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Knowledge by Acquaintance vs. Description

First published Mon Jan 19, 2004; substantive revision Tue Apr 8, 2008

The terminology is most clearly associated with Bertrand Russell, but the distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description is arguably a critical component of many classical versions of foundationalism. Indeed, to describe something as known by acquaintance may just be another way of asserting that the object of acquaintance is given.

The Distinction:

As introduced by Russell, knowledge by description often seems to be just inferential knowledge. One knows something P inferentially when one's knowledge that P is based on (or is constituted by) the fact that one can legitimately infer P from some other different proposition E. But knowledge by description is also sometimes related to how we think of the subject matter of a knowledge claim. We might claim to know that Jack the Ripper was a vicious human being, but we can only think of and know the individual about whom the claim is made through a description of that individual — Jack the Ripper is that person (whoever he was) who committed certain atrocities in London around the turn of the last century. We have no “first hand” knowledge of the person about whom our judgment is made—we don't even have “first hand” knowledge that only one individual committed the murders or, for that matter, that the murders took place. Put another way, we are not directly acquainted with either the crimes or the perpetrator of those claims.

Because we lack this direct awareness of the truth makers for our claim about Jack the Ripper, the only way we could come to know the truth of our claim, the argument goes, is to infer it from some more basic sort of knowledge. Ultimately, on one version of foundationalism, all knowledge rest ultimately on knowledge made possible by direct awareness of truth makers.

Examples like the one I just used, and many of Russell's examples, are at best misleading. They trade on that commonplace distinction between things we know “first hand” and things we have only heard about or read about—in short the things that have been described to us. But our commonsense way of making the distinction soon goes by the wayside. Most philosophers wedded to some notion of knowledge by acquaintance end up rejecting the idea that we have knowledge by acquaintance even of bread-box sized objects, immediately before us, under ideal conditions of perception.

The test to determine with what we are acquainted is often reminiscent of the method Descartes recommended for finding secure foundations of knowledge—the method of doubt. If you are considering whether you know some thing or state of affairs by acquaintance, ask yourself whether you can conceive of being in this very epistemic situation when the object does not exist or the state of affairs does not obtain. If you can, you should reject the suggestion that you are directly acquainted with the items in question. Based on familiar arguments concerning the possibility of illusion, hallucination, and other sources of error, it seemed to most that we could rule out acquaintance with physical objects, past events, future states of affairs, other minds and facts that involve any of these as constituents. Consider, for example, physical objects. It seems to many that the very evidence I possess right now for supposing that there is a computer before me is perfectly consistent with the hypothesis that I am now having a vivid dream or a vivid hallucination. If that is right, then the evidence I possess cannot be described as my standing in some real relation of awareness or acquaintance to some constituent of the computer. Neither the computer, nor any of its constituents, need be present in that vivid dream or hallucination. In even the best of epistemic situations, then, we are not directly acquainted with physical objects or their constiuents.

Classical acquaintance theorists have taken the most promising candidates for facts with which we can be acquainted to be occurrent states of mind and (sometimes) properties and their relations. Interestingly enough, the acquaintance theorist is in a position to offer a quite different gloss on the traditional distinction between a priori knowledge of necessary truth and a posteriori knowledge of contingent truth. On the classical acquaintance theory, knowledge of both truths has the same source — acquaintance with facts. The distinction lies with the objects of acquaintance. So when I am acquainted with pain, that can give me knowledge of the contingent truth that I'm in pain. When I am acquainted with being red, being yellow and the relation of being darker than holding between them, that can give me knowledge of the necessary truth that red is darker than yellow.

There is another potentially confusing way of making the distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description. Knowledge by description is sometimes described as knowledge of truths. Knowledge by acquaintance, by contrast, involves a relation between a subject and some entity or feature of the world that is either a truth maker, or a constituent of a truth maker. So, for example, I might have knowledge by acquaintance of the pain I feel right now, but, of course, pain is not the kind of thing that can viewed as true or false. Knowledge of truths, in contrast to knowledge by acquaintance, is then characterized in such a way that it always involves the application of concepts. That, in turn, is sometimes supposed to introduce the possibility of error, a kind of error that knowledge by acquaintance cannot encounter because that knowledge does not involve characterizing or conceptualizing (describing) the objects with which we are acquainted.

