Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Jul 14, 2005

Sounds make for a relatively neglected philosophical topic. Philosophy of perception typically centered on colors, as did the metaphysics of mind when discussing the mind-dependence of secondary qualities. Possibly, the philosophical privilege of the visible just reflects the cognitive privilege of the visible—as vision is considered to account for most of useful sensory information gathering.

This neglect of sounds is at times a regrettable state of affairs, as sounds are not only an important element of the perceptual scene but are also philosophically idiosyncratic in many intriguing ways; in particular, their temporal and spatial unfolding, as presented in perception, has interesting metaphysical and epistemological aspects. There is, however, an advantage of the neglect. Many philosophical aspects of sound and sound perception are not idiosyncratic and indeed make for general issues in philosophy of perception. Hence in this article we will take advantage of the many discussions that have used other sensory features such as colors as a paradigm of a sensory feature. For instance, we shall not rehearse the discussion about the subjectivity of secondary qualities or sensory features, as the example of sounds does not seem to introduce new philosophically interesting elements that could challenge generalizations obtained, say, from the example of colors.

The main issues which are on the table concern the nature of sounds. Sounds enter the content of auditory perception. But what are they? Are sounds individuals? Are they events? Are they properties of sounding objects? If they are events, what type of event are they? What is the relation between sounds and sounding objects? Temporal and causal features of sounds will be important in deciding these and related questions. However, it turns out that a fruitful way to organize these issues deals with the spatial properties of sounds. This classification of philosophical theories of sound will be the main topic of this entry. But pre-eminence is given to location factors in the treatment of sounds, we shall address questions about the link between sound and place that have been discussed in the literature.

The various philosophical pronouncements about the nature of sounds can be rather neatly classified according to the spatial status each of them assigns to sounds. Where are sounds? Are they anywhere? The main relevant classes include proximal, medial, distal, and aspatial theories. There are significant variants of each of these.

1. Proximal Theories of Sounds

1.1 Sounds as Sensations

Modern philosophical accounts of sounds informed by psychology of perception construe sounds as “sensations”, or states/properties of hearers. Consider,

It seems…reasonable to suggest that the sounds directly perceived are sensations of some sort produced in the observer when the sound waves strike the ear. (Maclachlan, 1989 p. 26)

The sound-as-sensations theory is justified by some facts about auditory experience. People report hearing voices and bells even when no one is speaking and no bell is around; the objects of these experiences are naturally and spontaneously categorized as sounds. If sounds are simply defined as the objects of audition, then they are easily identified with the qualitative aspects of auditory perception. Various strands of indirect realism in perception would make this view mandatory. According to them, it is by hearing the immediate, proximal items that we hear some distal events or objects. In such a case sounds would be defined as the immediate objects of perception.

1.2 Sounds as Proximal Stimuli

A bit more peripheral, albeit still proximal, is a position, defended by (O'Shaughnessy, 2000) claiming that the sound is where the hearer is:

…while the sound originates at a distance and we can hear that it is coming from a direction and even place, and while there is no auditory experience of hearing that the sound is where we are, the sound that we hear is nonetheless where we are (p. 447).

A major shortcoming of proximal theories is that they do not locate sounds where an untutored description of what is perceived suggests they are. This means that if sounds were inner sensations, we would be almost always mistaken in our aural perceptions on important aspects, which amounts to accounting for auditory perception in terms of a massive error theory.

2. Medial Theories of Sounds

By far, the most common theories of sounds are medial theories, construing sounds as properties of the medium in which a sounding object and a hearer are immersed.

2.1 Sounds as Events or Properties of the Medium

In his treatise On the Soul, Aristotle wrote that “sound is a particular movement of air” (420b 10). The natural scientists of the 17th century refined this intuition into the wave theory of sounds, which appeared to be an obvious competitor for the quality or sensation view. Galileo (1623) registered that “sounds are produced and heard by us when… a frequent vibration of air shaken in tiny waves moves a certain cartilage of the tympanum in our ear… the more frequent the vibration, the higher the pitch; the less frequent, the lower.” Descartes joined in and in his Passions of the soul considered that what we actually hear are not the objects themselves, but some “movements coming from them” (1649, XXIII).

