stoics have long been considered the ancestors of the natural law tradition (Striker 1987). If the Stoics formulate rule-like precepts, then perhaps this means that the law, as the Stoics understand it, consists of a set of laws.

In Letters 94 and 95, Seneca discusses two notions, praecepta and decreta, usually translated as ‘precepts’ and ‘principles’. The topic of Seneca's discussion is this. If we seek a good life by studying philosophy, do we need to study only decreta, or also praecepta? According to the first position, the only thing needed to achieve virtue is to immerse oneself in the core tenets of Stoic philosophy. It is these that Seneca calls decreta; decreta thus are not practical principles or rules. They are principles of philosophy, in the sense of being the most abstract and fundamental teachings of the Stoics.

According to the second position, which Seneca seems to endorse, studying the first principles of Stoic philosophy is not sufficient; we should also think in detail about the demands that specific situations in life might make on us (and so, we should study praecepta relating to them). It may seem that these lower-level considerations involve rules: in such-and-such a situation, one should act in such-and-such a way (Annas 1993, 98-105; Mitsis 2001). However, it is not clear whether Seneca indeed envisages such rules. As students of virtue, we will benefit from thinking our way through a variety of situations that one might encounter in life, contemplating how the different features of these situations matter to appropriate action, and so developing a sharpened sense of the particular value of the various things that do have value or disvalue for a human being. Seneca's ‘case studies’ (e.g., a previously married wife should be treated differently from a previously unmarried wife) perhaps only hone the students' appreciation for the kinds of issues that matter to appropriate action, where different things of value or disvalue impinge case by case, rather than providing them with rules for specific situations. Further, Seneca envisages an advisor who reminds us of insights such as ‘money does not bring happiness’. Such almost proverbial sayings, however, do not appear to be rules. Finally, the advisor is someone who can come up with specific advice for a given occasion, such as ‘walk in such-and-such a way’ (see On Favors 15.2; Inwood 2005 [4]; Vogt 2007, 189-198). As Seneca emphasizes in Letter 71.1, advice is adjusted to situations, and situations are in flux. If one needs advice, one is not asking to be told the correct rule to cover the situation, one is asking how to balance various considerations.

4.2 Benefiting Others

Although the Stoics are, with respect to the good, most famous for the claim that only virtue is good, they define the good as benefit. Seneca agrees with the early Stoic view that the good benefits. As we have seen, Seneca thinks that both public life and philosophy are good forms of life, if conducted right, precisely because both are of benefit to others. When discussing the benefit that a philosophical life brings to others, he claims that the virtuous person's life is beneficial even if she performs no public function whatsoever. Her gait, her silent persistence, and the expression of her eyes benefit. Just as some medication works merely through its smell, virtue has its good effects even from a distance (On Peace of Mind 4.6-7).

Seneca devotes an entire treatise to the question of how one should benefit others, and how one should receive benefits (On Favors; lat. De beneficiis). He analyses reciprocal relationships of giving and receiving favors, which characterize social practices in ancient societies, in terms of the Stoic thesis that only virtue benefits. This thesis is considered paradoxical. Does it not seem that loans, offices, houses, and so on, are the kinds of things that people want to receive, and the giving of which counts as benefaction? Seneca's discussion of giving and receiving favors aims to elucidate why this is not so—why, even in a society in which the giving and receiving of favors is highly important, it is true that only virtue benefits. In his analysis, it is not the transfer of an object that is justly called a beneficium. Rather, the favor consists in the state of mind of the giver—that he wants to benefit us. Seneca's discussion of favors is thus another place in his philosophy where “the will” and “willing” are prominent. What we might call the intention to benefit, and the intention to gratefully repay the favor, are the relevant actions of giving and receiving correctly. It is this act of willing which counts as a correct action (recte factum) (5.6; cf. 5.1; 6.1; 7.1; 31.1; Inwood, 2005 [3]; cf. Letter 81.10-13).

