Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Fri May 21, 2004; substantive revision Mon Aug 27, 2007

Sense data are the alleged mind-dependent objects that we are directly aware of in perception, and that have exactly the properties they appear to have. For instance, sense data theorists say that, upon viewing a tomato in normal conditions, one forms an image of the tomato in one's mind. This image is red and round. The mental image is an example of a “sense datum.” Many philosophers have rejected the notion of sense data, either because they believe that perception gives us direct awareness of physical phenomena, rather than mere mental images, or because they believe that the mental phenomena involved in perception do not have the properties that appear to us (for instance, I might have a visual experience representing a red, round tomato, but my experience is not itself red or round). Defenders of sense data have argued, among other things, that sense data are required to explain such phenomena as perspectival variation, illusion, and hallucination. Critics of sense data have objected to the theory's commitment to mind-body dualism, the problems it raises for our knowledge of the external world, its difficulty in locating sense data in physical space, and its apparent commitment to the existence of objects with indeterminate properties.

1. What Are Sense Data?

1.1. The Standard Conception

On the most common conception, sense data (singular: “sense datum”) have three defining characteristics:

  1. Sense data are the kind of thing we are directly aware of in perception,
  2. Sense data are dependent on the mind, and
  3. Sense data have the properties that perceptually appear to us.

Each of those conditions calls for clarification.

First, condition (i): Everyone in the philosophy of perception agrees that perception makes us aware of something. Most hold that there is a distinction between the things perception makes us directly aware of, and the things it makes us indirectly aware of, where to be indirectly aware of something is, roughly, to be aware of it in a way that depends on the awareness of something else. There are at least two ways of further explicating this notion. One way, adopted by Jackson (1977, pp. 15-20), is to say that we perceive something indirectly if we perceive it by virtue of perceiving something else. For example, consider my perception of the table in front of me. I do not perceive all of the table; I can only see its outer surface, and indeed only the portion of that surface facing me. Yet we still say that I see the table. I count as seeing the table by virtue of seeing something else, namely, the facing surface of the table. Therefore, Jackson would say that I see the table only indirectly. Sense data, on this view, are things that one may perceive not by virtue of perceiving anything else.

Another way of distinguishing direct and indirect awareness is to say, roughly, that one has indirect awareness of x when one's awareness of x is caused by one's awareness of something else (see Huemer [2001, pp. 55-7] for a more spelled-out version of this approach). For instance, I might wish to determine the temperature of a pot of water indirectly, by means of a thermometer, rather than sticking my hand in the water. In such a case, I would first become aware of the reading on the thermometer, and this would cause me to be aware of the temperature of the water. Thus, my awareness of the water's temperature would be indirect. On this view, sense data would be things our awareness of which is not causally dependent on any other awareness.

Second, condition (ii): Sense data theorists believe that the things we are directly aware of in perception are dependent on the mind of the perceiver — they cannot exist unperceived. Such things have also sometimes been called “mental images,” “ideas,” “impressions,” “appearances,” or “percepts.”

Third, condition (iii): “The properties that perceptually appear to us” refers to the qualities we seem to perceive things around us to have. For instance, if I perceive a tomato, and it looks red and round to me, then redness and roundness are properties that perceptually appear to me. According to those who believe in sense data, there is in this case a thing that I am directly aware of, which is both red and round, and which depends on my mind for its existence. Condition (iii) holds true even if I am subject to a sensory illusion or hallucination. Thus, if the tomato is really green, but, due to some sort of color illusion, it looks red to me, then my sense datum is red, not green. Furthermore, if there is no tomato present in reality, but I am hallucinating a tomato, then I will be having a tomato-like sense datum.

Those who accept sense data believe that sense data exist whenever a person perceives anything, by any of the senses, and also whenever a person has an experience qualitatively like perceiving, such as a hallucination.

So construed, the sense data theory contrasts with two competing schools of thought in the philosophy of perception. First, direct realism holds that in perception, we are directly aware of physical phenomena and only physical phenomena — for example, a table, or a portion of a table's surface. Direct realists thus deny that there is anything satisfying both conditions (i) and (ii) above, and therefore deny that there are sense data. Direct realism itself comes in at least two varieties: a disjunctivist variety (McDowell 1994; Dancy 1995) and an intentionalist variety (Armstrong 1961; Searle 1983; Huemer 2001).