Both Galileo and Descartes were aware that the wave account was revisionary relative to a common sense view of sounds, or at least as revisionary as is the sensation view. (Indeed, Galileo himself endorsed both a proximal theory—sounds as sensations – and a medial theory, thereby possibly originating a dualist account.) Sounds for the wave view or the sensation view are not what we unreflectively take them to be on the basis of the content of auditory perception. At the same time Galileo and Descartes, as well as other modern philosophers, were not particularly keen in specifying what we take sounds to be on the basis of auditory content. Moreover, the metaphysics of waves is itself a complex issue, and questions about the nature of waves are relatively recent in metaphysics.

2.2 Sounds as Waves

The wave account is, of course, endorsed by modern acoustics. Sounds are construed as mechanical vibrations transmitted by an elastic medium. They are thus described as longitudinal waves, defined by their frequency and amplitude. A vibrating object (the sound source, such as a moving vocal chord or a vibrating tuning fork) creates a disturbance in the surrounding medium (say, air, or water). Each particle of the medium is set in back-and-forth motion at a given frequency and with a given amplitude, and the motion propagates to neighboring particles at the same frequency, undergoing an energy loss that entails a decrease in amplitude. Seen macroscopically, the propagation of sound is the propagation of a compression in the medium followed by a depression, that is, the propagation of a wave. The behavior of each particle is described by a sinusoid that maps the pattern of compression and depressions against time. Amplitude is the distance between creases and valleys, period as the distance between a crease and its successor, and frequency as the number of periods per time unit.

Contemporary philosophers of perception of the physicalist strand tend to align themselves on the wave theory. Perkins (1983) thus summarizes the view: “…the sound we hear is identical with the train of airwaves that stretches from the distant sounding object to our ear.” And indeed, the physicalist account of sounds seems to make a good claim to successful reduction once we identify sounds with sound waves in a medium in which a sounding object (and possibly a hearer) is present.

2.3 Assessing the Wave Theory

2.3.1 Arguments for the Wave Theory

The medial/wave theory is a good candidate for claiming that it correctly represents the nature of sounds as perceived. Many perceptual properties of sounds are neatly explained by the presence of strong correlations with properties of waves, in particular pitch and intensity (or volume). Sounds having the felt quality of high pitch are correlated with high frequencies; low pitch sounds are correlated with low frequencies; high volume sounds with high, low volume sounds with low, amplitudes. The directionality of sounds (the fact that they appear to be ‘in a direction’) is related to the fact that the hearer is located on a propagation line from the source. Even more accomplished is the explanation of particular auditory effects, such as the Doppler effect, when the speed of a sounding object in motion contributes to a rise in the sound's heard pitch (so that the whistle of an engine passing by is heard to drop in pitch as it travels past us). Interestingly enough, the reduction of sounds to waves is arguably more successful than the corresponding attempt to reduce colors to properties of electromagnetic waves, as it is not affected by one of the key problems that plague the latter, that is, the existence of non-spectral colors such as purple.

2.3.2 Arguments Against the Wave Theory

However, for all its merits, the medial identification of sounds with sound waves raises some objections and leaves some matters wanting. For instance, there are metameric sounds (as there are metamers among colors), that is, sounds that feel identical to the ear although the corresponding medial properties are different. There is no one-to-one psychophysical correlation between auditory content and sounds as waves. Moreover, ultrasounds, above 20.000 Hz and infrasounds, below 20 Hz, have the same nature of sounds—they are mechanical vibrations transmitted by an elastic medium—but they are not audible (as infrared and ultraviolet are not visible in the domain of colors): do they count as sounds? It further appears that the relationship between sound and sounding object remains underspecified; and, most importantly, as happened with proximal theories, sounds are not located where an untutored conception of auditory perception suggests they are. If sounds were sound waves, we would be almost always mistaken in our aural perceptions on important aspects, which once more amounts to accounting for auditory perception in terms of a massive error theory.