4.3 The Good

In Letter 120, Seneca explains how we arrive at the notion of the good. This question is a much-discussed topic in Stoic ethics. The Stoics hold that, in the process of growing up, human beings acquire rationality, which importantly consists in acquiring preconceptions (prolêpseis). Once a human being has reason in this minimal sense, she can improve and eventually perfect her rationality. As part of this process she comes to acquire the concept of the good. The transitional moment in which a human being finally and fully recognizes that only virtue (consistency) is good is momentous: this is the moment in which a fool becomes a wise person (Cicero, De fin. 3.20-22). At that point, a human being acquires what we might call the scientific concept of the good. She now masters a concept of the good that gets things right—once one has this concept, one is not going to fall back on misguided ideas such as ‘money brings happiness’. But does it not seem that we have a notion of the good before, eventually, turning into wise people, if we do? We here must distinguish two notions. First, human beings have a preconception of the good—we call things good before understanding any of the truths of Stoic philosophy. But second, we might, as progressors, also come to see the point of the Stoic claim that only virtue is good, without yet being fully able to consistently appreciate its truth in our lives. As we have seen, it is this condition of the progressor that Seneca has in mind in many of his writings.

Letter 120 seems to contribute to Stoic thought about the acquisition of the concept of the good in precisely this fashion. Unlike Cicero, Seneca does not discuss the transitional moment in which an agent becomes wise. Rather, he discusses how we come to understand what the Stoics are talking about when they say that only virtue is good (supposing that neither we nor those we live with are virtuous). When reading about great deeds, we magnify the virtuous features of the agents, and minimize their negative features (Inwood, 2005 [10]). By these and similar cognitive operations, we arrive at an understanding of what virtue would actually be. This realization enables us to see virtue's goodness without having encountered a real-life instance of virtue (for the Stoics, the fully wise are rarely or never encountered).

5. Physics and Theology

5.1 The Practical Side of Natural Philosophy

The project of the Natural Questions is to “take measure of God” (1.17), to “walk through the universe” (mundum circuire; 3.1), to celebrate the works of the gods (3.5), and to free us from fear induced by natural events (6.4). The study of clouds or thunderstorms is interesting because we want to understand how clouds or thunderstorms arise—but more than that, it must be salutary (2.59.2), and it helps us achieve human excellence (3.10-18) (Inwood, 2005 [8]; on the relationship of ethics and physics, cf. I. Hadot, 1969, 111-117). How could a human being not investigate nature, knowing that ‘all this’—the world—pertains to him (ad se pertinere; Natural Questions 1.13)? Seneca's cosmopolitanism is integral to the way he leads his readers into the study of nature. Only when we view our local lives from the perspective of the stars do we come to see the insignificance of riches, borders, and so on (NQ 1.9-13). In an influential phrase, Pierre Hadot calls this perspective the ‘view from above’ (1995)—a view that liberates us insofar as we come to see many seemingly important issues as mere trifles. We need the study of nature in order to reach the kind of distance from our everyday concerns that eventually frees us from unreasonable concern for them. And we investigate nature as something that we are a part of. In agreement with early Stoic thought about the universe as a large living being with parts, Seneca thinks that we are rightly motivated to study nature—nature is the large entity of which we are parts. Natural philosophy thus is necessary for fully engaging with one's life. We might note that Seneca contrasts the study of nature with the study of history; for him, it is the seemingly more theoretical field of physics that has greater practical value. It is better to praise the gods than to praise the conquests of Philipp or Alexander (NQ 3.5). Further, the study of nature is particularly valuable because it is the study of what should happen (quid faciendum sit), as opposed to the study of what in fact did happen (quid factum) (NQ 3.7).

5.2 The Natural Law

The Stoics are considered ancestors of the natural law tradition. The standard epithet of the law, in early Stoicism, is ‘common’ (koinos), not ‘natural’. Seneca, however, characterizes laws or the law as natural and talks of the lex naturae (“law of nature”). Early Stoic thought about the law is partly rooted in the theory of appropriate action, and partly in a physical account of how reason—Zeus—pervades the world.

It is this physical notion of the law that is most prominent in Seneca. In his discussion of earthquakes and human fear, Seneca points out that we err by assuming that in some places, there is no danger of earthquakes; all places are subject to the same law (lex) (6.1.12). In another context, Seneca points out that the natural laws (iura) govern events under the earth as much as above (3.16.4). The world is constituted so that everything that is going to happen, including the conflagration of the world when it comes to an end, is from the very beginning part of it. Natural events like earthquakes, and in fact all events, help nature go through with the natural statutes (naturae constituta) (3.29.4). Since nature (or Zeus) decided in the beginning what was going to happen, everything is easy for nature (3.30.1). The study of nature aims at accepting facts of nature, first and foremost the fact that human beings are mortal. Seneca refers to the necessity of death as a natural law (NQ 6.32.12: mors naturae lex est). Death is a “done deal” already at conception (On Peace of Mind 11.6; cf. NQ 2.59.6). It is the task of science to understand why death need not be feared, that the philosophical life is particularly indispensable because it prepares us for death, and that the kinds of death that we are prone to fear particularly, such as death through an earthquake, are really not much different from more usual kinds of death. To be free according to the law of nature is to be prepared to die any minute (3.16). That we are all equals in death reflects the justice of nature (6.1.8).