Second, the adverbial theory, in one version, holds that in perception, we are directly aware of a certain kind of mental state or occurrence, but that this mental state does not actually possess the properties that appear to us (Chisholm 1977, pp. 29-30). Adverbialists have been known to characterize this mental state in such terms as “being appeared to redly.” When a person is in the mental state of being appeared to redly, say the adverbialists, it does not follow that anything is actually red. Thus, adverbialists deny that there is anything satisfying all of conditions (i), (ii), and (iii), and therefore deny that there are sense data.

Those who accept sense data believe that sense data exist whenever a person perceives anything, by any of the senses, and also whenever a person has an experience qualitatively like perceiving, such as a hallucination.

1.2. Variations

The term “sense data” has not always been used in the sense described above. Indeed, when the term was first introduced by early 20th-century philosophers such as H. H. Price, G. E. Moore, and Bertrand Russell, it was intended only to denote that which we are directly aware of in perception. The term's meaning was supposed to be neutral between direct and indirect realist theories of perception, so that it was not to be assumed either that sense data must by definition be mind-dependent or that they must be mind-independent (Russell 1997, p. 12; Moore 1953, p. 30). Thus, G.E. Moore debated with himself, inconclusively, about whether “sense data” were or were not typically parts of the surfaces of physical objects. Broad (1925) thought sense data were neither mental nor physical. And more recently, Bermúdez (2000) has defended what he calls a sense data theory, according to which the surfaces of visually perceived physical objects are “sense data.”

However, those who have used the term “sense data” have so frequently concluded that what we are directly aware of in perception is, in fact, dependent on the mind that the term is now usually understood to import an assumption of mind-dependence.

Sense data theorists have also differed over exactly how to describe the mind's relation to its sense data. Most sense data theorists have said that we perceive sense data or, in the case of visual sense data, that we literally see them (Jackson 1977; Ayer 1958; O'Shaughnessy 2003). Others say only that we are aware of, are acquainted with, or simply sense sense data (Robinson 1994; Price 1950, pp. 3-4), perhaps with the thought that the terms “perceive”, “see,” and the like should be reserved for our relation to the physical objects that cause our sense data.

In the remainder of this article, sense data are understood in the sense articulated in section 1.1, and the Sense Data Theory is understood simply as the theory that there are such things, that is, that in perception one is directly aware of mind-dependent things that have the properties that perceptually appear to us.

2. Arguments for Sense Data

The sense data theory was very popular, perhaps the orthodox view in the philosophy of perception, in the early twentieth century. The theory was advanced by Russell (1997); Broad (1925); Price (1950); and Ayer (1956). Moore (1953, pp. 40-44) described the theory as “the accepted view,” though he neither endorsed nor rejected the theory himself. (Though Moore uses the term “sense data,” he does not suppose that what he calls “sense data” must be mental.) Since the mid-twentieth century, the view's popularity greatly declined, though several philosophers have continued to defend it (Jackson 1977; Robinson 1994; Casullo 1987; Garcia-Carpintero 2001; O'Shaughnessy 2003).

Why has this theory been popular? A variety of arguments have been given for recognizing sense data:

2.1. The Argument from Perspectival Variation

Perspectival variation is the kind of variation in one's sensory experiences that normally attends changes in one's spatial or other physical relationship to the physical objects one is observing. Perspectival variation, in this sense, is ubiquitous. For instance, suppose you are viewing a table. If you move closer to or farther from the table, your sensory experience changes. If you move laterally relative to the table, your sensory experience will change in another way (Russell 1997, pp. 8-11). In a famous passage, Hume sought to use this phenomenon to show that what we are immediately aware of in perception cannot be the real, external objects, but must instead be only images in the mind:

The table which we see seems to diminish as we remove farther from it. But the real table, which exists independent of us, suffers no alteration. It was, therefore, nothing but its image which was present to the mind. These are the obvious dictates of reason, and no man who reflects ever doubted that the existences which we consider when we say this house and that tree are nothing but perceptions in the mind, and fleeting copies or representations of other existences which remain uniform and independent. (Hume 1758, section XII.1; emphasis Hume's; punctuation has been modernized)

This argument and others like it are commonly characterized as versions of “the argument from illusion,” though that label can be misleading, since the phenomenon Hume appeals to in the passage above is one of perspectival variation rather than illusion. In the present article, I distinguish the argument from perspectival variation from the argument from illusion proper; illusions will be discussed in the following section.

Though Hume does not use the term “sense data,” the mental images for which he contends are what 20th-century thinkers labeled “sense data.” Here is one way of understanding Hume's argument:

  1. In the phenomenon of perspectival variation, the thing we are directly aware of appears to change — for instance, its apparent size or shape changes.
  2. The real, external object does not change at this time.
  3. Therefore, the thing we are directly aware of is not the real, external object.

