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Absolute and Relational Theories of Space and Motion

First published Fri Aug 11, 2006

Since antiquity, natural philosophers have struggled to comprehend the nature of three tightly interconnected concepts: space, time, and motion. A proper understanding of motion, in particular, has been seen to be crucial for deciding questions about the natures of space and time, and their interconnections. Since the time of Newton and Leibniz, philosophers’ struggles to comprehend these concepts have often appeared to take the form of a dispute between absolute conceptions of space, time and motion, and relational conceptions. This article guides the reader through some of the history of these philosophical struggles. Rather than taking sides in the (alleged) ongoing debates, or reproducing the standard dialectic recounted in most introductory texts, we have chosen to scrutinize carefully the history of the thinking of the canonical participants in these debates — principally Descartes, Newton, Leibniz, Mach and Einstein. Readers interested in following up either the historical questions or current debates about the natures of space, time and motion will find ample links and references scattered through the discussion and in the Other Internet Resources section below.

1. Introduction

Things change. A platitude perhaps, but still a crucial feature of the world, and one which causes many philosophical perplexities — see for instance the entry on Zeno's Paradoxes. For Aristotle, motion (he would have called it ‘locomotion’) was just one kind of change, like generation, growth, decay, fabrication and so on. The atomists held on the contrary that all change was in reality the motion of atoms into new configurations, an idea that was not to begin to realize its full potential until the Seventeenth Century, particularly in the work of Descartes. (Of course, modern physics seems to show that the physical state of a system goes well beyond the geometrical configuration of bodies. Fields, while determined by the states of bodies, are not themselves configurations of bodies if interpreted literally, and in quantum mechanics bodies have ‘internal states' such as particle spin.)

While not all changes seem to be merely the (loco)motions of bodies in physical space. Yet since antiquity, in the western tradition, this kind of motion has been absolutely central to the understanding of change. And since motion is a crucial concept in physical theories, one is forced to address the question of what exactly it is. The question might seem trivial, for surely what is usually meant by saying that something is moving is to say that it is moving relative to something, often tacitly understood between speakers. For instance: the car is moving at 60mph (relative to the road and things along it), the plane is flying (relative) to London, the rocket is lifting off (the ground), or the passenger is moving (to the front of the speeding train). Typically the relative reference body is either the surroundings of the speakers, or the Earth, but this is not always the case. For instance, it seems to make sense to ask whether the Earth rotates about its axis West-East diurnally or whether it is instead the heavens that rotate East-West; but if all motions are to be reckoned relative to the Earth, then its rotation seems impossible. But if the Earth does not offer a unique frame of reference for the description of motion, then we may wonder whether any arbitrary object can be used for the definition of motions: are all such motions on a par, none privileged over any other? It is unclear whether anyone has really, consistently espoused this view: Aristotle, perhaps, in the Metaphysics; Descartes and Leibniz are often thought to have but, as we'll see, those claims are suspect; possibly Huygens, though his remarks remain cryptic; Mach at some moments perhaps. If this view were correct, then the question of whether the Earth or heavens rotate would be meaningless, merely different but equivalent expressions of the facts.

But suppose, like Aristotle, you take ordinary language accurately to reflect the structure of the world, then you could recognize systematic everyday uses of ‘up’ and ‘down’ that require some privileged standards — uses that treat things closer to a point at the center of the Earth as more ‘down’ and motions towards that point as ‘downwards'. Of course we would likely explain this usage in terms of the fact that we and our language evolved in a very noticeable gravitational field directed towards the center of the Earth, but for Aristotle, as we shall see, this usage helped identify an important structural feature of the universe, which itself was required for the explanation of weight. Now a further question arises: how should a structure, such as a preferred point in the universe, which privileges certain motions, be understood? What makes that point privileged? One might expect that Aristotle simply identified it with the center of the Earth, and so relative to that particular body; but in fact he did not adopt that tacit convention as fundamental, for he thought it possible for the Earth to move from the ‘down’ point. Thus the question arises (although Aristotle does not address it explicitly) of whether the preferred point is somewhere picked out in some other way by the bodies in the universe —the center of the heavens perhaps? Or is it picked out quite independently of the arrangements of matter?

The issues that arise in this simple theory help frame the debates between later physicists and philosophers concerning the nature of motion; in particular, we will focus on the theories of Descartes, Newton, Leibniz, Mach and Einstein, and their interpretations. But similar issues circulate through the different contexts: is there any kind of privileged sense of motion, a sense in which things can be said to move or not, not just relative to this or that reference body, but ‘truly’? If so, can this true motion be analyzed in terms of motions relative to other bodies — to some special body, or to the entire universe perhaps? (And in relativity, in which distances, times and measures of relative motion are frame-dependent, what relations are relevant?) If not, then how is the privileged kind of motion to be understood, as relative to space itself — something physical but non-material — perhaps? Or can some kinds of motion be best understood as not being spatial changes — changes of relative location or of place — at all?

2. Aristotle

To see that the problem of the interpretation of spatiotemporal quantities as absolute or relative is endemic to almost any kind of mechanics one can imagine, we can look to one of the simplest theories — Aristotle's account of natural motion (e.g., On the Heavens I.2). According to this theory it is because of their natures, and not because of ‘unnatural’ forces, that that heavy bodies move down, and ‘light’ things (air and fire) move up; it is their natures, or ‘forms’, that constitute the gravity or weight of the former and the levity of the latter. This account only makes sense if ‘up’ and ‘down’ can be unequivocally determined for each body. According to Aristotle, up and down are fixed by the position of the body in question relative to the center of the universe, a point coincident with the center of the Earth. That is, the theory holds that heavy bodies naturally move towards the center, while light bodies naturally move away.

