Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Aug 11, 2004

Carneades (214–129/8 B.C.E.) was a member and eventually scholarch or head of the Academy, the philosophical school founded by Plato, for part of its skeptical phase. He is credited by ancient tradition with founding the New or Third Academy and defended a form of probabilism in epistemology.

1. Life and work

Born in Cyrene (a Greek city in North Africa), Carneades came to Athens to study philosophy. In addition to his studies in the Academy, he found time to study dialectic (the discipline that corresponds most closely to present-day logic) with Diogenes of Babylon, the fifth scholarch of the Stoa and a pupil of Chrysippus. Chrysippus, the third scholarch of the Stoa, was the principal architect of the Stoic philosophical system and the most important stimulus to Carneades, who is reported to have said, "If Chrysippus had not been, I would not have been" (a version of the saying, "If Chrysippus had not been, there would have been no Stoa"). Carneades became head or scholarch of the Academy sometime before 155 B.C.E., when, together with Diogenes and Critolaus, the head of Aristotle's school, the Peripatos, he was sent to Rome to represent Athens in a petition before the senate.

Like Arcesilaus and Socrates before him, Carneades wrote nothing, but made his mark through face to face teaching and argument. The influence he exerted in this way on his students and contemporaries was considerable. From the time of his scholarchate until the dissolution of the Academy under its last leader, Philo of Larissa (159/8–84/3 B.C.E.), philosophy in the Academy and among the philosophers in its orbit largely took the form of interpreting Carneades. We are ultimately indebted for what we know about Carneades to works by those with firsthand experience of him, especially Clitomachus, his student and eventual successor as scholarch. Although none of the latter's many books has survived, they were used by authors like Cicero, and Sextus Empiricus, whom we are able to read.

2. Academic skepticism

According to tradition, in addition to fulfilling his official duties while in Rome, Carneades scandalized the city by delivering public lectures on two succeeding days, defending justice on the first and arguing that it is a form of folly on the second. This apparently shameful exercise was an instance of the Academy's practice of arguing on both sides of a question, the better (if possible) to discover the truth. Most often, Academics in this period left the defense of a theory to its proponents and argued the negative or skeptical side, and Carneades was renowned in antiquity above all for the virtuosity that he displayed in this sort of argument. He was indebted to the example of Arcesilaus (316/15 – 241/40 B.C.E.), the Academic scholarch responsible for the school's turn to skepticism. From Arcesilaus' time on, the examination of the theories of other schools, chiefly the Stoa's, was the Academy's principal occupation, and this practice reached its peak under Carneades.

Later ancient writers speak of Carneades as founding the third or New Academy, which followed the second or Middle Academy of Arcesilaus and the first or Old Academy of Plato and his successors before Arcesilaus. (The distinction between Academies was meant to signal changes in philosophical doctrine or approach, not changes in the school as an institution.) The New Academy seemed, to both ancient philosophers and modern historians, to differ from the Middle chiefly in two respects. Carneades appeared to favor a more mitigated form of skepticism, which admitted the possibility of well-founded opinions if not of certain knowledge. And he tackled issues in, and sometimes defended positions about, logic, ethics, natural philosophy and theology as well as epistemology, which had been the focus of Arcesilaus' interests. The two features supposed to characterize the New Academy are complementary. A mitigation of the Academy's skepticism would have opened the way for the suitably circumspect adoption of views in a wide range of areas.

Caution is in order, however. "Skeptic" was not a term used by the Academics themselves, but was first applied to them later in antiquity, and to assess these claims about developments in the Academy, it is first necessary to discover what Academic skepticism, mitigated or unmitigated, might have been. We may begin by considering the arguments that Carneades inherited from his predecessors. The Academy's method of argument was, in the first instance, dialectical, like that of Socrates in Plato's Socratic dialogues. The Academics took the part of the questioner, who puts questions to his interlocutors and deduces conclusions that are unwelcome to them from their answers. The difficulties that the questioner uncovers in this way are internal to his interlocutors' position, and in drawing them out he has not committed himself to a position of his own. This was the Academics' contribution to argument on both sides of the question, meant to assist the search for truth, not to deliver the truth by itself (cf. Cicero, Acad. 2.7. 60, 76; N.D. 1.11).

The Academics' principal target was Stoic epistemology. The Stoics maintained that it is possible for human beings to achieve a condition of wisdom entirely free of opinion, that is, false or insecure belief. According to them, all a wise human being's judgments will qualify as knowledge by being based on a firm and unshakable grasp of the truth. A necessary condition for knowledge of this kind on their view was the existence of cognitive impressions, which they identified as the criterion of truth (cf. Frede, 1999). A cognitive impression was defined by the Stoics as an impression from what is, stamped and impressed in exact accordance with what is, and such as could not be from what is not. This seems to mean, in the paradigm case of a perceptual impression, that it is an impression that arises in conditions which:

  1. ensure that, by capturing its object with perfect accuracy, it is true, and
  2. at the same time impart to it a clarity and distinctness that belong only to impressions that arise in these conditions.

