Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Apr 22, 2002; substantive revision Mon May 8, 2006

Broadly understood, events are things that happen -- things such as births and deaths, thunder and lightening, explosions, weddings, hiccups and hand-waves, dances, smiles, walks. Whether such things form a genuine metaphysical category is a question that has attracted the sustained interest of philosophers, especially in the second half of the 20th century. But there is little question that human perception, action, language, and thought manifest at least a prima facie commitment to entities of this sort:

It is not clear to what extent such commitments are to be understood as an integrated phenomenon or as four separate, independent dispositions. However, there exist significant signs of convergence among the various commitments. For instance, the events that are perceived appear to be categorically homogeneous with those that are talked about or thought of in causal explanations [Zacks et al. 2001].

Because the prima facie commitments of human perception, action, language, and thought are not taken for granted in philosophy, various forms of non-realism about events have been defended. Historically, the main arguments in favor of a realist attitude towards events has arisen out of theories concerning the metaphysics of the scientific image of the world [Whitehead 1919] and the semantics of natural language [Davidson 1967a]. But even in these contexts events have been introduced as questionable categories, meant to be somewhat in competition with (if not alternative to) entities of other sorts. This suggests that in spite of the apparent simplicity of the examples in our initial list, the event category is not uncontroversial.

As a matter of fact, it is not even easy to give an uncontroversial characterization of events. (Their broad characterization as ‘things that happen’ is commonly found in dictionaries, but it clearly just shifts the burden to the task of clarifying the meaning of ‘happen’.) One useful approach is to set events against entities belonging to other, philosophically more familiar, metaphysical categories. In the following we review the main contrasts between events and those categories that have in the literature been put forward explicitly as their ontological competitors, or at least as categories exhibiting significant differences with the category of events. Along the way, we shall review also the main conceptual tools that metaphysicians and other philosophers have adopted in their attempts to cope with events, either from a realist or from a non-realist perspective.

1. Events and Other Categories

1.1 Events vs. Objects

Although not undisputed, some standard differences between events and physical objects are commonplace in the philosophical literature. First, there is a difference in mode of being: material objects such as stones and chairs are said to exist; events are said to occur or happen or take place [Hacker 1982a]. Second, there are differences in the way objects and events are said to relate to space and time. Ordinary objects have relatively clear spatial boundaries and unclear temporal boundaries; events have relatively unclear spatial boundaries and clear temporal boundaries. Objects are invidiously located in space -- they occupy their spatial location; events tolerate co-location [Quinton 1979, Hacker 1982b]. Objects can move; events cannot [Dretske 1967]. Objects are continuants -- they are in time and they persist through time by being wholly present at every time at which they exist; events are occurrents -- they take up time and they persist by having different parts (or "stages") at different times [Mellor 1980].

The last distinction is particularly controversial, as there are philosophers who conceive of objects as four-dimensional entities that extend across time just as they extend across space. Some such philosophers would in fact draw no metaphysically significant distinction between objects and events [Quine 1960]. Rather, they would regard the relevant distinction as one of degree: both objects and events would be species of the same "material inhabitant of space-time" genus (as opposed to the genus "immaterial inhabitant", such as the Equator); but whereas events appear to develop quickly in time, objects are relatively "firm and internally coherent" [Quine 1970].

If a metaphysical distinction between objects and events is granted, then a question arises as to the relation between entities in the two categories. Objects are prime actors in events; objectless events are uncommon. But so are eventless objects; events make up the lives of objects. In a radical mood, however, one can think of the entities in one category as being metaphysically dependent on entities in the other. For instance, it has been claimed that events supervene on their participants [Lombard 1986], or that objects depend on the events in which they partake [Parsons 1991]. In a more moderate way, one can grant objects and events an equal ontological status but maintain that either objects or events are primary in the order of thought. For instance, it has been claimed that a pure event-based ontology would not be sufficient for the success of our re-identifying practices, which require some stable frame of reference, adequately provided by objects [Strawson 1959]. A similar asymmetry between objects and events seems to be endorsed by natural language, which has expressions such as ‘the fall of the apple’ but not ‘the pomification of the fall’. However, these asymmetries may be attenuated to the extent that objects, too, may and sometimes must be identified via reference to events [Moravcsik 1965, Davidson 1969, Tiles 1981].