Does this theory involve absolute or merely relative quantities? It depends on how the center is conceived. If the center were identified with the center of the Earth, then the theory could be taken to eschew absolute quantities: it would simply hold that the natural motions of any body depend on its position relative to another, namely the Earth. But Aristotle is explicit that the center of the universe is not identical with, but merely coincident with the center of the Earth (e.g., On the Heavens II.14): since the Earth itself is heavy, if it were not at the center it would move there! So the center is not identified with any body, and so perhaps direction-to-center is an absolute quantity in the theory, not understood fundamentally as direction to some body (merely contingently as such if some body happens to occupy the center). But this conclusion is not clear either. In On the Heavens II.13, admittedly in response to a different issue, Aristotle suggests that the center itself is ‘determined’ by the outer spherical shell of the universe (the aetherial region of the fixed stars). If this is what he intends, then the natural law prescribes motion relative to another body after all — namely up or down with respect to the mathematical center of the stars.

It would be to push Aristotle's writings too hard to suggest that he was consciously wrestling with the issue of whether mechanics required absolute or relative quantities of motion, but what is clear is that these questions arise in his physics and his remarks impinge on them. His theory also gives a simple model of how these questions arise: a physical theory of motion will say that ‘under such-and-such circumstances, motion of so-and-so a kind will occur’ — and the question of whether that kind of motion makes sense in terms of the relations between bodies alone arises automatically. Aristotle may not have recognized the question explicitly, but we see it as one issue in the background of his discussion of the center.

3. Descartes

The issues are, however, far more explicit in Descartes' physics; and since the form of his theory is different the ‘kinds of motion’ in question are quite different — as they change with all the different theories that we discuss. For Descartes argued in his 1644 Principles of Philosophy (see Book II) that the essence of matter was extension (i.e., size and shape) because any other attribute of bodies could be imagined away without imagining away matter itself. But he also held that extension constitutes the nature of space, hence he concluded that space and matter were one and the same thing. An immediate consequence of the identification is the impossibility of the vacuum; if every region of space is a region of matter, then there can be no space without matter. Thus Descartes' universe is ‘hydrodynamical’ — completely full of mobile matter of in different sized pieces in motion, rather like a bucket full of water and lumps of ice of different sizes, which has been stirred around. Since fundamentally the pieces of matter are nothing but extension, the universe is in fact nothing but a system of geometric bodies in motion without any gaps. (Descartes held that all other properties arise from the configurations and motions of such bodies — from geometric complexes. See Garber 1992 for a comprehensive study.)

3.1 The Nature of Motion

The identification of space and matter poses a puzzle about motion: if the space that a body occupies literally is the matter of the body, then when the body — i.e., the matter — moves, so does the space that it occupies. Thus it doesn't change place, which is should be to say that it doesn't move after all! Descartes resolved this difficulty by taking all motion to be the motion of bodies relative to one another, not a literal change of space.

Now, a body has as many relative motions as there are bodies but it does not follow that all are equally significant. Indeed, Descartes uses several different concepts of relational motion. First there is ‘change of place’, which is nothing but motion relative to this or that arbitrary reference body (II.13). In this sense no motion of a body is privileged, since the speed, direction, and even curve of a trajectory depends on the reference body, and none is singled out. Next, he discusses motion in ‘the ordinary sense’ (II.24). This is often conflated with mere change of arbitrary place, but it in fact differs because according to the rules of ordinary speech one properly attributes motion only to bodies whose motion is caused by some action, not to any relative motion. (For instance, a person sitting on a speeding boat is ordinarily said to be at rest, since ‘he feels no action in himself’.) Finally, he defined motion ‘properly speaking’ (II.25) to be a body's motion relative to the matter contiguously surrounding it, which the impossibility of a vacuum guarantees to exist. (Descartes’ definition is complicated by the fact that he modifies this technical concept to make it conform more closely to the pre-theoretical sense of ‘motion’; however, in our discussion transference is all that matters, so we will ignore those complications.) Since a body can only be touching one set of surroundings, Descartes (dubiously) argued that this standard of motion was unique.

What we see here is that Descartes, despite holding motion to be the motion of bodies relative to one another, also held there to be a privileged sense of motion; in a terminology sometimes employed by writers of the period, he held there to be a sense of ‘true motion’, over and above the merely relative motions. Equivalently, we can say that Descartes took motion (‘properly speaking’) to be a complete predicate: that is, moves-properly-speaking is a one-place predicate. (In contrast, moves-relative-to is a two-place predicate.) And note that the predicate is complete despite the fact that it is analyzed in terms of relative motion. (Formally, let contiguous-surroundings be a function from bodies to their contiguous surroundings, then x moves-properly-speaking is analyzed as x moves-relative-to contiguous-surroundings(x).)

This example illustrates why it is crucial to keep two questions distinct: on the one hand, is motion to be understood in terms of relations between bodies or by invoking something additional, something absolute; on the other hand, are all relative motions equally significant, or is there some ‘true’, privileged notion of motion? Descartes' views show that eschewing absolute motion is logically compatible with accepting true motion; which is of course not to say that his definitions of motion are themselves tenable.

3.2 Motion and Dynamics

There is an interpretational tradition which holds that Descartes only took the first, ‘ordinary’ sense of motion seriously, and introduced the second notion to avoid conflict with the Catholic Church. Such conflict was a real concern, since the censure of Galileo's Copernicanism took place only 11 years before publication of the Principles, and had in fact dissuaded Descartes from publishing an earlier work, The World. Indeed, in the Principles (III.28) he is at pains to explain how ‘properly speaking’ the Earth does not move, because it is swept around the Sun in a giant vortex of matter — the Earth does not move relative to its surroundings in the vortex.

The difficulty with the reading, aside from the imputation of cowardice to the old soldier, is that it makes nonsense of Descartes' mechanics, a theory of collisions. For instance, according to his laws of collision if two equal bodies strike each other at equal and opposite velocities then they will bounce off at equal and opposite velocities (Rule I). On the other hand, if the very same bodies approach each other with the very same relative speed, but at different speeds then they will move off together in the direction of the faster one (Rule III). But if the operative meaning of motion in the Rules is the ordinary sense, then these two situations are just the same situation, differing only in the choice of reference frame, and so could not have different outcomes — bouncing apart versus moving off together. It seems inconceivable that Descartes could have been confused in such a trivial way. (Additionally, as Pooley 2002 points out, just after he claims that the Earth is at rest ‘properly speaking’, Descartes argues that the Earth is stationary in the ordinary sense, because common practice is to determine the positions of the stars relative to the Earth. Descartes simply didn't need motion properly speaking to avoid religious conflict, which again suggests that it has some other significance in his system of thought.)