Once we have agreed that the immediate object of awareness is not the real, external object, we are then meant to infer that it must be some sort of image of the physical object in our minds, which we perhaps confused with the physical object.

As Reid (1983, pp. 178-9) observes, the argument from (1) and (2) to (3) is invalid, since the first premise speaks of apparent change, whereas the second premise concerns actual change. There is no contradiction in maintaining that the external object appears to change but does not in fact change.

The argument could be made logically valid by rendering it like so:

  1. In the phenomenon of perspectival variation, the thing we are directly aware of changes.
  2. The real, external object does not change at this time.
  3. Therefore, the thing we are directly aware of is not the real, external object.

Now critics of the argument will charge that premise (4) is false or question-begging (Austin 1962, p. 30; Jackson 1977, pp. 107-8; Huemer 2001, p. 125) — it is at least as natural to say that the thing we are directly aware of (namely, the physical object) merely appears to change without actually changing. Perhaps this is mistaken, but Hume has given no independent reason for rejecting this initially plausible description of the situation. Sense data theorists have often held it to be intuitively obvious that when we are directly, perceptually aware of something, that thing must have the properties that it appears to have (Price 1950, p. 3; Robinson 1994, p. 32; Martin 2000, pp. 218-19). Opponents of sense data have typically found this assumption unmotivated; J. L. Austin, the best-known critic of the argument from illusion and related arguments for sense data, is a case in point:

If, to take a rather different case, a church were cunningly camouflaged so that it looked like a barn, how could any serious question be raised about what we see when we look at it? We see, of course, a church that now looks like a barn. We do not see an immaterial barn, an immaterial church, or an immaterial anything else. (1962, p. 30; emphasis Austin's)

Austin's point seems to be that, just as a church can merely look like a barn without there being anything that is a barn, the table that we see in Hume's example may merely seem to get smaller, without there being anything that actually gets smaller.

Here is an alternate way of making out the argument from perspectival variation:

  1. An experience counts as awareness of x only if the properties of the experience covary with certain of the properties of x, so that when x changes, the experience changes, and when x does not change, the experience does not change.
  2. In the phenomenon of perspectival variation, our sensory experience changes, but the real, external object does not change.
  3. Therefore, our sensory experience does not count as awareness of the real, external object.

Modifications might be made to this argument to make it more plausible: the first premise might be put in counterfactual terms, rather than in terms of actual changes; “direct awareness” might replace “awareness”; and one might specify more carefully in what respects the properties of experience must covary with those of the object of awareness. Something like this argument may be what Hume had in mind, if only implicitly.

Critics of this version of the argument may question either premise. Thomas Reid seems to deny premise (8), arguing that the external object changes in respect of certain relational properties. For instance, when one moves farther away from a table, the table's angular size relative to one's own position decreases, where this is the size of the angle created by connecting the extremities of the table to the point in space from which the table is viewed. Though this property is relational, the relationship involved is a purely physical one, holding between physical things such as the table and the eye, so it might be said that there is no need to introduce mind-dependent sense data as objects of awareness (Reid 1983, pp. 176-8; Huemer 2001, pp. 120-23; Cornman 1975, pp. 58-9).

2.2. The Argument from Illusion

The Argument from Illusion is the best-known and most historically influential argument for the existence of sense data. An illusion is a case in which one perceives an object, but the object is not the way it appears in some respects. For instance, when one views a straight stick half-submerged in water, the stick may appear bent. Since it is not in fact bent, this is an illusion. Some philosophers have argued that the possibility of such sensory illusions shows that what we are directly aware of in perception is never the real, physical object (Ayer 1963, pp. 3-11). Using the bent-stick illusion as an example, one might argue:

  1. When viewing a straight stick half-submerged in water, one is directly aware of something bent.
  2. No relevant physical thing is bent in this situation.
  3. Therefore, in this situation, one is directly aware of something non-physical.
  4. What one is directly aware of in this situation is the same kind of thing that one is directly aware of in normal, non-illusory perception.
  5. Therefore, in normal perception, one is directly aware of non-physical things.

A background assumption is that there is only one stick-like thing that one sees in the example, and that thing is either an actual, physical stick, or a sense datum of a stick. The argument concludes that it is not the physical stick, so it must be a sense datum.