What is the nature of sounds under the wave theory? Relevant to our purposes, there are two main metaphysical conceptions about waves, in both cases construed as individuals. Either (a) waves are considered to be of the same nature as processes (temporally extended entities, with temporal parts), or (b) they are taken as individuals of a peculiar kind but akin to substances. In case (a), they would not move, for arguably processes do not move (Dretske 1967), but rather have phases (temporal parts) located at different spatial regions. One would then have to construe sound waves' “movement” in term of the presence of different phases of the wave at different spatial locations. However, one does not hear a sound wave's phase as being at a particular location, in particular at any of the locations between the source and oneself. (Contrast this case with the visual perception of a sea wave's phase at a particular place.) Sound waves do not appear to be perceptually located where sounds are. A wave-process has some starting phases in the object, and some end-phases around the perceiver: but the sound is, perceptually, wholly where the object is. In case (b), (sound) waves are different from processes and are peculiar just because waves move, as individual substances do. But again, if sound waves move, the corresponding sounds are not generally heard as moving. Sound waves propagate in all or most directions from a sounding object, but the corresponding sounds are not actually heard as propagating in any direction: the only moving sounds are the sounds emitted by a moving source. It follows that if sounds were sound waves in this sense, we would not be hearing them as they are.

2.3.3 Arguments for or Against the Wave Theory Reassessed

Some other remarks against the identification of sounds with sound waves in the medium between the object and the perceiver apply independently of the metaphysical construal of sound waves as processes or sui generis individuals.

Consider first the fact that sounds are sometimes loud and sometimes weak; as we have seen, this feature is correlated with amplitude in the wave theory. However, the location of the sound plays a role in establishing the correlation. A loud sound, which is heard as being far from us, is different from a weak sound, which is heard as being close to us. In some conditions, however, it can be difficult for us to tell a sound of the former kind from a sound of the latter, because in the part of space closer to our ears the sound waves that reach us and correspond to the two sounds can have the same amplitude. Indeed, the fact that the two sound waves have the same amplitude when they are close to the ear accounts for the indistinguishability of the two sounds in certain conditions; nevertheless, the two sounds, even if indistinguishable, are distinct, whereas the two sound waves are not. A way to put the difficulty is as follows: a loud sound heard at a distance is still a loud sound; but the corresponding sound waves decrease in amplitude. That is, we can make perfect sense of the notion of distal volume of sounds. Something happens to sound waves which does not happen to sounds; hence it can be argued that they are distinct.

As a matter of fact, one may want to distinguish two possible lines of argument here. (i) A phenomenological argument, claiming that sometimes we hear a constant sound (constant in intensity, for instance), even though the source is moving away from us. Here different sound waves can correspond to one and the same sound. (ii) A metaphysical argument, holding that sometimes the sound waves corresponding to two sounds are the same while the sounds are clearly different: a loud sound in the distance, or a faint sound close to us. Here the same sound waves can correspond to distinct sounds. The latter argument is not lethal, but is a useful reminder that there is no fully developed theory of sounds as sound waves as yet. Should the sound be identified with the sound waves when they reach the ears, or with the whole train of sound waves from the source to our ears, or with the sphere filled with sound waves and centered on the source?

The thesis that sounds are sound waves is also often motivated by the argument from vacuums. Surely, it is argued, sounds cannot exist in a vacuum. As Hylas says in Berkeley's Three Dialogues Between Hylas and Philonous, “a bell struck in the exhausted receiver of an air-pump, sends forth no sound. The air therefore must be thought the subject of sound” (1975: 171-2). But is the claim that there are no sounds in vacuums really obvious? On pain of question begging, it cannot be made to follow from any particular metaphysics of sounds. In order to assess it on its own merits, consider the analogy between, on the one hand, sounds and air, and, on the other hand, colors and light. Air is the medium of auditory perception, and light is the medium of visual perception. Now just as things can sensibly be taken to have colors in the dark, they can sensibly taken to produce sounds in a vacuum.