Thus Garber (1992, Chapter 6-8) proposes that Descartes actually took the unequivocal notion of motion properly speaking to be the correct sense of motion in mechanics. Then Rule I covers the case in which the two bodies have equal and opposite motions relative to their contiguous surroundings, while Rule VI covers the case in which the bodies have different motions relative to those surroundings — one is perhaps at rest in its surroundings. That is, exactly what is needed to make the rules consistent is the kind of privileged, true, sense of motion provided by Descartes' second definition. Insurmountable problems with the rules remain, but rejecting the traditional interpretation and taking motion properly speaking seriously in Descartes' philosophy clearly gives a more charitable reading.

4. Newton

4.1 Newton Against the Cartesian Account of Motion — The Bucket

In an unpublished essay — De Gravitatione (Newton, 2004) — and in a Scholium to the definitions given in his 1687 Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy (see Newton, 1999 for an up-to-date translation), Newton attacked both of Descartes' notions of motion as candidates for the operative notion in mechanics. (see Stein 1967and Rynasiewicz 1995 for important, and differing, views on the issue.) (This critique is studied in more detail in the entry Newton's views on space, time, and motion.)

The most famous argument invokes the so-called ‘Newton's bucket’ experiment. Stripped to its basic elements one compares:

  1. a bucket of water hanging from a cord as the bucket is set spinning about the cord's axis, with
  2. the same bucket and water when they are rotating at the same rate about the cord's axis.

As is familiar from any rotating system, there will be a tendency for the water to recede from the axis of rotation in the latter case: in (i) the surface of the water will be flat (because of the Earth's gravitational field) while in (ii) it will be concave. The analysis of such ‘inertial effects' due to rotation was a major topic of enquiry of ‘natural philosophers' of the time, including Descartes and his followers, and they would certainly have agreed with Newton that the concave surface of the water in the second case demonstrated that the water was moving in a mechanically significant sense. There is thus an immediate problem for the claim that proper motion is the correct mechanical sense of motion: in (i) and (ii) proper motion is anti-correlated with the mechanically significant motion revealed by the surface of the water. That is, the water is flat in (i) when it is in motion relative to its immediate surroundings — the inner sides of the bucket — but curved in (ii) when it is at rest relative to its immediate surroundings. Thus the mechanically relevant meaning of rotation is not that of proper motion. (You may have noticed a small lacuna in Newton's argument: in (i) the water is at rest and in (ii) in motion relative to that part of its surroundings constituted by the air above it. It's not hard to imagine small modifications to the example to fill this gap.)

Newton also points out that the height that the water climbs up the inside of the bucket provides a measure of the rate of rotation of bucket and water: the higher the water rises up the sides, the greater the tendency to recede must be, and so the faster the water must be rotating in the mechanically significant sense. But supposing, very plausibly, that the measure is unique, that any particular height indicates a particular rate of rotation. Then the unique height that the water reaches at any moment implies a unique rate of rotation in a mechanically significant sense. And thus motion in the sense of motion relative to an arbitrary reference body, is not the mechanical sense, since that kind of rotation is not unique at all, but depends on the motion of the reference body. And so Descartes’ change of place (and for similar reasons, motion in the ordinary sense) is not the mechanically significant sense of motion.

4.2 Absolute Space and Motion

In our discussion of Descartes we called the sense of motion operative in the science of mechanics ‘true motion’, and the phrase is used in this way by Newton in the Scholium. Thus Newton's bucket shows that true (rotational) motion is anti-correlated with, and so not identical with, proper motion (as Descartes proposed according to the Garber reading); and Newton further argues that the rate of true (rotational) motion is unique, and so not identical with change of place, which is multiple. Newton proposed instead that true motion is motion relative to a temporally enduring, rigid, 3-dimensional Euclidean space, which he dubbed ‘absolute space’. Of course, Descartes also defined motion as relative to an enduring 3-dimensional Euclidean space; the difference is that Descartes space was divided into parts (his space was identical with a plenum of corpuscles) in motion, not a rigid structure in which (mobile) material bodies are embedded. So according to Newton, the rate of true rotation of the bucket (and water) is the rate at which it rotates relative to absolute space. Or put another way, Newton effectively defines the complete predicate x moves-absolutely as x moves-relative-to absolute space; both Newton and Descartes offer the competing complete predicates as analyses of x moves-truly.

4.2.1 Absolute Space vs. Galilean Relativity

Newton's proposal for understanding motion solves the problems that he posed for Descartes, and provides an interpretation of the concepts of constant motion and acceleration that appear in his laws of motion. However, it suffers from two notable interpretational problems, both of which were pressed forcefully by Leibniz (in the Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence, 1715–1716) — which is not to say that Leibniz himself offered a superior account of motion (see below). (Of course, there are other features of Newton's proposal that turned out to be empirically inadequate, and are rejected by relativity: Newton's account violates the relativity of simultaneity and postulates a non-dynamical spacetime structure.) First, according to this account, absolute velocity is a well-defined quantity: more simply, the absolute speed of a body is the rate of change of its position relative to an arbitrary point of absolute space. But the Galilean relativity of Newton's laws mean that the evolution of a closed system is unaffected by constant changes in velocity; Galileo's experimenter cannot determine from observations inside his cabin whether the boat is at rest in harbor or sailing smoothly. Put another way, according to Newtonian mechanics, in principle Newton's absolute velocity cannot be experimentally determined. So in this regard absolute velocity is quite unlike acceleration (including rotation); Newtonian acceleration is understood in absolute space as the rate of change of absolute velocity, and is, according to Newtonian mechanics, in general measurable, for instance by measuring the height that the water ascends the sides of the bucket. (It is worth noting that Newton was well-aware of these facts; the Galilean relativity of his theory is demonstrated in Corollary V of the laws of the Principia, while Corollary VI shows that acceleration is unobservable if all parts of the system accelerate in parallel at the same rate, as they do in a homogeneous gravitational field.) Leibniz argued (rather inconsistently, as we shall see) that since differences in absolute velocity were unobservable, they could not be genuine differences at all; and hence that Newton's absolute space, whose existence would entail the reality of such differences, must also be a fiction. Few contemporary philosophers would immediately reject a quantity as meaningless simply because it was not experimentally determinable, but this fact does justify genuine doubts about the reality of absolute velocity, and hence of absolute space.