Step (4) seems plausible, since one can imagine first perceiving the stick normally, and then moving it into the water. It would be implausible to maintain that one is seeing the physical stick up to the moment when it touches the water, at which point the object of one's awareness suddenly changes to a sense datum.

Opponents of sense data object to premise (1) on grounds similar to those considered in section 2.1: namely, it may be that what one is directly aware of merely appears bent but is not in fact bent. Sense data theorists and their opponents, again, disagree over whether an object of direct awareness must have exactly the features it appears to have.

2.3. The Argument from Fallibility

Having been taken to task by Austin (1962) over the argument from illusion, A. J. Ayer sought to defend sense data by another argument (though Ayer seems to think it is the same argument):

What the argument from illusion . . . does clearly establish is . . . that there is not a perfect coincidence between appearance and reality. It shows that if we were always to take appearances as it were at their face value we should sometimes go wrong and, what is important here, that we should go wrong predictively. When we misidentify an object, or misjudge its properties, or misperceive its status, taking it for example to be a physical solid when it is in fact an image, we issue a draft on our further experiences which they fail to honour. But this again implies that our judgements of perception are, in my sense, inferential. (Ayer 1967, p. 129)

By “judgements of perception,” Ayer means beliefs about the physical world that express what we seem to perceive to be the case; for instance, when I see a chair, I normally make the “perceptual judgement” that a physical chair is present. Ayer's central premise seems to be that all such beliefs about the physical world are fallible; somehow, this is supposed to force the conclusion that such beliefs are inferential. That, in turn, is supposed to support the sense data theory.

Perhaps Ayer's implicit reasoning is this:

  1. If one is directly aware of something, then one can have non-inferential knowledge of facts about it. (Premise.)
  2. If one knows non-inferentially that p, then one's belief that p is infallible. (Premise.)
  3. No belief about the physical world can be infallible. (Established by the possibility of illusion, hallucination, etc.)
  4. Therefore, no one can have non-inferential knowledge about the physical world. (From 2, 3.)
  5. Therefore, no one is directly aware of anything physical. (From 1, 4.)

Conclusion (5) does not suffice to establish the existence of sense data, but by ruling out the competing direct realist theory, it would take Ayer a considerable distance towards vindicating the sense data theory. If beliefs about sense data could plausibly be claimed to be infallible, and if one assumes a foundationalist epistemology, beliefs about sense data would be prime candidates for constituting non-inferential knowledge. This would make sense data very plausible candidates for objects of direct awareness.

Unfortunately, Ayer gives no motivation for premise (2), which is rejected by most contemporary foundationalists (Audi 1983; Alston 1976; Huemer 2001, pp. 100-101).

2.4. The Argument from Hallucination

A hallucination is a case in which one has an experience qualitatively like perception, but there is no external object that one is perceiving. For instance, a large dose of LSD might cause me to have an experience of seeming to see a pink rat on this table, where there is in reality nothing pink-rat-like.

Some believe that the possibility of hallucinations shows that even normal perception always involves sense data (Robinson 1994, pp. 151-62; Jackson 1977, pp. 50ff.). Imagine two people, Sally and Sam, each of whom is having an experience of seeming to see a pineapple. Sally is simply perceiving a pineapple in the normal way. Sam, however, is having an incredibly realistic hallucination of a pineapple, induced by brain scientists who have sophisticated technology for electrically stimulating Sam's brain. And suppose, as is theoretically possible, that the brain state causally relevant to Sally's visual experience is the same as the brain state causally relevant to Sam's visual experience. I will call this brain state B. Sam would be unable to distinguish his experience from a normal perception of a pineapple.

In this scenario, what is Sam directly aware of? Surely not a physical pineapple, since no physical pineapple is present. It seems, then, that he must be aware of a mere mental image of a pineapple. This mental image is caused by brain state B.

Now, what about Sally? Sally's brain state was caused in a different way from Sam's — Sally's was caused by a real pineapple, whereas Sam's was caused by the brain scientists. But that does not change the fact that Sally is now in the same brain state as Sam. We have already said that in Sam, brain state B caused a mental image of a pineapple. Therefore, it seems that if someone else were to have state B, it would also cause a mental image of a pineapple for them. Therefore, it seems that Sally must also be having a mental image of a pineapple, since she is in state B. Therefore, normal perception involves sense data, just as hallucination does. This argument relies on the principle that, if a causal chain of events leads to some effect, E, then any series of events that duplicates the last member of the causal chain will also produce E, regardless of whether the earlier members of the chain are duplicated. As long as Sally and Sam get into the same brain state, regardless of how they got there, both should experience whatever effects result from that brain state.