According to the Stoics, by restricting one's assent in the sphere of perception to impressions with this character, one can avoid ever assenting to a false perceptual impression. As the criterion of truth, cognitive impressions are the ultimate basis of all knowledge, and if further conditions are satisfied, the Stoics maintained, one can avoid error entirely.

The Academics appealed to the skeptic's stock in trade, dreams, madness, optical illusions and divinely inspired visions, in order to argue that the special character allegedly proper to cognitive impressions was not in fact confined to impressions produced in the required truth-guaranteeing way, but could also be found in false impressions (Cicero, Acad. 2.49–54, 79–82, 88–90; Sextus Empiricus, Adversus mathematicos [henceforwad S.E. M] 7.402–8). If so, impressions that arise in the specified conditions, though true, will be indistinguishable from false impressions—as far as any intrinsic discriminable character is concerned. Therefore they will not be cognitive, and not being cognitive, they will not be able to serve as a criterion. That there are no cognitive impressions is the first of the two propositions most closely associated with ancient skepticism. And since it then follows, on Stoic assumptions, that nothing can be known, this was often taken to be equivalent to the claim that nothing can be known. The second skeptical proposition, that one ought to suspend judgment, the Academics deduced from the first together with the Stoic doctrine that the wise do not hold (mere) opinions (S.E. M 7.155–7). On Stoic assumptions, assent to an impression that is not cognitive (either in the strict sense or in a broader sense which covers impressions that, though not perceptual, nonetheless afford an equally secure grasp of their contents), gives rise to opinion. Therefore, in the absence of cognitive impressions, one can avoid opinion only by suspending judgment entirely.

On a strictly dialectical interpretation, the skeptical propositions for which the Academics argued need not tell us anything about what philosophical views, if any, they accepted themselves. The skeptical position that comprises these two claims—that knowledge is not possible and that one ought to suspend judgement about everything—is an unwelcome consequence of Stoic views and presents the Stoics with a problem that it is their responsibility to solve, not the Academy's. What is more, it would have been manifestly paradoxical for the Academics to adopt the skeptical position if holding it meant taking themselves to know that its component propositions are true and assenting to them. If it is true that nothing can be known, this too cannot be known. And if there is a duty to suspend judgment by withholding assent, to accept or acknowledge it may be to violate it.

To be sure, Arcesilaus and other Academics defended the possibility of a life without knowledge and without assent (Plutarch, Adversus Colotem 1122A–F; cf. Long and Sedley [henceforward L&S] 69A). But that need not show that they somehow held the skeptical position all the same. Instead their aim may have been to counter the Stoic charge that the the Academic arguments for the skeptical propositions must be faulty because they render rational action impossible. And Arcesilaus' account of how one can act in the absence of knowledge and without assent is so heavily dependent on Stoic doctrines that it looks very much like an effort to show the Stoics that their system already contained the resources necessary to explain how action was possible for the skeptic, as envisaged in the Academy's arguments.

Nevertheless, there is evidence that at some stage in the school's history, even if they did not use the term ‘skeptic’, some Academics were skeptics in the sense that they endorsed one or both of the two skeptical propositions as the correct philosophical position. There was a tradition in the Academy, according to which Arcesilaus agreed with Zeno that opinion is a sin utterly alien to wisdom (Acad. 2.66–7, 77, 108, 133). The lesson he drew from the difficulties that he had uncovered in the Stoic position among others, however, was that he and his opponents were not in a position to give their assent with confidence. Suspension of judgment and continued open-minded inquiry were therefore indicated. The skepticism characterized by this attitude was a matter of intellectual honesty and prudence; it was a provisional outlook or stance, though one capable of being sustained indefinitely, rather than a position to be resolutely adhered to. Inevitably the question how attachment to this stance differed from adherence to a philosophical position became the subject of an extensive discussion in the Academy and among its opponents.

3. Epistemology

It is likely that Carneades added to the stock of skeptical arguments employed in the Academy. In particular, he may be responsible for the arguments that focus on the requirement that cognitive impressions be distinct (Acad. 2.54–8, 84–6; S.E. M 7.408–11 = L&S 40H). These arguments are based on the idea, denied by the Stoa, that two objects might be exactly alike. If this were true, then even if impressions that captured their objects with complete accuracy by arising in the specified ideal conditions did possess a clarity that it was possible to acquire in no other way, it would not be possible to avoid errors of identification by confining one's assent to impressions with the required clarity. One could, for instance, mistake someone for his identical twin. The only sure way to avoid error would then be to suspend judgment.