To develop this line of thought, imagine a vacuum jar which has the property of immediately creating a vacuum on closing the lid (and of course of immediately recalling air upon opening the lid). Take now a tuning fork at 440 Hz and have it vibrate, supposing that the vibration fades and becomes inaudible after 20 seconds. What you hear is an A that becomes feebler and feebler until it disappears. Now, place the tuning fork inside the jar, have it vibrate as before, and repeatedly open-and-close the lid of the jar, say once a second. What do you hear? You won't have the feeling that 10 little sounds, each feebler than the preceding one, come into existence and pass away. You have the impression instead of a sound that is revealed by the opening and closing of the jar. If sounds were sound waves in the medium surrounding the object, we would be forced to admit that the tuning-fork started and ceased to sound; because sound waves would not be present in the surrounding medium. A visual analogue of this would be the perception of an object in the dark, on which light is shed at intervals. We would not have the impression that the object gets its colors and then loses them at intervals.

In the above arguments an important role is played by the requirement that a theory of sounds should be true to the phenomenological content of auditory perception. Intuitively, it seems quite reasonable to require that as sounds are the objects of hearing, whatever they are should be somewhat revealed in hearing. In point of fact, there are two ways in which the fidelity to auditory content requirement can enter the argument. In a strong version (O'Callaghan 2002) it may be held that no theory of sounds “should make the fact of location perception a wholesale illusion” (p. 5); hence, as sounds are represented as located, it would follow that they are correctly so represented. In a weak version (Casati and Dokic 1994) it is the representational power of auditory content that is appealed to. Auditory experience has the power to represent sounds, and it has the power to represent movement (as when one hears the sound of a moving train's whistle). It is then natural to assume that if sounds were moving, then auditory experience would be able to represent sounds as moving, if sounds were indeed moving entities by their nature. But such is not the case; hence auditory experience correctly represents them as firmly located.

The requirement of fidelity to auditory content may be challenged on two grounds. First, it may be challenged by opposing its rationale. Auditory content may well be massively illusory, and this could be just the price to pay for any realist account of sounds. Possibly there is here an analogue to the case of colors, in which there is room for selective illusion and for the choice between realism about location and realism about hue.

Second, the requirement of fidelity to auditory content may be challenged by questioning the phenomenological claim that motivates it. The move would consist in suggesting that sounds do not have the strong spatial property of locatedness, but the weaker property of directionality (the distinction between two senses of ‘locatedness’ in relation to sounds can be traced back to Malpas (1965), based on ordinary language arguments, and is echoed in Urmson (1968) and Hacker (1987:102 ff.). Cf. O'Shaughnessy (1957)). Locatedness specifies an address for the sound, e.g., by specifying both directionality and distance from the hearer (thus including directionality as a component). But sounds would only be perceived as “coming from” a certain direction, without any information about the distance they travel. Now surely this is not the general case. Although in some cases it may be difficult or impossible to tell, say, whether what we hear is a soft sound nearby or a loud sound far away, in most cases the distinction is perfectly available to the subject, as we noticed earlier when we introduced the notion of distal volume—indeed the issue of the locatedness of sounds is the subject matter of specialized branches of cognitive science (Blauert 1974; Bregman 1994.)

It may be surmised that claiming that sounds are heard in a direction rather than at a location mixes up two ways of accounting for auditory experience: phenomeology on the one hand and commonsense reflections on the directional transmission of auditory information on the other hand; where the commonsense picture may have been made a bit too sophisticated by exposure to some physical accounts of sounds.

Several among the previous remarks jointly point to the necessity of better accounting for the distinction between events in the sounding thing and events in the surrounding medium. As for sounds, this distinction is consequent upon the distinction between two kinds of medium: the source medium (that is, the stuff the thing is composed of) and the medium proper or environment medium, surrounding the sounding thing, the one in which the hearer could be immersed as well. The thing is a sounding entity only insofar the stuff(s) the thing is composed of is (are) vibrating. There are no properties of a tuning fork which account for its sounding, which are not properties of the stuff(s) the fork consists of (including shape). So what is it that licenses the view that the sound is linked to the medium of the sounding object (and therefore to the sounding object itself) rather than to the medium proper? In order to answer this question, one can once more appeal to a visual analogy. There are cases in which both a thing and (a part of) a medium between us and the thing are seen. This happens when we look at things through irregularly warmed air, or through moving water. In these cases, we see both the thing and the medium, the thing in an unclear way, and the medium as that which makes the thing appear in an unclear way.