One way for a critic of sense data to respond to this argument would be to deny that state B causes Sam to have a mental object of awareness. According to the intentionalist account of perception, what Sam has is a mental state that falsely represents there to be a pineapple. Sally also has a mental state that represents there to be a pineapple, though in her case the representation is true. It may be held that Sam's mental state has no object of awareness since it is entirely false, whereas Sally's mental state has the physical pineapple as its object of awareness. Thus, in neither case must we posit a mental object of awareness, as in the sense data theory (Huemer 2001, pp. 127-8).

2.5. The Argument from Double Vision

Hume tells us that one can induce a case of double vision in oneself by merely pushing on one eye with one's finger. The possibility of double vision, he believes, shows that the immediate objects of awareness in perception are not the real, physical objects (Hume 1739, I.IV.ii; see also Broad 1925, pp. 187-8). The intended argument may be something like this:

  1. In a case of double vision, one sees two of something.
  2. There are not two (relevant) physical objects in this situation.
  3. Therefore, in a case of double vision, one sees something non-physical.

It would be implausible to maintain that one of the two things is a sense datum while the other is a real object. One reason this would be implausible is that there seems to be nothing relevantly different between the two things that could make one of them the “real” object. Therefore, one should conclude that both of the things one sees are sense data, rather than physical objects.

Critics might respond to this argument by claiming that in a case of double vision, rather than seeing two things, one sees a single thing that merely appears to be in each of two places (Huemer 2001, pp. 130-31).

2.6. The Time Gap Argument

There is always a time delay between any event in the physical world and our perception of it. This is most stark in the case of distant stars, which may burn out and yet still be “seen” thousands of years later, as the light continues to travel the distance between the star and us.

Imagine two individuals, Sally and Sam, who are each looking up at the night sky and “seeing” — or seeming to see — qualitatively similar stars. The star responsible for Sally's experience still exists. But the star ultimately responsible for Sam's experience ceased to exist 1000 years ago. Sam still “sees” it because the star was over 1000 light years away.

What is Sam directly aware of? Surely not an actual star, since no star presently exists in the place where he is looking. It must be a mere mental image of a star that he is directly aware of. Just as in the case of the argument from hallucination, we can now argue that since Sally is in the same brain state as Sam, she must also be having a mental image of a star. Therefore, sense data are involved in normal perception, even when the physical object responsible for the perception still exists. (Russell 1997, p. 33; Robinson 1994, pp. 80-84. Ayer [1956, pp. 102-4] discusses the argument without endorsing it.)

One might be tempted to say that what Sam sees is light rays, rather than a sense datum. But if the time gap shows that Sam does not directly perceive the star, it must also show that Sam does not directly perceive anything else outside of him either, since there is some time delay, however small, between any external event and Sam's corresponding sensory experience. Sam's visual experience as of a star will occur at least slightly later than the light rays strike his retina.

The natural reply for theorists wishing to resist sense data is to claim that one can “see into the past,” that is, that one's perceptual experiences may represent past states of affairs, or represent objects as they were at an earlier time (Cornman 1975, pp. 49-50; Huemer 2001, pp. 131-5).

2.7. The Illusoriness of Secondary Qualities

Many philosophers have held that the so-called “secondary qualities” — including such qualities as colors, tastes, smells, and sounds — do not exist in the external world, and that we must instead recognize them as properties of sense data. Consider the case of colors. A sense data theorist might argue:

  1. Everything we directly see has color.
  2. No physical thing is colored.
  3. Therefore, everything we directly see is non-physical.

(See Russell 1997, pp. 8-11; Jackson 1977, pp. 120-37; Robinson 1994, pp. 59-74.) The first premise seems obvious on its face. The second premise may seem unbelievable, but there are several arguments for it.

One of these arguments appeals to differences of color perception among people. Not only color blind people, but even people with normal vision differ among themselves slightly in how they perceive the colors of things (Hardin 1988, pp. 79-80; Byrne and Hilbert 1997, pp. 272-4). If colors are really out there, then there would have to be an answer to the question, Whose color perceptions are right? But not only is there no way of determining the answer to that; it seems hard to think of what facts might make one person's color perceptions more correct than another's. A related argument appeals to the differences of color perception among different species of animals (on these differences, see Jacobs 1981, chapter 5; Varela et al. 1993). Again, there seems no answer to the question of which species is right.