4.2.2 The Ontology of Absolute Space

The second problem concerns the nature of absolute space. Newton quite clearly distinguished his account from Descartes' — in particular with regards to absolute space's rigidity versus Descartes' ‘hydrodynamical’ space, and the possibility of the vacuum in absolute space. Thus absolute space is definitely not material. On the other hand, presumably it is supposed to be part of the physical, not mental, realm. In De Gravitatione, Newton rejected both the standard philosophical categories of substance and attribute as suitable characterizations. Absolute space is not a substance for it lacks causal powers and does not have a fully independent existence, and yet not an attribute since it would exist even in a vacuum, which by definition is a place where there are no bodies in which it might inhere. Newton proposes that space is what we might call a ‘pseudo-substance’, more like a substance than property, yet not quite a substance. (Note that Samuel Clarke, in his Correspondence with Leibniz, which Newton had some role in composing, advocates the property view, and note further that when Leibniz objects because of the vacuum problem, Clarke suggests that there might be non-material beings in the vacuum in which space might inhere.) In fact, Newton accepted the principle that everything that exists, exists somewhere — i.e., in absolute space. Thus he viewed absolute space as a necessary consequence of the existence of anything, and of God's existence in particular — hence space's ontological dependence. Leibniz was presumably unaware of the unpublished De Gravitatione in which these particular ideas were developed, but as we shall see, his later works are characterized by a robust rejection of any notion of space as a real thing rather than an ideal, purely mental entity. This is a view that attracts even fewer contemporary adherents, but there is something deeply peculiar about a non-material but physical entity, a worry that has influenced many philosophical opponents of absolute space.

5. Absolute Space in the Twentieth Century

5.1 The Spacetime Approach

After the development of relativity (which we will take up below), and its interpretation as a spacetime theory, it was realized that the notion of spacetime had applicability to a range of theories of mechanics, classical as well as relativistic. In particular, there is a spacetime geometry — ‘Galilean’ or ‘neo-Newtonian’ spacetime — for Newtonian mechanics that solves the problem of absolute velocity; an idea exploited by a number of philosophers from the late 1960s (e.g., Earman 1970, Friedman 1983, Sklar 1974 and Stein 1968). For details the reader is referred to the entry on spacetime: inertial frames, but the general idea is that although a spatial distance is well-defined between any two simultaneous points of this spacetime, only the temporal interval is well-defined between non-simultaneous points. Thus things are rather unlike Newton's absolute space, whose points persist through time and maintain their distances; in absolute space the distance between p-now and q-then (where p and q are points) is just the distance between p-now and q-now. However, Galilean spacetime has an ‘affine connection’ which effectively specifies for every point of every continuous curve, the rate at which the curve is changing from straightness at that point; for instance, the straight lines are picked out as those curves whose rate of change from straightness is zero at every point. (Another way of thinking about this space is as possessing — in addition to a distance between any two simultaneous points and a temporal interval between any points — a three-place relation of colinearity, satisfied by three points just in case they lie on a straight line.)

Since the trajectories of bodies are curves in spacetime the affine connection determines the rate of change from straightness at every point of every possible trajectory. The straight trajectories thus defined can be interpreted as the trajectories of bodies moving inertially, and the rate of change from straightness of any trajectory can be interpreted as the acceleration of a body following that trajectory. That is, Newton's Second Law can be given a geometric formulation as ‘the rate of change from straightness of a body's trajectory is equal to the forces acting on the body divided by its mass’. The significance of this geometry is that while acceleration is well-defined, velocity is not — in accord with empirically determinability of acceleration but not velocity according to Newtonian mechanics. (A simple analogy helps see how such a thing is possible: betweenness but not ‘up’ is a well-defined concept in Euclidean space.) Thus Galilean spacetime gives a very nice interpretation of the choice that nature makes when it decides that the laws of mechanics should be formulated in terms of accelerations not velocities (as Aristotle and Descartes proposed).

5.2 Substantivalism

Put another way, we can define the complete predicate x accelerates as trajectory(x) has-non-zero-rate-of-change-from-straightness, where trajectory maps bodies onto their trajectories in Galilean spacetime. And this predicate, defined this way, applies to the water in the bucket if and only if it is rotating, according to Newtonian mechanics formulated in terms of the geometry of Galilean spacetime; it is the mechanically relevant sense of the word in this theory. But all of this formulation and definition has been given in terms of the geometry of spacetime, not relations between bodies; acceleration is ‘absolute’ in the sense that there is a preferred (true) sense of acceleration in mechanics and which is not defined in terms of the motions of bodies relative to one another. (Note that this sense of ‘absolute’ is broader than that of motion relative to absolute space, which we defined earlier. In the remainder of this article we will use it in the broader sense. The reader should be aware that the term is used in many ways in the literature, and such equivocation often leads to massive misunderstandings.) Thus if any of this analysis of motion is taken literally then one arrives at a position regarding the ontology of spacetime rather like that of Newton's regarding space: it is some kind of ‘substantial’ (or maybe pseudo-substantial) thing with the geometry of Galilean spacetime, just as absolute space possessed Euclidean geometry. This view regarding the ontology of spacetime is usually called ‘substantivalism’ (Sklar, 1974). The Galilean substantivalist usually sees himself as adopting a more sophisticated geometry than Newton but sharing his substantivalism (though there is room for debate on Newton's exact ontological views, see DiSalle, 2002). The advantage of the more sophisticated geometry is that although it allows the absolute sense of acceleration apparently required by Newtonian mechanics to be defined, it does not allow one to define a similar absolute speed or velocity — x accelerates can be defined as a complete predicate in terms of the geometry of Galilean spacetime but not x moves in general — and so the first of Leibniz's problem is resolved. Of course we see that the solution depends on a crucial shift from speed and velocity to acceleration as the relevant senses of ‘motion’: from the rate of change of position to the rate of rate of change.