Perceptual media are in the norm cognitively transparent: they are imperceptible insofar as they limit themselves to transmit without significant alteration information about some relevant properties of the thing perceived through them. Media become perceivable when this transmitting function is impaired by some event or disturbance occurring in them. In these cases, and think of thunders (or the Doppler effect) one and the same event, namely air vibration, carries information about both the electric discharge and the way in which the latter affects the medium itself (or, to return to the Doppler effect, the air vibration carries information about the sounding object and about the effect its speed has on the medium). Compare this to the way in which the water-air interface carries visual information about both a stick partly immersed in water and the way water refracts light differently from air.

The affectedness of the medium is a feature which is mostly evident, and almost pervasive in the case of sounds, because of the relatively similar size of the phenomena involved at the source and in the medium proper. Vibrations in the sounding objects are macroscopic phenomena, of a size which is fairly comparable to the size of the sounding object itself. Therefore the interaction of these vibrations with the surrounding medium can easily be a source of misperception, for their impact on the medium brings about processes which are of the same order of magnitude of the object involved.

3. Distal Theories of Sounds

In light of the above, one should consider another candidate for the physical identification of sounds, namely distal properties, processes or events in the medium inside (or at the surface of) sounding objects, or in the stuff of the sounding object. Distal views claim they are superior to their non-distal competitors in virtue of their better adherence to the spatial structure of auditory content. In point of fact, we do hear sounds both as externalized (hence auditory content is at odds with proximal views) and as distally located (hence auditory content is at odds with medial views).

There exist at least three varieties of the distal account of sounds: the Property View, the Located Event View, and the Relational Event view. Let us take them in turn.

3.1 Sounds as Properties

According to the Property View, sounds are properties of material objects just like colors and shapes.

The property view is in part endorsed by the founding fathers of modern philosophy of perception, Galileo and Locke, who opened a tradition of lumping various sensory items in the class of secondary qualities. The typical 17th century list of secondary qualities includes colors, smells and sounds. No significant internal metaphysical differentiation within the class of sensory qualities is made, hence the charge of an oversimplification cannot be directly addressed to historical accounts. Other philosophers may have added shapes to the list (as Berkeley did), without addressing the issue of the homogeneity of the class: the issue was only whether shapes are secondary as sounds are, not whether they are on a par with sounds as to their structure. The Property View has contemporary endorsers (Pasnau 1999; although Pasnau takes sounds to be properties like colors, he comes close to the event view when he writes, p. 316, that sounds “either are the vibrations of [objects that have sounds], or supervene on those vibrations”).

The view faces a number of objections. First, we ordinarily describe objects as “having” colors or shapes, but we do not ordinarily describe sources as “having sounds”. Rather, we say that they make or produce sounds. Of course this is an ordinary language argument, and as such it might not be very strong.

The main consideration against the Property View is that it underestimates the important differences between colors and shapes on the one hand, and sounds on the other hand. The latter, unlike the former, are dynamic dependent particulars. Even if colors and shapes can be theoretically conceived as particulars or tropes, they are not dynamic. Sounds take up time. They start and cease. They are intrinsically temporal entities. Their temporal profile is essential to individuating them, in a way which has no analogue in the case of colors and shapes.

3.2 Sounds as Located Events

According to the Location Event View, sounds are monadic events happening to material objects. They are located at their source, and are identical with, or at least supervene on, vibration processes in it. On this view (Casati and Dokic, 1994), auditory perception of sounds requires a medium which transmits information from the vibrating object to the ears; however, the transmitting medium is not essential to the existence of sounds. One can see at once the fit of this view with those features of sound which were sources of trouble in the cases discussed above.

(a) Vibration processes in the sounding object do not move any more than sounds appear to.
(b) They do not propagate from the object, as much as sounds do not appear to.
(c) Like sounds, and unlike sound waves in the ambient medium, their intensity can remain the same through a period of time, even if one distances oneself from the source and hence hears them as less loud.
(d) Finally, and most importantly, tuning-forks and other sounding objects can be taken as continuing to vibrate irrespective of their being or not being immersed in a medium. We do not create sounds by surrounding vibrating objects with a medium—we simply reveal them.