Another argument appeals to the fact that our experiences of color are caused by the wavelengths of light that physical objects reflect. Therefore, it seems that if colors belong to physical objects, they must be reducible to spectral reflectance distributions (as Byrne and Hilbert [1997] claim). However, there is in general no single spectral reflectance distribution, or even a single continuous range of spectral reflectance distributions, corresponding to each of the colors we see. Two objects with very different spectral reflectance distributions may both appear orange to us in normal lighting conditions, for example. (This phenomenon is known as “metamerism.”) Some believe that this fact precludes our reducing colors to spectral reflectance properties (Hardin 1988, pp. 7, 46-8).

Some philosophers hold that colors are dispositions to cause certain kinds of sensory experiences in us, rather than dispositions to reflect light in certain ways. But others object that this is not so, because colors ought to be properties that we directly perceive things to have, whereas we do not perceive things as having dispositions to cause experiences in us.

There is a good deal to be said about color, and a good deal yet to be resolved. The ultimate acceptability of premise (2) of the above argument will turn on whether some reductive theory of the nature of colors is defensible.

3. Objections to Sense Data

The sense data theory has been subjected to at least four main kinds of objection.

3.1. The Appeal to Physicalism

One reason the sense data theory has lost favor is no doubt the ascendance of physicalism in the philosophy of mind. Physicalists believe that the world is entirely physical; in particular, they believe that mental states either do not exist or are reducible to physical states, such as brain states. Physicalism is contrasted with dualism, which holds that mental states/events are distinct from physical states/events.

For various reasons, most contemporary thinkers in philosophy of mind embrace some form of physicalism and reject dualism. If they are right to do so, then there is a reason for rejecting sense data: namely, that sense data do not seem to fit into the physicalist picture (Martin [2000, p. 222] discusses but does not endorse this line of thought).

Sense data are supposed to have the properties that perceptually appear to us. But, in cases of normal perception, the only physical things that have the properties that perceptually appear to us are the external objects that the direct realists say we are perceiving; and in cases of illusions and hallucinations, there are no physical things that have the properties that perceptually appear to us. In particular, our brain states manifestly do not ordinarily have the properties that perceptually appear to us (except in the odd case that we happen to be looking at a brain). So sense data, if they exist, must be non-physical things.

O'Shaughnessy (2003, p. 186) seeks to avoid this consequence by distinguishing the place where a sense-datum is from the place where it “is given experientially to us”. Presumably he would draw a similar distinction for other properties of the sense-datum. His view seems to be that sense data might be identical with brain states, so that the sense data one experiences would in fact have the properties, such as shape, location, and perhaps color, of one's brain states, even though they are given experientially as having different and incompatible sets of properties. O'Shaughnessy does not explain what it is for a thing to be given experientially as having a property, but he seems to be abandoning the traditional doctrine that sense data literally have the features that perceptually appear to us.

A more perspicuous response to the argument from physicalism is to simply embrace mind-body dualism (Jackson 1982).

3.2. Epistemological Objections

At least three sorts of epistemological objections to the sense data theory have been raised. The first and most common charge is that the sense data theory leaves us vulnerable to external world skepticism. If we are only ever directly aware of our own sense data and other nonphysical phenomena, it is said, then it is unclear what reason we have for believing anything physical exists. Sense data theorists will generally admit that it is logically possible that someone should have exactly the same sense data that I, for example, have, and yet for there to be no physical objects around that person of the kind that I take myself to be surrounded by. Berkeley (1710, section 20) famously took this point to show that I have no good reason for believing in such physical objects. However, as Jackson (1977, pp. 141-2) observes, the point really shows only that we cannot validly deduce the existence of physical things from facts about our sense data; it remains open that we might infer the existence of physical things non-demonstratively. To rule this out, one may appeal to Hume's (1758, XII.1) skeptical argument, according to which all non-demonstrative reasoning proceeds by induction, and all inductive reasoning consists in generalizing from past experience. On this view, in order to non-demonstratively infer any conclusion about physical objects, one must first have past experience of physical objects from which one might draw generalizations. If, as the sense data theory holds, one's immediate experience only ever concerns sense data, then one's inductive inferences can only draw generalizations about sense data.

Sense data theorists can respond to this skeptical challenge by proposing that our beliefs about the physical world are justified by inference to the best explanation (Jackson 1977, pp. 142-5; Russell 1997, pp. 22-4). Consider an analogy: we know of the existence of molecules, despite never having directly observed a molecule, because the theory that posits molecules provides the best explanation for certain other things we know about the behavior of macroscopic bodies. Similarly, perhaps we know of the existence of physical objects in general, despite never having directly observed one, because the theory that posits physical objects provides the best explanation for other things that we know about the behavior of sense data.