While this proposal solves the first kind of problem posed by Leibniz, it seems just as vulnerable to the second. While it is true that it involves the rejection of absolute space as Newton conceived it, and with it the need to explicate the nature of an enduring space, the postulation of Galilean spacetime poses the parallel question of the nature of spacetime. Again, it is a physical but non-material something, the points of which may be coincident with material bodies. What kind of thing is it? Could we do without it? As we shall see below, some contemporary philosophers believe so.

6. Leibniz

There is a ‘folk-reading’ of Leibniz that one finds either explicitly or implicitly in the philosophy of physics literature which takes account of only some of his remarks on space and motion. The reading underlies vast swathes of the literature: for instance, the quantities captured by Earman's (1999) ‘Leibnizian spacetime’, do not do justice to Leibniz's view of motion (as Earman acknowledges). But it is perhaps most obvious in introductory texts (e.g., Ray 1991, Huggett 2000 to mention a couple). According to this view, the only quantities of motion are relative quantities, relative velocity, acceleration and so on, and all relative motions are equal, so there is no true sense of motion. However, Leibniz is explicit that other quantities are also ‘real’, and his mechanics implicitly — but obviously — depends on yet others. The length of this section is a measure, not so much the importance of Leibniz's actual views, but the importance of showing what the prevalent folk view leaves out regarding Leibniz's views on the metaphysics of motion and interpretation of mechanics.

That said, we shall also see that no one has yet discovered a fully satisfactory way of reconciling the numerous conflicting things that Leibniz says about motion. Some of these tensions can be put down simply to his changing his mind (see Cover and Hartz 1988 for an explication of how Leibniz's views on space developed). However, we will concentrate on the fairly short period in the mid 1680-90s during which Leibniz developed his theory of mechanics, and was most concerned with their interpretation. We will supplement this discussion with the important remarks that he made in his Correspondence with Samuel Clarke around 30 years later (1715–1716); this discussion is broadly in line with the earlier period, and the intervening period is one in which he turned to other matters, rather than one in which his views on space were dramatically evolving.

6.1 The Ideality of Space

Arguably, Leibniz's views concerning space and motion do not have a completely linear logic, starting from some logically sufficient basic premises, but instead form a collection of mutually supporting doctrines If one starts questioning why Leibniz held certain views — concerning the ideality of space, for instance — one is apt to be led in a circle. Still, exposition requires starting somewhere, and Leibniz's argument for the ideality of space in the Correspondence with Clarke is a good place to begin. But bear in mind the caveats made here — this argument was made later than a number of other relevant writings, and its logical relation to Leibniz's views on motion is complex.

Leibniz (LV.47 — this notation means Leibniz's Fifth letter, section 47, and so on) says that (i) a body comes to have the ‘same place’ as another once did, when it comes to stand in the same relations to bodies we ‘suppose’ to be unchanged (more on this later). (ii) That we can define ‘a place’ to be that which any such two bodies have in common (here he claims an analogy with the Euclidean/Eudoxan definition of a rational number in terms of an identity relation between ratios). And finally that (iii) space is all such places taken together. However, he also holds that properties are particular, incapable of being instantiated by more than one individual, even at different times; hence it is impossible for the two bodies to be in literally the same relations to the unchanged bodies. Thus the thing that we take to be the same for the two bodies — the place — is something added by our minds to the situation, and only ideal. As a result, space, which is after all constructed from these ideal places, is itself ideal: ‘a certain order, wherein the mind conceives the application of relations’.

It's worth pausing briefly to contrast this view of space with those of Descartes and of Newton. Both Descartes and Newton claim that space is a real, mind-independent entity; for Descartes it is matter, and for Newton a ‘pseudo-substance’, distinct from matter. And of course for both, these views are intimately tied up with their accounts of motion. Leibniz simply denies the mind-independent reality of space, and this too is bound up with his views concerning motion. (Note that fundamentally, in the metaphysics of monads that Leibniz was developing contemporaneously with his mechanics, everything is in the mind of the monads; but the point that Leibniz is making here is that even within the world that is logically constructed from the contents of the minds of monads, space is ideal.)

6.2 Force and the Nature of Motion

So far (apart from that remark about ‘unchanged’ bodies) we have not seen Leibniz introduce anything more than relations of distance between bodies, which is certainly consistent with the folk view of his philosophy. However, Leibniz sought to provide a foundation for the Cartesian/mechanical philosophy in terms of the Aristotelian/scholastic metaphysics of substantial forms (here we discuss the views laid out in Sections 17-22 of the 1686 Discourse on Metaphysics and the 1695 Specimen of Dynamics, both in Garber and Ariew 1989). In particular, he identifies primary matter with what he calls its ‘primitive passive force’ of resistance to changes in motion and to penetration, and the substantial form of a body with its ‘primitive active force’. It is important to realize that these forces are not mere properties of matter, but actually constitute it in some sense, and further that they are not themselves quantifiable. However because of the collisions of bodies with one another, these forces ‘suffer limitation’, and ‘derivative’ passive and active forces result. (There's a real puzzle here. Collision presupposes space, but primitive forces constitute matter prior to any spatial concepts — the primitive active and passive forces ground motion and extension respectively. See Garber and Rauzy, 2004.) Derivative passive force shows up in the different degrees of resistance to change of different kinds of matter (of ‘secondary matter’ in scholastic terms), and apparently is measurable. Derivative active force however, is considerably more problematic for Leibniz. On the one hand, it is fundamental to his account of motion and theory of mechanics — motion fundamentally is possession of force. But on the other hand, Leibniz endorses the mechanical philosophy, which precisely sought to abolish Aristotelian substantial form, which is what force represents. Leibniz's goal was to reconcile the two philosophies, by providing an Aristotelian metaphysical foundation for modern mechanical science; as we shall see, it is ultimately an open question exactly how Leibniz intended to deal with the inherent tensions in such a view.