The contribution for which Carneades is best known, however, came in response to the Stoics' counter-argument in defense of the cognitive impression. They contended that, without cognitive impressions, human beings would be deprived of any basis for action or inquiry. In reply Carneades argued that such a basis could be found in so-called probable impressions (from "probabilis," that which lends itself to or invites approval, Cicero's Latin for the Greek "pithanos," persuasive). The theory of probable impressions went far beyond anything Arcesilaus had said and had an independent appeal which Arcesilaus' response to the same challenge lacked. Carneades' defense of this theory is the main reason why he was thought to have departed from or moderated the stricter skepticism thought to have been espoused by Arcesilaus and the Middle Academy (S.E. Pyrrhoneae hypotyposes [henceforward PH] 1.227–30; M 7.166–89 = L&S 69DE).

This may be so, but Carneades' defense of probabilism can also be viewed as a natural extension of the Academy's tradition of dialectical argument (cf. Allen, 1994). The epistemological debate between the Stoa and the Academy extended over many years and was conducted with a great deal of energy and ingenuity on both sides. It tended toward the condition of an impasse. If the burden of argument belonged wholly to the Academy, and the Academics were restricted to premises that were strictly implied by Stoic theory, AS seems to have been the case with Arcesilaus, the Academic case was not proved. The Stoics were not required on pain of self-contradiction to accept all the premises the Academics needed. Nonetheless, by rejecting these premises, the Stoics often committed themselves to highly disputable contentions. This mattered to them, because their aim was not simply to vindicate the internal consistency of their system. They claimed that their views were true and uniquely consistent with common conceptions had by all human beings.

In effect, the Stoics claimed that no position apart from theirs could do justice to a set of considerations that were not peculiar to their school but were accepted by everyone. It should, then, be possible for them to convince open-minded and intelligent auditors of the truth of Stoicism. The challenge that Carneades accepted was to show that there were alternatives which could do justice to the agreed upon considerations as well as or better than did the Stoic position, while dispensing with its most distinctive and contentious features. Though it does not restrict itself to premises that are already Stoic doctrines, this form of argument is broadly dialectical. By aiming to do justice to the considerations which the Stoics agree are relevant to the area in question, and directing his arguments to intelligent and open-minded auditors whom they are committed to taking seriously, Carneades was trying to show the Stoics that their position did not satisfy the standards they set for themselves. Because the theories he put forward and defended to this end are not based solely on Stoic doctrines, they sometimes have a wider appeal, and it is easier to attribute them to their author. Nonetheless, though they are Carneades' in the sense of being his creations, they need not have expressed his convictions.

In keeping with this style of argument, Carneades prepared the way for his theory of probability by setting out an epistemological framework which, though obviously indebted to Stoic views, was intended to capture intuitions that were held much more widely. In this broadly foundationalist framework it is natural to look for a criterion of truth where the Stoics and other Hellenistic philosophers do, viz. among self-evident perceptual impressions (S.E. M 7.159–65 = L&S 70A). Yet the Academy's arguments against cognitive impressions seem to have shown that no such impressions are to be found. The task of Carneades' account of probability is to show that, after all, they are not needed. Rational action and inquiry are possible without the foundation that cognitive impressions promised to provide because probable impressions can serve in their place. And if this is right, or if it is sufficiently plausible, the Stoics' attempt to provide indirect support for their contentions about the cognitive impression by showing that there are no acceptable alternatives will fail to be conclusive.

The account of probability explains how one can discriminate among impressions by investigating whether an initially persuasive impression agrees with one's other impressions or if there is something about the conditions in which it arose that undermines confidence in it. The more such checks it survives, the more confidence one will have in it. Depending on the amount of time available and the importance of the matter in question, it is possible to perform more or fewer of them. Although no amount of checking is sufficient to eliminate the possibility of error, it will be possible to achieve the degrees of confidence required in different circumstances to make rational action and theoretical inquiry possible (Acad. 2.32, 110). Carneades' theory is thus an early instance of fallibilism. And he seems to have used it not only to counter the Stoics' argument that there are no alternatives to their theory, but also to suggest that that theory's reliance on self-evident perceptual impressions is misplaced, even when viewed as an epistemological ideal. According to Carneades' theory, the improvement of which our powers of perception are capable is not a matter of approaching the condition of perfect discrimination of self-evident impressions ever more closely; it consists instead in refining one's appreciation for the complicated relations between impressions in virtue of which they add to or detract from each other's value as evidence.

Drawing on his account of probable impressions, Carneades defended two views about assent. He sometimes argued that the wise person will always withhold assent, but will be able to act and inquire by following or using probable impressions in a way that does not amount to assent, and so does not involve holding opinions about anything (Acad. 2.59, 99, 108). On other occasions, he maintained that the wise person will assent to what is probable and so form opinions, but with the proviso that he may be wrong (Acad. 2.59, 67, 78, 112). In this way he gave his interlocutors a choice between two alternatives to Stoic orthodoxy, each of which describes a way of life without the certainty furnished by cognitive impressions. Either one lives entirely without opinions, while following probable impressions without assenting to them or one lives with opinions, but opinions that are held in a self-consciously tentative spirit and subject to revision in the light of new evidence.