1.2 Events vs. Facts

No matter what their relationships, events are naturally contrasted with objects insofar as both are conceived of as individuals. Both appear to be concrete, temporally and spatially located entities organized into part-whole hierarchies. Both can be counted, compared, quantified over, referred to, and variously described and re-described. (It has been argued that our conceptions of these two categories are so closely tied as to be structurally complementary, in that any characterization of the concept event that only mentions spatial and temporal features yields a characterization of the concept object by a simple replacement of temporal with spatial predicates, and vice versa [Mayo 1961].) From this point of view, events are to be distinguished from facts, which are characterized by features of abstractness and a-temporality: the event of Caesar's death took place in Rome in 44 B.C., but that Caesar died is a fact here as in Rome, today as in 44 B.C. [Ramsey 1927]. One could indeed speculate that for every event there is a companion fact (the fact that the event took place), but the two would still be categorially distinct [Bennett 1988]. Some philosophers, however, have conceived of the link between events and facts as being much closer than this -- close enough to justify assimilating the two categories [Wilson 1974] or at least treating both as species of the same "state of affairs" genus [Chisholm 1970]. This has two main consequences. On the one hand, because facts corresponding to non-equivalent propositions are distinct, events conceived of as facts are fine-grained entities that cannot be freely re-described or re-identified under different conceptualizations: the fact that Caesar died violently is different from the fact that he died, so the death of Caesar would be a different event from his violent death [Chisholm 1971]. On the other hand, because linguistic expressions of facts are semantically transparent, a Fregean line of argument could be concocted to show instead that events construed as facts are too coarse-grained, to the point of melting into a single "big" entity [Davidson 1967a]. (The argument is known as the "slingshot argument" since [Barwise & Perry 1981].) Either way, the assimilation of events to facts appears to give rise to difficulties.

Some authors have insisted on distinguishing events from facts but have given accounts that effectively amount to such an assimilation. This is the case with those theories that construe events as property exemplifications, i.e., exemplifications of properties by objects at times [Kim 1966, Martin 1969, Goldman 1970, Taylor 1985]. On such theories, events are individual entities. But because they have a structure, a difference in any constituent is sufficient to yield a different event. In particular, a difference in the relevant constitutive property is sufficient to distinguish events such as Caesar's death, construed as Caesar's exemplification of the property of dying, and Caesar's violent death, construed as his exemplification of the property of dying violently [Kim 1976]. This makes events virtually as fine-grained as facts. It bears emphasis, however, that this consequence is not intrinsic to the theory of events as property exemplifications. Both Caesar's death and his violent death could be construed as Caesar's exemplification of one and the same property P, describable both as a type of dying and -- with greater accuracy -- as a type of dying violently. Thus, even if construed as a structured complex, an event can be coarsely referred to insofar as its names need not be sensitive to this structure [Bennett 1988]. In this way the distinction between events and facts can be reinstated in terms of a firm distinction between semantic and metaphysical aspects of the theory of event-descriptions.

Similar considerations apply to those theories that treat events as situations, in the sense familiar from situation semantics [Barwise & Perry 1983]. On such theories, events are construed as sets of functions from spatiotemporal locations to "situation types" defined as sequences of objects standing or failing to stand in a certain relation. But while the formal machinery delivers a fine-grained account, the algorithm for applying the machinery to natural language sentences leaves room for flexibility.

1.3 Events vs. Properties

A third major metaphysical category with which events have sometimes been contrasted is that of properties. If events are individuals then they are not properties, for properties are normally construed as universals. Individuals occur whereas universals recur. However, some philosophers have taken very seriously the intuition that in some cases events may be said to recur, as when we say that the sun rises every morning. If so, then events are more similar to properties than to individuals, similar enough to justify treating them as a kind of property -- e.g., as properties of moments or intervals of time [Montague 1969], properties of cross-world classes of individuals [Lewis 1986], or properties of sets of world segments [von Kutschera 1993]. For instance, on the first of these accounts, the event of the sun's rising is the property of being an interval during which the sun rises. As a characterization of event types this would be uncontroversial and would allow one to construe particular events as tokens of the corresponding type. (One such construal would correspond to the above-mentioned conception of events as property exemplifications.) But to conceive of events as universal properties is to go beyond this uncontroversial fact and to reject the existence of event tokens altogether, even when it comes to "particular" events such as the unique rising of the sun that we witnessed this morning. Rather than an instance of the universal sun rising, such an event would be a universal in its own right, albeit a universal of such a restricted sort and of such a degree of singularity as to be instantiated only once.