6.2.1 Vis Viva and True Motion

The texts are sufficiently ambiguous to permit dissent, but arguably Leibniz intends that one manifestation of derivative active force is what he calls vis viva — ‘living force’. Leibniz had a famous argument with the Cartesians over the correct definition of this quantity. Descartes defined it as size times speed — effectively as the magnitude of the momentum of a body. Leibniz gave a brilliant argument (repeated in a number of places, for instance Section 17 of the Discourse on Metaphysics) that it was size times speed2 — so (proportional to) kinetic energy. If the proposed identification is correct then kinetic energy quantifies derivative active force according to Leibniz; or looked at the other way, the quantity of virtus (another term used by Leibniz for active force) associated with a body determines its kinetic energy and hence its speed. As far as the authors know, Leibniz never explicitly says anything conclusive about the relativity of virtus, but it is certainly consistent to read him (as Roberts 2003 does) to claim that there is a unique quantity of virtus and hence ‘true’ (as we have been using the term) speed associated with each body. At the very least, Leibniz does say that there is a real difference between possession and non-possession of vis viva (e.g., in Section 18 of the Discourse) and it is a small step from there to true, privileged speed. Indeed, for Leibniz, mere change of relative position is not ‘entirely real’ (as we saw for instance in the Correspondence) and only when it has vis viva as its immediate cause is there some reality to it. (However, just to muddy the waters, Leibniz also claims that as a matter of fact, no body ever has zero force, which on the reading proposed means no body is ever at rest, which would be surprising given all the collisions bodies undergo.) An alternative interpretation to the one suggested here might say that Leibniz intends that while there is a difference between motion/virtus and no motion/virtus, there is somehow no difference between any strictly positive values of those quantities.

It is important to emphasize two points about the preceding account of motion in Leibniz's philosophy. First, motion in the everyday sense — motion relative to something else — is not really real. Fundamentally motion is possession of virtus, something that is ultimately non-spatial (modulo its interpretation as primitive force limited by collision). If this reading is right — and something along these lines seems necessary if we aren't simply to ignore important statements by Leibniz on motion — then Leibniz is offering an interpretation of motion that is radically different from the obvious understanding. One might even say that for Leibniz motion is not movement at all! (We will leave to one side the question of whether his account is ultimately coherent.) The second point is that however we should understand Leibniz, the folk reading simply does not and cannot take account of his clearly and repeatedly stated view that what is real in motion is force not relative motion, for the folk reading allows Leibniz only relative motion (and of course additionally, motion in the sense of force is a variety of true motion, again contrary to the folk reading).

6.3 Motion and Dynamics

However, from what has been said so far it is still possible that the folk reading is accurate when it comes to Leibniz's views on the phenomena of motion, the subject of his theory of mechanics. The case for the folk reading is in fact supported by Leibniz's resolution of the tension that we mentioned earlier, between the fundamental role of force/virtus (which we will now take to mean mass times speed2) and its identification with Aristotelian form. Leibniz's way out (e.g., Specimen of Dynamics) is to require that while considerations of force must somehow determine what form of the laws of motion, the laws themselves should be such as not to allow one to determine the value of the force (and hence true speed). One might conclude that in this case Leibniz held that the only quantities which can be determined are those of relative position and motion, as the folk reading says. But even in this circumscribed context, it is at best questionable whether the interpretation is correct.

6.3.1 Leibniz's Mechanics

Consider first Leibniz's mechanics. Since his laws are what is now (ironically) often called ‘Newtonian’ elastic collision theory, it seems that they satisfy both of his requirements. The laws include conservation of kinetic energy (which we identify with virtus), but they hold in all inertial frames, so the kinetic energy of any arbitrary body can be set to any initial value. But they do not permit the kinetic energy of a body to take on any values throughout a process. The laws are only Galilean relativistic, and so are not true in every frame. Furthermore, according to the laws of collision, in an inertial frame, if a body does not collide then its Leibnizian force is conserved while if (except in special cases) it does collide then its force changes. According to Leibniz's laws one cannot determine initial kinetic energies, but one certainly can tell when they change. At very least, there are quantities of motion implicit in Leibniz's mechanics — change in force and true speed — that are not merely relative; the folk reading is committed to Leibniz simply missing this obvious fact.

6.3.2 The Equivalence of Hypotheses

That said, when Leibniz discusses the relativity of motion — which he calls the ‘equivalence of hypotheses’ about the states of motion of bodies — some of his statements do suggest that he was confused in this way. For another way of stating the problem for the folk reading is that the claim that relative motions alone suffice for mechanics and that all relative motions are equal is a principle of general relativity, and could Leibniz — a mathematical genius — really have failed to notice that his laws hold only in special frames? Well, just maybe. On the one hand, when he explicitly articulates the principle of the equivalence of hypotheses (for instance in Specimen of Dynamics) he tends to say only that one cannot assign initial velocities on the basis of the outcome of a collision, which requires only Galilean relativity. However, he confusingly also claimed (On Copernicanism and the Relativity of Motion, also in Garber and Ariew 1989) that the Tychonic and Copernican hypotheses were equivalent. But if the Earth orbits the Sun in an inertial frame (Copernicus), then there is no inertial frame according to which the Sun orbits the Earth (Tycho Brahe), and vice versa: these hypotheses are simply not Galilean equivalent (something else Leibniz could hardly have failed to notice). So there is some textual support for Leibniz endorsing general relativity, as the folk reading maintains. A number of commentators have suggested solutions to the puzzle of the conflicting pronouncements that Leibniz makes on the subject, but arguably none is completely successful in reconciling all of them (Stein 1977 argues for general relativity, while Roberts 2003 argues the opposite; see also Lodge 2003).