A theme that is equally present in Seneca's natural philosophy and in his therapeutic practice is time. Book 3 of the Natural Questions is entitled On the waters of the earth and begins with reflections on the enormous time which the task of natural philosophy may consume; on time that has been wasted with worldly concerns; and the claim that it can be regained if we make diligent use of the present. The fact that human life is finite is thus present from the very first lines of the book. Seneca then turns to the way in which the world's life-cycle is as finite as that of a human being. Just as a human foetus already contains the seed of its death, the beginnings of the world contain its end (3.28.2-3). It is precisely for this reason that things are easy for nature. Its death does not, as it were, come as a surprise—nature is well-prepared. Nature does what it initially determined; nothing in nature's doings is ad hoc (3.30.1). Seneca points to examples: Look at the way the waves roll onto the beaches; the oceans are trained in how to flood the earth (3.30.2). The world's preparedness for its death seems to be the perfect analogue of how, for Seneca, we ought to spend our lives. In Letter 12.6-8, Seneca says that everything, light and darkness, is contained in a single day. To use the present well is to be aware of this completeness. More days, and months, and years, will (or at least may) make up our lives. But we should not think of them as stretching out into the future; rather, they are concentric circles surrounding the day which, right now, is present. And since even this very day stretches out, from its beginning to its end, we can appreciate it as containing everything—there can be more such days, but they will be more of the same. Thus, every such day, if it is lived well, we can be fully prepared to die.

5.3 God

The study of nature—of the heavens—eventually leads to knowledge of God (or at least, to the beginnings of such an understanding; NQ 1.13). Seneca characterizes God in a number of ways: (i) God is everything one sees and everything one does not see. Nothing greater than his magnitude is conceivable (magnitudo […] qua nihil maius cogitari potest); he alone is everything—he keeps together his work from the inside and the outside (NQ 1.13). (ii) God is completely soul (animus) and reason (ratio) (1.14), or, as Seneca puts it in Letter 65.12, “reason in action” (ratio faciens). (iii) Like earlier Stoics, Seneca emphasizes that God (‘Jupiter’) can be referred to by many names: fate, the cause of causes (causa causarum), providence, nature, universe (NQ 2.45.2). (iv) Seneca agrees with the orthodox Stoic view that God is corporeal. God is a part of the world (pars mundi; NQ 7.30.4). At the same time, he emphasizes that it is in thought that we have to see God—he flees human eyes. The study of God is thus not the study of a visible entity (7.30.3-5). (v) God, or nature, is beneficial (5.18.13-15).

In his discussions of thunder and lighting, Seneca explains that, while every natural event is a sign, we should not think of God busying himself with sending us, as it were, a sign at every particular occasion. Rather, we should explain natural events by seeking out their natural causes, and at the same time understand that the order of things as a whole is established by God. Since there is this order, divination is possible (NQ 2.32.1-4). Fate is the necessity of all events and actions, which no power can disrupt (2.36). Prayer cannot change fate; but since the gods have left some things unresolved, prayer can be effective (2.37.2).

Like other ancient philosophers, Seneca discusses virtue as the ideal of “becoming like God.” This is, however, not an otherworldly ideal—rather, it is the ideal of perfecting our rationality, as agents living in this world (Russell 2004). We are a part of God; to perfect our reason is to achieve the perfect rationality of divinity. In agreement with earlier Stoics, Seneca thinks that the virtuous man is an equal to the gods (Letter 92.30-31; 87.19). Seneca's natural philosophy and his theology are thus closely related to his ethics and philosophical psychology. Ultimately, he is concerned with how we can perfect our soul, and he pursues this question in a variety of ways—by discussing virtue, the soul, nature, and theology.


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cosmopolitanism | death | ethics: ancient | ethics: natural law tradition | Foucault, Michel | intentionality: in ancient philosophy | soul, ancient theories of | Stoicism