One possible view about properties is that they are not universals but rather particulars of a special sort -- viz. abstract particulars [Stout 1923] or tropes [Williams 1953]. According to this view, the redness of this apple is different from the redness of anything else, not because of its extreme singularity (other things could agree with the apple colorwise) but because it is the redness of this apple. It exists here and now, where and while the apple exists. Likewise, this morning's rising of the sun would be a different property than any other morning's rising of the sun. If so, then the view that events are properties becomes compatible with the view that they are spatiotemporally located. An event would just be a particularized property located at some region of space-time [Bennett 1996]. (Once again, this conception is closely related to the conception of events as property exemplifications, although the term ‘exemplification’ suggests a construal of properties as universals. Some authors actually identify the two conceptions [Bennett 1988]; others reject the identification on account of the difference between property instances and property exemplifications [Macdonald 1989].)

A variant of the trope conception construes events as trope sequences [Campbell 1981]. However, since tropes are particulars, a sequence of tropes at a place is itself a trope, hence this variant is best regarded as a specification of what sort of tropes events are.

1.4. Events vs. Times

The intuition that events are properties of times can also be fleshed out in terms of thinner metaphysical commitments, by construing events as times cum description, i.e., as temporal instants or intervals during which certain statements hold [Van Benthem 1983]. On this view, for example, this morning's rising of the sun is identified by an ordered pair <i,φ> where i is the relevant time period (corresponding to the descriptor ‘this morning’) and φ is the sentence ‘The sun rises’. Of course, this treatment does not do justice to some of the intuitions underlying the prima facie commitments to events -- for instance, events can be perceived but times cannot [Gibson 1975]. But because of the availability of fully developed theories of intervals along with fully developed interval-based semantics [Cresswell 1979, Dowty 1979], and because of equally well worked out traditional theories of instants and instant-based semantics [Prior 1967], such accounts are especially attractive from a reductionist perspective. (A more general account would construe events as spatiotemporal regions cum description, distinguishing e.g between this morning's rising of the sun in London and its rising in Paris.)

The link between events and times has also been explored in the opposite direction, though. If events are assumed as a primitive ontological category, then one can dispense with temporal instants or intervals and construe them as derived entities. The most classical treatment of this sort proceeds by construing temporal instants as maximal sets of pairwise simultaneous (or partially simultaneous) events [Russell 1914, Whitehead 1929, Walker 1947], but other treatments are possible. For example, it has been suggested that the mathematical connection between the way events are perceived to be ordered and the underlying temporal dimension is essentially that of a free construction (in the category-theoretic sense) of linear orderings from event orderings, induced by the binary relation x wholly precedes y [Thomason 1989]. Treatments such as these provide a reduction of time in terms of relations among events and are therefore especially germane to a relational conception of time (and, more generally, of space-time). Modal variants [Forbes 1993] as well as mereological variants [Pianesi & Varzi 1996] of such views are also available.

2. Types of Events

2.1 Activities, Accomplishments, Achievements, and States

Philosophers who agree with a conception of events as particulars typically distinguish different sorts of such particulars. A classic typology distinguishes four sorts: activities, accomplishments, achievements, and states [Ryle 1949, Vendler 1957]. An activity, such as John's walking uphill, is a homogeneous event: its sub-events satisfy the same description as the activity itself and has no natural finishing point or culmination. An accomplishment, such as John's climbing the mountain, may have a culmination, but is never homogeneous. An achievement, such as John's reaching the top, is a culminating event (and is therefore always instantaneous). And a state, such as John's knowing the shortest way, is homogeneous and may extend over time, but it makes no sense to ask how long it took or whether it culminated. Sometimes accomplishments and achievements are grouped together into a single category of performances [Kenny 1963]. Sometimes achievements have also been called events tout court and all other events have been grouped together into a broadly understood category of temporally extended entities, called processes [Ingarden 1935]; the word ‘eventuality’ may then be used as a label covering both categories [Bach 1986].

Some authors introduce aspectual considerations into the taxonomy, drawing on Aristotle's distinction between Energeia and Kinêsis [Ackrill 1965]. The idea is that different verbs describe different types of events: verbs with no continuous form (‘know’) correspond to states; verbs with continuous form for which the present continuous entails the past perfect (‘John is walking uphill’ entails ‘John walked uphill’) correspond to activities; and verbs for which the present continuous entails the negation of the past perfect (‘John is climbing the mountain’ entails ‘John has not (yet) climbed the mountain’, at least in the relevant context) correspond to performances [Mourelatos 1978]. Several authors have followed in these footsteps to develop linguistically sophisticated theories [Taylor 1977, Dowty 1979, Bach 1981, Galton 1984, Verkuyl 1989], but the legitimacy of drawing ontological categorizations from such linguistic distinctions has been questioned [Gill 1993].