The view according to which the wise person assents and forms opinions appealed to those convinced by the Academy's arguments that, though certainty is unobtainable, well founded probabilities are within reach, among which is this view itself. Someone who thinks this, is likely to see little point in keeping assent in reserve for a kind of certainty which he thinks is neither needed nor possible, though he cannot be certain of this any more than he can be of anything else. This view was favored by Philo of Larissa among others (cf. Brittain, 2001), and it gave rise to a form of probabilism, as a positively endorsed theory of knowledge, which is one of the New Academy's legacies. The other view, which favors withholding assent, appealed to those who were attracted, as Zeno and Arcesilaus had been, to the ideal of certain knowledge and were struck by the force of what is said on both sides of the epistemological debate between the Academy and the Stoa. This is the classical skeptical stance that was the New Academy's other legacy. It was defended by Clitomachus, and it also influenced the other main ancient school of skepticism, the Pyrrhonists. It is noteworthy that the more radical forms of skepticism defended by Clitomachus and the Pyrhonists were less firmly attached to the skeptical proposition that nothing can be known than moderate skeptics like Philo, who who were willing to recognize it as a school dogma (Acad. 2.133, 148).

4. Ethics

In ethics Carneades proceeded as he had in epistemology and constructed a framework intended to classify not only all the views about the goal of life that had been held, but also all those that could be held (Cicero, Fin. 5.16–21 = L&S 64EG; cf. Algra, 1997). He sets out from the assumption that practical wisdom, the knowledge we need to conduct our lives successfully, must have an object. That is, it must be knowledge of something other than itself. This immediately rules out of contention views that identify human good with knowledge, but without having anything to say about what it might be knowledge of apart from human good. He further supposes that this object must be one towards which human beings have a natural impulse.. There were, he maintained, three possible such objects: pleasure, freedom from pain, and the natural advantages such as health and strength. The principle of virtue corresponds to this initial choice: to be virtuous is to act with a view to obtaining one of them. There are six simple views about the goal of life itself, three of which identify the goal with virtue, that is, acting with a view to obtaining either pleasure, freedom from pain, or the natural advantages; and three of which identify it with actually obtaining one of these objects. Three combined views take the goal to be a combination of virtue and actually obtaining the corresponding object. There are thus nine views altogether. The Stoic position, that virtue is the only good, is the third view mentioned, namely that the goal is acting with a view to obtaining the natural advantages whether or not one obtains them.

On different occasions, we are informed, Carneades defended the simple view that the goal is actually to obtain the natural advantages or the combined view that it is virtue together with pleasure (Fin. 2.35; 5.20; Acad. 2.132, 139). His aim seems to have been to challenge the Stoics by showing that the considerations captured by the framework do not all point to the Stoic view. By defending the view that the goal is the actual enjoyment of the natural advantages, Carneades probably intended to suggest that the considerations which support taking the natural advantages as the object of our first natural impulse, as the Stoics did, also count in favor of taking them to be goods. The point of arguing in support of the view that the goal is a combination of virtue and pleasure, on the other hand, was probably to show that taking pleasure as the ultimate object of impulse would require a recognizably virtuous life, a view for which there were Socratic antecedents in Plato's Protagoras. Neither of these positions had the kind of independent appeal that Carneades' probabilism and his views about assent did—our sources always describe them as put forward for the sake of argument—but Carneades' division of ethical views was extremely influential, and through Cicero it shaped the modern understanding of Hellenistic ethical theory (cf. Striker, 1991 sect. 5).

5. Other interests

Among the other issues that engaged Carneades' attention were Stoic and Epicurean views about determinism, fate, and freedom (much of the evidence is in Cicero's De Fato); Stoic belief in divination (see Cicero, De divinatione 2); and Stoic theology (see Cicero, De natura deorum 3). He argued against the Epicureans that their commitment to free will does not require the rejection of the principle of bivalence applied to propositions about the future or the postulation of an uncaused swerve among the atoms. Against the Stoics he argued that a commitment to bivalence and the principle that every action has a cause does not entail that all actions are fated. And he sought to raise questions about their conception of the gods by means of a sorites argument that appeared to show that they could not consistently set any bounds to the divine, with the result that everything threatened to become divine (cf. Burnyeat, 1997). It is very likely that Carneades had a hand in the arguments raising problems in logic which Cicero preserves (Acad. 2.91–8; cf. Barnes, 1997).



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Academy, Plato's | Arcesilaus | Philo of Larissa | skepticism: ancient | Stoicism