A by-product of the Location Event View is that it makes plain what category sounds belong to, as opposed to views that construe sounds generically as qualities. Sounds are either instantaneous events or temporally extended processes. They start and cease. They are intrinsically temporal entities.

Another feature of the Located Event View is that it provides us with a clear example of the compatibility of a theory of non-direct perception, according to which we hear external events by hearing their perceptual deputies, with a non-phenomenalistic theory, according to which perceptual deputies are not mental items. The case of sound perception shows that there can be indirect perception without mental deputies. We hear coaches and telephones by hearing their sounds, i.e., by hearing some (cluster of) vibratory processes or events occurring in those objects. Sounds are both physical events and perceptual deputies.

3.3 Objections to the Located Event View

We shall now briefly discuss some objections to the identification proposed by the Location Event View, as they allow us to highlight certain metaphysically interesting features of sounds.

3.3.1 Imprecise Location

The first objection concerns sound location. Even if sounds are heard as located, it could be held that location is often imprecise or even erroneous, this in turn depending on the nature of sounds waves. If a sound wave coming from a sounding object located on my right is reflected by a wall on my left, a sound is heard as being located on my left. The response to this is that there may be no particular problem in this fact, as in other facts linked to misperception. Seeing an object in the mirror is not seeing another, immaterial object located in an immaterial space beyond the mirror-plane. There is no such object; we see one and the sole material object, and we locate it incorrectly.

The mirror sophism should be credited to Hobbes' Leviathan (Hobbes 1651, I, I), which explicitly linked perception in a mirror and perception of echoes: “The cause of sense, is the external body, or object, which presseth the organ proper to each sense, either immediately, as in the taste and touch; or mediately, as in seeing, hearing, and smelling; which pressure, by the mediation of the nerves, and other strings and membranes of the body, continued inwards to the brain and hearth, causeth there a resistance, or counter-pressure, or endeavour of the earth to deliver itself, which endeavour, because outward, seemeth to be some matter without. And this seeming, or fancy, is that which men call sense; and consisteth, as to the eye, in a light, or colour figured; to the ear, in a sound…if those colours and sounds were in the bodies, or objects that cause them, they could not severed by them, as by glasses, and in echoes by reflection, we see they are; where we know the thing we see is in one place, the appearance in another.”

The temptation of identifying sounds with sound waves can arise because of precisely this fact: that sounds can be mislocated in audition. They can be heard as located in a region which is larger than, or removed from, the one occupied by a sounding object, a region which it is reasonable to take as being occupied by sound waves. But does this compel one to accept the identification of sounds with sound waves? By no means. Sound waves are responsible for the perceptual difficulty in locating sounds, as mirrors are for the analogous difficulty for visible objects. But it is not the case that sound waves are sounds just because of this responsibility. Consider the following sophism: x hears something as imperfectly located, therefore x hears something which is imperfectly located. This would be an invalid inference from epistemology to ontology.

3.3.2 Doppler Effect

The second objection concerns typical acoustical effects, like the Doppler effect, which are perfectly accounted for by appeal to (medial) sound waves. Such explanations of the Doppler effect are harmless for a distal account. The Doppler effect is dependent on something going on in the medium, but this should not allow one to conclude that what we hear are sound waves. The situation can be described as follows in a way that is relatively uncommitting: When we hear sounds as undergoing the Doppler effect, we do not hear anything different from a vibration process in a sounding object, a process which is heard in a sort of perspectival shortening because the movement of the sounding object causes, among other things, the Doppler effect.

3.3.3 Properties of Sounds

A third objection is as follows. Sounds are phenomenologically high or low (they have high or low pitch). But processes in objects cannot be high or low. Therefore sounds are not processes in objects. This can be answered in the following way. Notice first that sound waves fare no better on this objection—they cannot literally be said to be high or low. But a more substantial answer is available. What one needs is a way of systematically correlating predicates like ‘…is high’, ‘…is higher than…’ to processes in sounding objects. It is likely that a high sound corresponds to a quickly vibrating process, and so forth.