It is misleading, I think, to view the distinction between knowledge by description and knowledge by acquaintance as one between knowledge of truths and knowledge of something other than truths. We do indeed talk about knowing people and cities, and knowing how to do this or that, but the epistemologist's primary interest is knowledge of truths and it seems clear that the acquaintance theorist's epistemological goal is to locate foundational knowledge of premises that can serve as the first truths from which we can legitimately infer the rest of what we think we know. What confuses the issue is that proponents of the given have sometimes talked as if we can have both knowledge by acquaintance of the kind of thing that couldn't be true or false, and knowledge by acquaintance of certain truths made possible by acquaintance with aspects of reality.

The confusion is, however, largely terminological. The proponent of the view should probably restrict knowledge by acquaintance to foundational knowledge of truths. Acquaintance, by contrast, is a sui generis relation that holds between a conscious being and various kinds of entities. Depending on the acquaintance theorist's ontological commitments one might think one is acquainted with certain sorts of objects (sense data), determinate properties (this particular shade of yellow), generic universals (being yellow, being colored), and, crucially, facts (my being in pain now, something's being yellow). None of the items on this list are the kinds of things that can be true or false (with one qualification discussed below). The object that is yellow, the yellowness of the object, that fact that the object is yellow are all neither true nor false.

But if the items with which we are acquainted are themselves neither true nor false, how do we get propositional knowledge out of acquaintance? How do we get knowledge of “first” truths to employ as premises in our reasoning? The answer is relatively straightforward. On what is surely the classical conception of truth, truth consists in correspondence between the truth bearer (the proposition, belief, thought) and the representation-independent fact to which that truth bearer corresponds. The question of what constitute the primary bearers of truth value is a matter of enormous controversy. Suppose, though, for this discussion that it is a thought that is the primary bearer of truth value (sentences, are derivatively true or false when they express thoughts that are true or false). On such a view, the acquaintance theorist will argue that when we form the thought that P while we are directly acquainted with the fact that P (and perhaps while we are directly acquainted with the correspondence between the thought and the fact) we have noninferential knowledge that P. So if I am the kind of being who has the conceptual sophistication to form thoughts and have the thought that I am in pain while I am directly acquainted with the pain and the fact that the thought does accurately represent the pain, I've got the most secure and basic sort of knowledge of truth. I said earlier facts aren't the kinds of things that can be true or false. But while that is true of most facts, there is one sort of fact that is a good candidate for the bearer of truth value — the kind of fact that has the capacity to represent reality. The fact that is my thinking that I'm in pain is a fact that has the capacity to correspond or fail to correspond to my pain. That capacity, arguably, just is the capacity to be true or false.

So far I have been talking primarily about the role of acquaintance in securing a special kind of knowledge. I have also mentioned, however, another crucial role acquaintance has been thought to play. For philosophers like Russell, acquaintance secures not only the objects of knowledge but the objects of thought itself. The idea actually goes back to the empiricists who claimed that all simple ideas have their source in experience. When refined the view probably amounted to the view that all simple ideas are derived from objects or properties with which we are directly and immediately acquainted. On Russell's version of the view, whenever you form a thought, the components of that thought are items with which you are directly acquainted. You can, to be sure, think of Jack the Ripper, but the thought when analyzed is broken down into constitutents each of which is something we can apprehend directly. The name “Jack the Ripper” gets reduced to a description embedded in a quantified statement. The thought that Jack the Ripper is vicious just is the thought that there exists one and only one individual who has certain properties F, G, and H, and who also has the property of being vicious. Russell has always struggled with the question of how to view our understanding of the quantifier, but it is clear that he believed that we have the capacity to entertain in thought (directly) the properties (universals) picked out by predicate expressions.

Summarizing, knowledge by acquaintance of truths is knowledge made possible by direct acquaintance with truth makers and (more controversially) the correspondence between truth bearers and truth makers. Facts are not the only entities with which one can be acquainted. Facts have constituents (properties, objects, whatever it is that we express with quantifiers) and one may be directly acquainted with the kind of things that can compose facts as well as the complex facts that they constitute. Just as knowledge is secured by acquaintance, so, more fundamentally still, some philosophers would hold that thought itself is made possible only by virtue of our being able to hold “before” our minds various kinds of entities with which we are acquainted.