A second broadly epistemological objection claims that the sense data theorist cannot account for our having the concept of physical objects, or for our ability to conceive of the properties of physical objects. This is because, according to the sense data theory, physical objects in principle cannot be directly observed in the way sense data can. Thus, while a sense datum may, for example, be red and round, all physical objects are invisible (they cannot be seen). It makes no sense to say that a color resembles something that is invisible, and similar arguments could be made for all other observable properties besides color; therefore, physical objects cannot in principle resemble sense data. Since we are supposedly never directly aware of physical objects or their properties, and they cannot resemble the things we are directly aware of, it is argued that we could have no conception of the nature of physical objects (Berkeley 1710, sections 8-10; Searle 1983, pp. 59-60).

Sense data theorists will reply first by denying that on their view physical objects are “invisible.” Rather, their view is that what it is to see a physical object is to have a sense datum representing that object, so physical objects are, on their view, often seen (O'Shaughnessy 2003, pp. 175, 178-9). Second, the objection of the preceding paragraph gains undeserved plausibility from the use of the word “resemble.” The statement that A resembles B may be taken to mean that A looks like B. Sense data theorists are not committed to claiming that sense data look like physical objects. They are, however, committed to claiming that sense data have at least some of the properties that physical objects typically have. In particular, most sense data theorists will agree that physical objects, like sense data, have shapes, though they will typically deny that physical objects have colors or other secondary qualities (Locke 1689, II.viii; Jackson 1977, 120-37). Pace Berkeley, it is not unintelligible to speak of an object one is directly aware of having the same shape as an object one cannot be directly aware of. No one thinks, for example, that because an individual H2O molecule cannot be seen, it is therefore unintelligible to speak of the molecule's shape.

A third epistemological objection derives from Wilfrid Sellars (2000), who questions the traditional account of foundational empirical knowledge (knowledge that comes immediately from experience). The epistemological view traditionally taken by sense data theorists has been roughly along these lines (Russell 1997):

  1. First, one has a sense datum.
  2. When one has a sense datum, one is necessarily immediately and infallibly aware of that sense datum. This immediate awareness is known as “sensing” or “being acquainted with” the sense datum.
  3. By virtue of this acquaintance, one is in a position to know that one has a sense datum of the kind that one in fact has.
  4. One then makes inferences about the physical world to explain the series of sense data that one has.

The first epistemological objection discussed above questions step (d). Sellars, however, questions step (c). He poses a dilemma for sense data theorists: either the immediate awareness of a sense datum mentioned in (b) and (c) is propositional in form (that is, it is the awareness that the sense datum has F, where F is some property), or it is non-propositional. If the awareness is propositional, says Sellars, then it requires the application of concepts. For instance, to be aware that a sense datum is red, one must first have the concept of redness. This is problematic, because it is generally thought that perceptual awareness ought to precede and be independent of concepts. On the other hand, if the awareness in step (b) is non-propositional, then it cannot give one the knowledge posited in step (c), because that knowledge is propositional — it involves the knowledge that one's sense datum is of a certain kind — and a non-propositional state cannot support a proposition (Sellars 2000, part I).

One reply on behalf of the sense data theorist is to note that Sellars' dilemma is not particularly directed at the sense data theory, despite that Sellars formulates it in those terms. That is, if Sellars' argument is compelling, a version of it would apply equally well to direct realist, idealist, or adverbial theories of perception. Sellars' real objection is to the idea of any form of direct awareness providing us with knowledge, whether it be awareness of sense data, physical objects, states of being appeared to, or anything else. Sellars' intended solution to the problem seems to lie in the direction of a coherence theory of justification. But it is unclear why a sense data theorist could not equally appeal to considerations of coherence, despite that historically all or most sense data theorists have in fact been foundationalists.

A second reply, on behalf of the sense data foundationalist, is that Sellars has confused propositional awareness with conceptual awareness. One might enjoy an immediate awareness of a sense datum as having a certain specific shade of color for which one has no preexisting concept. The awareness would thus be non-conceptual but propositional: one is aware of the fact that a is F, where a is the sense datum and F is the unconceptualized property one senses it as having (Huemer [2001, pp. 71-7] takes a similar line, but adapted to a direct realist view).

3.3. Where Are Sense Data?

If sense data have the properties that perceptually appear to us, then among other things, visual sense data have sizes and shapes. If so, then they occupy space. It is therefore fair to ask where in space they are located. But there does not seem to be any plausible answer to this (Huemer 2001, pp. 149-68).