3.3.4 The Causal Link

A fourth objection has it that surely there are sound waves in the ambient medium, otherwise no causal link could be set between the sounding object and our perception of the latter. And such sound waves can certainly be measured and physically described. Now one should not deny that there are sound waves in the ambient medium: of course there are, and they are causally responsible for our aural perceptions when these are perceptions of anything at all. One ought to just contend that such sound waves are not what we hear (in this sense, they are not perceptual deputies, for we do not perceive sounds by perceiving them). Consider an analogy. Light is causally responsible for your perception of an object's surface. But this does not make you see the light. Actually, we can see luminescent sources, but never light in itself: in order to be seen, light should have to emit light carrying information about it.

3.3.5 Space Filling Sounds?

Another objection concerns the alleged meaningful use of expressions such ‘the sound fills the room’, ‘sounds fill the room’. It seems that what makes these sentences true is best found in the spreading of sound waves, which could actually be everywhere in the room. But one should not be too much impressed by idioms. ‘The sound fills the room’ does not describe any phenomenological fact which is different from the fact that the sound is audible from any place in the room (in this respect sounds are unlike fog, which can literally be seen to fill a room).

However, this point deserves closer attention. For sometimes sounds do seem to fill space. Thunders seem to. This is a case in which the only vibrating entity is the medium. Nonetheless this case too can be accommodated by the Located Event view: what we hear is the electric discharge, whose impact is only confusedly propagated by the medium.

3.4 The Relational Event View

There is a third interesting variant of the distal account, which incorporates some aspects of medial theories. According to the Relational Event View, sounds are events which involve both the source and the surrounding medium. They are relational rather than monadic events. (The distinction between monadic and relational events is not to be taken as cast in iron, since the latter can be reduced to the former by making the mereological sum of sources and surrounding medium as the subject of sounds.)

O'Callaghan (2002) has developed such a view in some length. He notes that the wave conception of sounds is not the only possible interpretation of Aristotle's remarks about sounds in On the Soul. Aristotle writes that “everything which makes a sound does so because something strikes something else in something else again, and this last is air”. On O'Callaghan's view, what Aristotle might have meant is that the sound itself is not an (intransitive) movement of the air, but the event in which a vibrating object disturbs a surrounding medium and sets it “moving”. The waves in the medium are not the sounds themselves, but rather the effects of sounds.

The main motivation for a Relational Event View seems to be arguments from vacuums. However, it could be argued that these arguments neglect striking analogies between audition and vision. In both cases, there are tunnel effects which seem to show that the transmitting medium is not essential to the existence of sounds or colors. One might object that these effects, at least in the case of audition, in fact give rise to perceptual illusions. However, these illusions are not at all on the same par as well-known perceptual illusions. The so-called ‘Phi-phenomenon’, for instance, involves an illusion of motion: it seems to us that we see a moving light source where there is only a set of lights flashing in rapid succession. This is a well circumscribed illusion, for which there are plausible psychophysical explanations. The case is different with the alleged illusions created by the auditory versions of tunnel effects. In this case, we have no reason to rate tunnel effects as illusions, and there is a legitimate suspicion that rating them as illusions is an artifact of a theory that presupposes the conclusion of the argument from vacuum. At this stage, it looks as if the Location Event View is a simpler theory which does more justice to the representational power of auditory perception.

4. Aspatial theories

Aspatial theories deny either (i) that sounds are intrinsically spatial, or (ii) that auditory perception is intrinsically spatial. Arguably, claim (i) implies claim (ii), but the converse is not true, which leaves room for an interesting aspatial theory of auditory perception which nevertheless acknowledges that sounds have some spatial locations.

4.1 Aspatial Sounds

We have seen the use of phenomenological arguments against both medial and proximal theories of sound. To sum up, one can claim that, first, auditory experience has a spatial content whereby sounds seem to be located in egocentric space (to the left, above, in front of us, etc.). Second, unless one subscribes to an error theory of auditory experience, sounds are where they are (normally) heard to be, namely at their sources.