An acquaintance theorist owes us an account not only of noninferential knowledge and justification, but also of inferential knowledge and justification. How can we get at least reasonable belief when we are not directly acquainted with the truth makers of those beliefs? How can we acquire knowledge (or reasonable belief) by description? Again, I stress that the question we are concerned with here is not how we can get knowledge of truths in contrast to knowledge of something other than a truth. We have already suggested that knowledge by acquaintance should be thought of as knowledge of truths made possible by acquaintance with the truth maker. The question, rather, concerns how we can get knowledge of truths when we are not acquainted with the truth maker? For the classical acquaintance theorist, that question, in turn, reduces to the question of how we can acquire knowledge through inference.

There are at least two possible answers the acquaintance theorist might give. A view we might call inferential externalism, suggests that to acquire inferential knowledge that Q by inferring Q from P it is enough that P makes highly probable Q. The relation of making probable, itself, can be interpreted in many different ways. A detailed discussion of the very important question concerning the interpretation of epistemic probability would take us too far afield, so let us be content with a few very brief remarks. Foreshadowing contemporary externalism one might try to understand the probability in terms of frequency. Roughly the idea is that P makes Q probable when P/Q form a pair of propositions of a certain kind, where usually when the first member of a pair of propositions of that sort is true, then so is the second. Alternatively, some philosophers would argue that there are relations of making probable that hold between propostions analagous (in some ways) to the relation of entailment that holds between propositions. On this view, when P makes probable Q, it is a necessary truth that P makes probable Q (though that necessary truth is perfectly consistent with the fact that the conjunction of P and X might not make probable Q).

Most classical foundationalists at least implicitly rejected the idea that the mere obtaining of a probability relation between one's noninferential evidence that P and the proposition Q one infers from that evidence is sufficient to acquire inferential justification or inferential knowledge (knowledge by description). Rather, they insisted, one must be aware of, or have access to the probabilistic connection that obtains between one's premises and one's conclusion. Direct acquaintance with facts was designed to end a potentially vicious regress of justification, but now the regress looms again in connection with knowledge of probabilistic connection. How can one get knowledge of probabilistic connections between premises and conclusions? If one infers the existence of the probabilistic connections from the truth of some other different proposition F, then one not only needs to be justified in believing F, but, one needs justification for believing that F does indeed make probable that the probabilistic connection holds! The problem seems hopeless if one understands probability in terms of frequency. But if one can convince oneself that there are real quasi-logical relations of making probable holding between propositions, then perhaps the acquaintance theorist can secure the required knowledge of those connections once again through direct acquaintance. This time, the relevant acquaintance will be with the probability connection holding between the propositions. As perhaps one should have expected, this version of the acquaintance theory relies critically on the fundamental epistemic concept of acquaintance in understanding both noninferential and inferential knowledge. Noninferential knowledge is secured by direct acquaintance with truth makers. Inferential knowledge is secured by direct acquaintance with logical and probabilistic connections between the propostions known through acquaintance and what one infers from those propositions.

2. Criticisms

In developing the view, we have already responded to one of its most common criticisms. As was noted above, it has been argued (most famously by Sellars) that even if there were such a thing as acquaintance with individuals, properties, or facts, that relation wouldn't give one knowledge of truths. The observation while correct is irrelevant to the more sophisticated view according to which the acquaintance is only a constituent of the ground of propositional knowledge.

Opponents of the view will probably want some analysis of the critical relation of acquaintance. They also probably won't get one. Acquaintance is typically taken to be a sui generis, simple (and thus indefinable) relation between the mind and its objects. To be sure, one can use metaphors of one sort or another to explain the concept, but the metaphors are as likely to be misleading as helpful. The pain one feels, one might say, is “before” the mind. There is nothing “between” one and the pain one feels. But these are spatial metaphors and the relation between one's self and that with which one is acquainted is not really all that much like a spatial relation.

While one cannot analyze acquaintance, perhaps one can point to it with a definite description. Unfortunately, the attempt at pointing involves controversial presuppositions. But imagine the following sort of familiar case. One is in pain but as one engages in an interesting conversation, one doesn't notice the pain for awhile. After the conversation ends, one is again aware of the pain. There are, of course, two possibilities. One is that the pain temporarily ceased. The other is that the pain continued, but that the subject was temporarily unaware of it. On the supposition that the last makes sense, then awareness is that relation the subject had to pain before the conversation, the relation that ceased during the conversation, and that began again shortly thereafter.