6.4 Where Did the Folk Go Wrong?

So the folk reading simply ignores Leibniz's metaphysics of motion, it commits Leibniz to a mathematical howler regarding his laws, and it is arguable whether it is the best rendering of his pronouncements concerning relativity; it certainly cannot be accepted unquestioningly. However, it is not hard to understand the temptation of the folk reading. In his Correspondence with Clarke, Leibniz says that he believes space to be “something merely relative, as time is, … an order of coexistences, as time is an order of successions” (LIII.4), which is naturally taken to mean that space is at base nothing but the distance and temporal relations between bodies. (Though even this passage has its subtleties, because of the ideality of space discussed above, and because in Leibniz's conception space determines what sets of relations are possible.) And if relative distances and times exhaust the spatiotemporal in this way, then shouldn't all quantities of motion be defined in terms of those relations? We have seen two ways in which this would be the wrong conclusion to draw: force seems to involve a notion of speed that is not identified with any relative speed, and (unless the equivalence of hypotheses is after all a principle of general relativity) the laws pick out a standard of constant motion that need not be any constant relative motion. Of course, it is hard to reconcile these quantities with the view of space and time that Leibniz proposes — what is speed in size times speed2 or constant speed if not speed relative to some body or to absolute space? Given Leibniz's view that space is literally ideal (and indeed that even relative motion is not ‘entirely real’) perhaps the best answer is that he took force and hence motion in its real sense not to be determined by motion in a relative sense at all, but to be primitive monadic quantities. That is, he took x moves to be a complete predicate, but he believed that it could be fully analyzed in terms of strictly monadic predicates: x moves iff x possesses-non-zero-derivative-active-force. And this reading explains just what Leibniz took us to be supposing when we ‘supposed certain bodies to be unchanged’ in the construction of the idea of space: that they had no force, nothing causing, or making real any motion.

6.5 Leibniz's Response to Newton's Scholium

It's again helpful to compare Leibniz with Descartes and Newton, this time regarding motion. Commentators often express frustration at Leibniz's response to Newton's arguments for absolute space: “I find nothing … in the Scholium that proves or can prove the reality of space in itself. However, I grant that there is a difference between an absolute true motion of a body and a mere relative change …” (LV.53). Not only does Leibniz apparently fail to take the argument seriously, he then goes on to concede the step in the argument that seems to require absolute space! But with our understanding of Newton and Leibniz, we can see that what he says makes perfect sense (or at least that it is not as disingenuous as it is often taken to be). Newton argues in the Scholium that true motion cannot be identified with the kinds of motion that Descartes considers; but both of these are purely relative motions, and Leibniz is in complete agreement that merely relative motions are not true (i.e., ‘entirely real’). Leibniz's ‘concession’ merely registers his agreement with Newton against Descartes on the difference between true and relative motion; he surely understood who and what Newton was refuting, and it was a position that he had himself, in different terms, publicly argued against at length. But as we have seen, Leibniz had a very different analysis of the difference to Newton's; true motion was not, for him, a matter of motion relative to absolute space, but the possession of quantity of force, ontologically prior to any spatiotemporal quantities at all. There is indeed nothing in the Scholium explicitly directed against that view, and since it does potentially offer an alternative way of understanding true motion, it is not unreasonable for Leibniz to claim that there is no deductive inference from true motion to absolute space.

7. ‘Not-Newton’ versus ‘Be-Leibniz’

7.1 Non Sequiturs Mistakenly Attributed to Newton

The folk reading which belies Leibniz has it that he sought a theory of mechanics formulated in terms only of the relations between bodies. As we'll see presently, in the Nineteenth Century, Ernst Mach indeed proposed such an approach, but Leibniz clearly did not; though certain similarities between Leibniz and Mach — especially the rejection of absolute space — surely helps explain the confusion between the two. But not only is Leibniz often misunderstood, there are influential misreadings of Newton's arguments in the Scholium, influenced by the idea that he is addressing Leibniz in some way. Of course the Principia was written 30 years before the Correspondence, and the arguments of the Scholium were not written with Leibniz in mind, but Clarke himself suggests (CIV.13) that those arguments — specifically those concerning the bucket — are telling against Leibniz. That argument is indeed devastating to a general principle of relativity — the parity of all relative motions — but we have seen that it is highly questionable whether Leibniz's equivalence of hypotheses amount to such a view. That said, his statements in the first four letters of the Correspondence could understandably mislead Clarke on this point — it is in reply to Clarke's challenge that Leibniz explicitly denies the parity of relative motions. But interestingly, Clarke does not present a true version of Newton's argument — despite some involvement of Newton in writing the replies. Instead of the argument from the uniqueness of the rate of rotation, he argues that systems with different velocities must be different because the effects observed if they were brought to rest would be different. This argument is of course utterly question begging against a view that holds that there is no privileged standard of rest!

As we discuss in Section 8, Mach attributed to Newton the fallacious argument that because the surface of the water curved even when it was not in motion relative to the bucket, it must be rotating relative to absolute space. Our discussion of Newton showed how misleading such a reading is. In the first place he also argues that there must be some privileged sense of rotation, and hence not all relative motions are equal. Second, the argument is ad hominem against Descartes, in which context a disjunctive syllogism — motion is either proper or ordinary or relative to absolute space — is argumentatively legitimate. On the other hand, Mach is quite correct that Newton's argument in the Scholium leaves open the logical possibility that the privileged, true sense of rotation (and acceleration more generally) is some species of relative motion; if not motion properly speaking, then relative to the fixed stars perhaps. (In fact Newton rejects this possibility in De Gravitatione (1962) on the grounds that it would involve an odious action at a distance; an ironic position given his theory of universal gravity.)

7.2 The Best Explanation Argument Mistakenly Attributed to Newton

However the kind of folk-reading of Newton that underlies much of the contemporary literature replaces Mach's interpretation with a more charitable one. According to this reading, Newton's point is that his mechanics — unlike Descartes' — could explain why the surface of the rotating water is curved, that his explanation involves a privileged sense of rotation, and that absent an alternative hypothesis about its relative nature, we should accept absolute space. But our discussion of Newton's argument showed that it simply does not have an ‘abductive’, ‘best explanation’ form, but shows deductively, from Cartesian premises, that rotation is neither proper nor ordinary motion.