2.2 Static and Dynamic Events

One may want to distinguish between dynamic events, such as John's walk, and static events, such as John's rest under a tree. According to some authors, the latter are not events proper because they do not involve any change [Ducasse 1926]. In the most abstract construal, a change is an ordered pair of facts: the fact that obtains prior to the change and the fact that obtains after the change took place [von Wright 1963]. More substantial accounts of events as changes describe them as the exemplifications of dynamic properties, i.e., properties that an object has by virtue of a "movement" in some quality space [Lombard 1979]. However, the question of whether all events should be or involve changes of some sort has been found by most authors to be ultimately a matter of conceptual stipulation -- hence of little metaphysical import.

If static events are admitted, the question arises of whether they should be kept distinct from states [Parsons 1989]. One plausible assumption is that the distinction between the static and the dynamic aspects of the world is skew to the distinction between states and activities. As there may be static activities, so there may be dynamic states. Walking is a state of John's that is dynamic, as opposed to his state of resting, which is static. The walk itself is an activity of John's that is dynamic, as opposed to the rest John takes, which can be considered a static activity.

2.3 Actions and Bodily Movements

Prima facie, actions are categorized as a subclass of events, namely, animate events. Like all events, actions are said to occur or take place, not to exist, and their relation to time and space is event-like as well: they have relatively clear beginnings and endings but unclear spatial boundaries, they appear to tolerate co-location, and they cannot be said to move from one place to another or to endure from one time to another, but rather extend in space and time by having spatial as well as temporal parts [Thomson 1977]. Actions and events appear to be homogeneous in causal explanations, too: actions can be causes of which events are effects [Davidson 1967b]. Some authors, however, prefer to draw a distinction here and to treat actions as relations between agents and events, namely as instances of the relation of ‘bringing about’ that may hold between an agent and an event [von Wright 1963, Chisholm 1964, Bach 1980]. On such views, actions are not individuals unless relations are themselves construed as tropes.

Whether or not actions are treated as events, one might be tempted to distinguish between actions proper (such as John's raising his arm) and bodily movements (such as John's arm rising), or between intentional actions (John's walk) and unintentional ones (John's falling into a hole). For some authors this is necessary in order to explain important facts of human behavior [Brand 1984, Mele 1997]. However, it has been argued that such a distinction does not pertain to metaphysics but rather to the conceptual apparatus by means of which we describe the realm of things that happen. On this view, an arm raising is just an arm's rising under a mentalistic description [Anscombe 1957, 1979].

2.4 Mental and Physical Events

A similar story applies to the distinction between mental events (John's decision to wear boots) and physical or physiological events (such and such neurons firing). One may think that this distinction is real insofar as the latter events are expected to fall naturally into the nomological net of physical theory whereas the former seem to escape it. But one may also want to resist this line of thought and maintain that the distinction between the mental and the physical concerns exclusively the vocabulary with which we describe what goes on. These options have important ramifications for various issues philosophy of mind -- e.g., issues of mental causation [Heil & Mele 1993]. If the distinction between mental and physical events is ontologically significant, then the question arises of how they causally interact with each other, leading to various forms of anomalous or nomological dualism [Foster 1991]. By contrast, the claim that the distinction is purely semantic is congenial to a monist position, whether nomological (e.g., reductive materialism) or anomalous [Macdonald 1989]. Anomalous monism has been popular especially among philosophers who accept a particularist conception of events as widely redescribable entities, for such a conception allows one to accept the materialist claim that all events are physical (regardless of whether one describes them in mentalistic terms) while rejecting the seeming consequence that mental goings-on can be given purely physical explanations (precisely because only a physicalistic vocabulary is suited to such an explanation, so that it is only under its physical description that a mental event can be seen to enter into causal relations) [Nagel 1965, Davidson 1970, 1993]. Some authors, however, have argued that this line of argument falls prey to the charge of epiphenomenalism [Honderich 1982, Kim 1993] and on such matters the debate is still quite open.