The philosophers for whom acquaintance plays a critical philosophical role will typically be quite unapologetic about their inability to define the concept. Given their conception of analysis they will quite plausibly argue that analysis requires conceptual “atoms” — simple ideas out of which other ideas are built. Acquaintance, for them, is arguably the most fundamental concept on which all epistemology, and perhaps all philosophy of mind, is built. Still, one philosopher's conceptual atom is another's complete mystery, and unless one can convince oneself that one understands what acquaintance is, one will obviously be unable to take the view seriously.

Just as many reject the existence and intelligibility of acquaintance, so others reject the theory of truth presupposed by those who want to ground knowledge of truth in direct acquaintance with facts. Contemporary anti-realists, coherence theorists, minimalists, and disquotationalists are all more than a little suspicious of the ontological category of representation-independent structured fact that serves as truth maker. Some would argue that reference to the fact that snow is white is just another way of referring to its being true that snow is white. If such a view were correct, then it would be an utter illusion to suppose that one could explain knowledge of a truth by appealing to acquaintance with a fact. For all its critics, however, the correspondence theory of truth is not about to go away and the defender of knowledge by acquaintance is unlikely to feel threatened by a criticism that presupposes an alternative conception of truth.

If one attempts to find propositional knowledge by acquaintance by searching for truths about which we cannot be mistaken, one will encounter a host of other objections. It will be argued by some, for example, that as soon as one imposes concepts on reality, one inevitably encounters the possibility of error. To evaluate this claim, one needs, of course, a full account of what “applying concepts” involves. If, for example, to categorize something as a pain involves comparing it to some past experience or some class of experiences, or it involves making a judgment about what other people would say, or what linguistic rules people in general follow, then the making of judgments will inevitably involve the possibility of error. Suffice it to say, those who think that acquaintance can constitute the source of infallible justification, will reject these models of judgment.

Recently, Sosa (2003a,b) and Markie (forthcoming) have raised the old problem of the speckled hen to raise concerns with the acquaintance theorist's conception of noninferential justification. The speckled hen presents an appearance of say 48 speckles. One is, they assume, directly acquainted with one's visual field replete with the 48 speckles. Yet unless one has "Rainman" abilities, one is unlikely to have justification for believing that one's visual field contains the 48 speckles. Even if one guesses correctly the number of speckles in the field, one's guess hardly counts as a justified belief. Direct acquaintance with truthmakers for one's belief is, then, clearly not sufficient for noninferential justification (or any other kind of justification, for that matter).

There are a number of responses available to the acquaintance theorist (see Fumerton 2005). It is certainly not part of the acquaintance theorist's view that in being direclty acquainted with an experience one is directly acquainted with all aspects of the experience. One might be directly acquainted with the fact that one is being appeared to many-speckledly without being acquainted with the fact that one is appeared to 48-speckledly. (Think about how you can be aware of a car's having a dark colour without being aware of any determinate shade of color that the car has). Alternatively, one might concede that one is directly acquainted with the 48 speckles in one's visual vield but deny either that one has the relevant thought or that one is directly aware of a correspondence relation holding between the thought that the hen has 48 speckles and the 48 speckles themselves. Perhaps, when one thinks of something's having 48 speckles, one is, essentially, thinking only of a process of counting, a process that terminates in 48 (See Feldman, 2004). If that is the nature of the relevant thought, it is doubtful that we could be directly aware of its correponding to a static state of affairs. As long as one has an account of why one of the conditions for noninferential justification fails, one is in a position to respond to the objection.

Although it is not always offered explicitly as an argument, many no doubt reject the direct acquaintance theorist's account of both noninferential an inferential knowledge out of fear that the account will inevitably lead to a radical skepticism. If knowledge by acquaintance is restricted to belief in propositions where one's epistemic situation precludes the possibility of error, the radical empiricist might well be right in suggesting that we have a tiny body of knowledge secured by direct acquaintance. The rest of what we know or justifiably believe must be secured by inference, and the fear is that we simply don't have anything like the inferential resources to get from such a narrow base to commonsense beliefs about the world around us. How legitimate that fear is depends very much on the analysis of inferential knowledge one accepts and, within that analysis, on one's understanding of probability. If one requires access to probability connections as a condition for inferential knowledge, then unless one can be acquainted with a broad array of probability connections holding between propositions, skepticism does, indeed, loom on the horizon. Even should it be true that the acquaintance theorist has a view that invites skepticism, it should, perhaps, be an open question as to whether that constitutes a legitimate objection to the view.


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a priori justification and knowledge | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | qualia: knowledge argument | Russell, Bertrand | self-knowledge | sense-data