But are sounds really located in space? There is in the literature a strong non-locational view of sounds. Strawson has made the plausibility of a thought-experiment of a purely auditory world rest upon the tenet of an intrinsic non-spatiality of sounds. (Philosophers and psychologists such as Lotze (1842: §§ 123-6), Binet (1905: cap.3), Heymans (1905: cap. 1), Stumpf (1907: 29), Wellek (1934), Révész (1946), Evans (1980: 248 ff.), have investigated the phenomenology of auditory space and suggested the possibility of a purely auditory world.) Strawson (1959: 65-66) thus wrote: “Sounds … have no intrinsic spatial characteristics: such expressions as ‘to the left of’, ‘spatially above’, ‘nearer’, ‘farther’ have no intrinsically auditory significance (…). A purely auditory concept of space… is an impossibility. The fact that, with the variegated types of sense-experience which we in fact have, we can, as we say, ‘on the strength of hearing alone’ assign directions and distances to sounds, and things that emit or cause them, counts against this not at all. For this fact is sufficiently explained by the existence of correlations between the variations of which sound is intrinsically capable and other non-auditory features of sense-experience.”

Strawson designed his thought-experiment in the context of an analysis of the Kantian claim that the notion of there being objective entities (entities which do not depend on our perception of them) involves the notion of space: “[t]he question we are to consider, then, is this: Could a being whose experience was purely auditory have a conceptual scheme which provided for objective particulars?” (p. 66). Thus, he imagined a character (later on called “Hero” by Gareth Evans) who has only non-spatial auditory experiences. Hero perceives sounds, but he does not perceive them to be located in physical space. What Strawson tried to show is that Hero needs an “analogue” to the notion of space in order to “locate” sounds when they are not actually heard. This analogue is provided by what Strawson calls a “master-sound”, namely a constant sound varying in pitch. Any particular sound is heard against the background of the master-sound. Thanks to the master-sound, Hero can distinguish between experiencing the same particular sound again (when its “location” as provided by the master-sound is the same), and experiencing successively two particular sounds of the same type (when they have different “locations” on the master-sound map). Evans (1980) questioned the claim that the master-sound could play the role of physical space in grounding the notion of objective particulars; see also Strawson's (1980) reply to Evans.

In evaluating Strawson's thought-experiment, we should distinguish the claim that there can be non-spatial auditory experiences from the claim that there can be a world populated only with sounds. Strawson's thought-experiment justifies the former claim, but it does not obviously lead to the latter. One cannot infer from the fact that we can perceptually represent a sound without representing its location, that we can perceptually represent a non-located sound.

4.2 Aspatial Auditory Perception

It is possible to argue that auditory perception is not intrinsically spatial independently of a commitment to the claim that sounds do not have spatial locations. This is O'Shaughnessy's view, who writes that “while we have the auditory experience of hearing that a sound comes from p, we do not have any experience that it is here where it now sounds… And this is so for a very interesting reason: namely, that we absolutely never immediately perceive sounds to be at any place” (2000: 446). However, O'Shaughnessy does not draw the conclusion that sounds have no spatial locations. On the contrary, as we have seen, he defends a proximal account of the location of sounds, according to which sounds are where hearers, rather than sources, are.

O'Shaughnessy would not be impressed by allegedly phenomenological arguments according to which one normally hears sounds as located at their sources. One may still have the feeling that his sophisticated version of proximal theories does not locate sounds where an untutored description of what is perceived suggests they are. As a consequence, it appears to be another massive error theory of auditory perception.

5. Conclusion

We have suggested that a fruitful way to classify the various accounts of sounds that have been given in the literature is in terms of their spatial locations. If the sounds we hear have spatial locations, they can be thought to be located either where the material sources are (distal theories), or where the hearers are (proximal theories), or somewhere in between (medial theories). It has also been denied that sounds have any spatial locations, which gives rise to a fourth class of theories, aspatial theories. All these theories have interestingly different phenomenological, epistemological and metaphysical implications.


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This entry was prepared with the help of funds from the IST-2002-002114 Enactive Network of Excellence of the 6th Framework programme of the European Commission.