3. Existence, Identity, and Indeterminacy

As mentioned in the Introduction, one finds a prima facie commitment to events in various aspects of human perception, action, language, and thought. The main line of argument offered to back this commitment up, however, comes from considerations of logical form. Not only does ordinary talk involve explicit reference to and quantification over events, as when one says that John's walk was pleasant or that two explosions were heard last night. Ordinary talk also seems to advert implicitly to events through adverbial modification [Reichenbach 1947]. We say that Brutus stabbed Caesar with a knife. If this statement is taken to assert that a certain three-place relation obtains among Brutus, Caesar, and a knife, then it is hard to explain why our statement entails that Brutus stabbed Caesar (a statement that involves a different, two-place relation) [Kenny 1963]. By contrast, if we take our statement to assert that a certain event occurred (namely, a stabbing of Caesar by Brutus) and that it had a certain property (namely, of being done with a knife), then the entailment is straightforward [Davidson 1967a]. These reasons do not constitute a proof that there are such entities as events. But they are telling insofar as one is interested in an account of how it is that certain statements mean what they mean, where the meaning of a statement is at least in part determined by its logical relations to other statements. For another example, it has been argued that singular causal statements cannot be analyzed in terms of a causal connective (essentially for reasons having to do with the above mentioned slingshot argument) but rather require that causation be treated as a binary relation holding between individual events [Davidson 1967b]. Still a third example involves the semantics of perceptual reports with naked infinitive complements, as in ‘John saw Mary cry’, which is analyzed as ‘John saw an event which was a crying by Mary’ [Higginbotham 1983]. Many more such arguments have been offered, also by authors working within different programs in linguistics [Parsons 1990, Schein 1993, Rothstein 1998, Link 1998, Higginbotham et al. 2000, Tenny & Pustejovsky, 2000].

On the other hand, some philosophers have been dissatisfied with this sort of "existential proof" and have argued instead that all talk that seems to involve explicit or implicit reference to or quantification over events can be paraphrased so as to avoid the commitment. For example, it has been argued that a term such as ‘John's walk’ goes proxy for the corresponding statement ‘John walked’ [Geach 1965], so to say that John's walk was pleasant is just to say that John walked pleasantly. Similar paraphrases have been offered to deal with the case of explicit quantifier-phrases such as ‘two explosions’ as well as with the implicit event quantification that lies behind adverb-dropping inferences [Clark 1970], singular causal statements [Horgan 1978], and so on. On the face of it, it appears that questions of logical form leave the existential issue undecided, at least insofar as an event-committing analysis automatically turns into an eliminativist paraphrase when read in the opposite direction (and vice versa).

Another issue that appears to be undecided is that of identity criteria, which has been the focus of an intense debate [Pfeifer 1989]. Is John's walk the same event as his pleasant walk? Was Brutus's stabbing of Caesar the same event as his killing of Caesar? Was it the same as the violent assassination of Caesar? Some philosophers take these to be metaphysical questions -- questions whose answers call for identity criteria, which must be provided before we are allowed to take our event talk seriously. Different conceptions of events tend to suggest different answers, and widely varying ones. At one extreme we find the radical "unifiers" (who take events to be as coarse-grained as objects [Quine 1950]), at the other the radical "multipliers" (who take events to be as fine-grained as facts [Kim 1966]). Other philosophers, however, regard questions of identity to be first and foremost semantic questions -- questions about the way we talk and about what we say. No metaphysical theory, it is said, can settle the semantics of ordinary event talk, hence there is no way of determining the truth or falsity of an event identity statement exclusively on the basis of one's metaphysical views. Which events a statement speaks of depends heavily (more heavily than with ordinary material objects) on local context and unprincipled intuitions [Bennett 1988]. If so, the whole identity issue is undecidable, since one is demanding metaphysical answers to questions that are in large part semantical.

4. Conclusion

One could take the massive indeterminacy that seems to surround the existence and identity issues to be evidence that systematic theorizing about events is impossible. On the other hand, it is not clear that the indeterminacy is any worse in the case of events than in the case of objects, and we seem able to theorize in a systematic fashion about them [Lombard 1998]. If that is right, then the indeterminacy in our event concept would seem to be no fatal hindrance to the development of systematic theorizing about events.




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action | anomalous monism | causation: the metaphysics of | Davidson, Donald | dualism | epiphenomenalism | facts | identity theory of mind | logical form | mental causation | supervenience | tropes