  1. One might propose that one's sense data are literally inside one's head. This view would probably seem plausible only if one identified sense data with brain states (as Russell [1927, p. 383] and O'Shaughnessy [2003, p. 186] do). But this is problematic since one's brain states do not generally have the properties that perceptually appear to one. The brain state involved in seeing a table, for example, is not table-shaped. Therefore, if one's sense datum is table-shaped, then the sense datum is not the brain state.
  2. One might propose that sense data are located wherever the physical objects causing them are. Thus, when I look at a table, my sense datum of a table is located right where the table is. But this view would have trouble assimilating the sense data supposedly involved in hallucinations. For this reason, the sense data theorist could probably be pushed to the following view.
  3. One might propose that sense data are located wherever they appear to be (this appears to be Jackson's view [1977, pp. 77-8, 102-3]). One problem with this view concerns experiences of non-existent locations. For instance, one might have a vivid dream about a fictional locale. If sense data are involved in illusions and hallucinations, then presumably something like them is also involved in dreams. But in this case, since the dreamt of place does not exist, one cannot say that the sense data are located there.

A further objection to both answers (2) and (3) is that they conflict with the special theory of relativity, since in some cases, they would require one's brain state to cause a sense datum to appear outside one's forward light cone, and the theory of relativity precludes causal relations with events so situated.

  1. Unable to find any plausible location for sense data in physical space, some philosophers have proposed that sense data occupy their own, separate space, sometimes called “phenomenal space” (Broad 1925, p. 181; Russell 1927, pp. 252-3; Price 1950, pp. 246-52; Smythies 2003). This view raises questions about how events in physical space can interact with those in phenomenal space, and it also conflicts with the theory of special relativity, which precludes the kind of separation between space and time that the doctrine of phenomenal space requires.

3.4. The Argument from Indeterminacy

As we have noted, sense data are supposed to have precisely the properties that are presented to us in perceptual experience. If one has an experience of seeming to see something red, then one's sense datum is red; equally importantly, if one is not having an experience of seeming to see something red, then one does not have a red sense datum.

A problem with this is raised by the observation that it is sometimes indeterminate what properties objects appear to us to have. To say that it is indeterminate what properties an object appears to have is to say that the object appears to instantiate some determinable, but there is no specific determinate falling under that determinable that it appears to instantiate. For example, an object might appear to fall within a certain range of colors, while there is no exact shade of color that it appears to have. Chisholm (1942) discusses a case in which one sees a speckled hen for a moment, but one is unable to say how many speckles one saw. Ayer (1963, pp. 124-5) implies that in such a case, there is no definite number of speckles that the sense datum had. Other, perhaps more convincing pieces of evidence for indeterminate appearances include our inability to say exactly how far away certain objects seem to be, our inability in some cases to say merely on the basis of appearances whether two objects are the same color, and our inability to read blurred or far-away words. Hardin (1985) discusses psychological experiments that seem to demonstrate indeterminacy of color and shape appearances: in some cases, subjects can visually detect the existence of an object without being able to make out any apparent color, can detect motion without awareness of the shape or color of the moving object, and so on.

If the apparent properties of objects of perception are sometimes indeterminate, then the sense data involved would have to be metaphysically indeterminate — that is, they would have to actually lack definite characteristics. This, however, is logically impossible — an object cannot be speckled but have no particular number of spots; an object cannot be colored but have no particular shade of color; and so on. This sort of problem only arises when, as sense data theorists do, one analyzes appearance in such a way that there must always be an actual object that has all and only the properties that appear to the subject (Huemer 2001, pp. 168-73; Armstrong 1993, pp. 218-21).

A related problem is raised by cases of inconsistent appearances, as in the case of the waterfall illusion. This is an illusion in which objects appear, at each moment during an extended time interval, to be moving, yet they never change their positions in the visual field. The sense data theory would seem to demand sense data with inconsistent properties in such a case (Hardin 1985, p. 489).

Sense data theorists may respond to these problems by denying, pace Ayer, that sense data have exactly the properties they appear to have. It is unclear how much of the original motivation for introducing “sense data” remains after the idea has been thus revised.


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Ayer, Alfred Jules | color | dualism | Hume, David | intentionality | knowledge: by acquaintance vs. description | mental imagery | mental representation | Moore, George Edward | perception: epistemological problems of | perception: the contents of | perception: the problem of | physicalism | qualia | Reid, Thomas