That is not to say that Newton had no understanding of how such effects would be explained in his mechanics. For instance, in Corollaries 5 and 6 to the Definitions of the Principles he states in general terms the conditions under which different states of motion are not — and so by implication are — discernible according to his laws of mechanics. Nor is it to say that Newton's contemporaries weren't seriously concerned with explaining inertial effects. Leibniz, for instance, analyzed a rotating body (in the Specimen). In short, parts of a rotating system collide with the surrounding matter and are continuously deflected, into a series of linear motions that form a curved path. But the system as Leibniz envisions it — comprised of a plenum of elastic particles of matter — is far too complex for him to offer any quantitative model based on this qualitative picture. (In the context of the proposed ‘abductive’ reading of Newton, note that this point is telling against a rejection of intrinsic rigidity or forces acting at a distance, not narrow relationism; it is the complexity of collisions in a plenum that stymies analysis. And since Leibniz's collision theory requires a standard of inertial motion, even if he had explained inertial effects, he would not have thereby shown that all motions are relative, much less that all are equal.)

7.3 Substantivalism and The Best Explanation Argument

7.3.1 The Rotating Spheres

Although the argument is then not Newton's, it is still an important response to the kind of relationism proposed by the folk-Leibniz, especially when it is extended by bringing in a further example from Newton's Scholium. Newton considered a pair of identical spheres, connected by a cord, too far from any bodies to observe any relative motions; he pointed out that their rate and direction of rotation could still be experimentally determined by measuring the tension in the rod, and by pushing on opposite faces of the two globes to see whether the tension increased or decreased. He intended this simple example to demonstrate that the project he intended in the Principia, of determining the absolute accelerations and hence gravitational forces on the planets from their relative motions, was possible. However, if we further specify that the spheres and cord are rigid and that they are the only things in their universe, then the example can be used to point out that there are infinitely many different rates of rotation all of which agree on the relations between bodies. Since there are no differences in the relations between bodies in the different situations, it follows that the observable differences between the states of rotation cannot be explained in terms of the relations between bodies. Therefore, a theory of the kind attributed to the folk's Leibniz cannot explain all the phenomena of Newtonian mechanics, and again we can argue abductively for absolute space. (Of course, the argument works by showing that, granted the different states of rotation, there are states of rotation that cannot merely be relative rotations of any kind; for the differences cannot be traced to any relational differences. That is, granted the assumptions of the argument, rotation is not true relative motion of any kind.)

This argument (neither the premises nor conclusion) is not Newton's, and must not be taken as a historically accurate reading, However, that is not to say that the argument is fallacious, and indeed many have found it attractive, particularly as a defense not of Newton's absolute space, but of Galilean spacetime. That is, Newtonian mechanics with Galilean spacetime can explain the phenomena associated with rotation, while theories of the kind proposed by Mach cannot explain the differences between situations allowed by Newtonian mechanics, but these explanations rely on the geometric structure of Galilean spacetime — particularly its connection, to interpret acceleration. And thus — the argument goes — those explanations commit us to the reality of spacetime — a manifold of points — whose properties include the appropriate geometric ones. This final doctrine, of the reality of spacetime with its component points or regions, distinct from matter, with geometric properties, is what we earlier identified as ‘substantivalism’.

7.3.2 Relationist Responses

There are two points to make about this line of argument. First, the relationist could reply that he need not explain all situations which are possible according to Newtonian mechanics, because that theory is to be rejected in favor of one which invokes only distance and time relations between bodies, but which approximates to Newton's if matter is distributed suitably. Such a relationist would be following Mach's proposal, which we will discuss next. Such a position would be satisfactory only to the extent that a suitable concrete replacement theory to Newton's theory is developed; Mach never offered such a theory, but recently more progress has been made.

Second, one must be careful in understanding just how the argument works, for it is tempting to gloss it by saying that in Newtonian mechanics the connection is a crucial part of the explanation of the surface of the water in the bucket, and if the spacetime which carries the connection is denied, then the explanation fails too. But this gloss tacitly assumes that Newtonian mechanics can only be understood in a substantial Galilean spacetime; if an interpretation of Newtonian mechanics that does not assume substantivalism can be constructed, then all Newtonian explanations can be given without a literal connection. Both Sklar (1974) and van Fraassen (1985) have made proposals along these lines. Sklar proposes interpreting ‘true’ acceleration as a primitive quantity not defined in terms of motion relative to anything, be it absolute space, a connection or other bodies. (Notice the family resemblance between this proposal and Leibniz's view of force and speed.) Van Fraassen proposes formulating mechanics as ‘Newton's Laws hold in some frame’, so that the form of the laws and the ways bodies move picks out a standard of inertial motion, not absolute space or a connection, or any instantaneous relations. These proposals aim to keep the full explanatory resources of Newtonian mechanics, and hence admit ‘true acceleration’, but deny any relations between bodies and spacetime itself. Like the actual Leibniz, they allow absolute quantities of motion, but claim that space and time themselves are nothing but the relations between bodies. Of course, such views raise the question of how a motion can be not relative to anything at all, and how we are to understand the privileging of frames; Huggett (2006) contains a proposal for addressing these problems. (Note that Sklar and van Fraassen are committed to the idea that in some sense Newton's laws are capable of explaining all the phenomena without recourse to spacetime geometry; that the connection and the metrical properties are explanatorily redundant. A similar view is defended in the context of relativity in Brown 2005.)

8. Mach and Later Machians

Between the time of Newton and Leibniz and the 20th century, Newton's mechanics and gravitation theory reigned essentially unchallenged, and with that long period of dominance, absolute space came to be widely accepted. At least, no natural philosopher or physicist offered a serious challenge to Newton's absolute space, in the sense of offering a rival theory that dispenses with it. But like the action at a distance in Newtonian gravity, absolute space continued to provoke metaphysical unease. Seeking a replacement for the unobservable Newtonian space, Neumann (1870) and Lange (1885) developed more concrete definitions of the reference frames in which Newton's laws hold. In these and a few other works, the concept of the set of inertial frames was first clearly expressed, though it was implicit in both remarks and procedures to be found in the Principia. (See the entries on space and time: inertial frames and Newton's views on space, time, and motion) The most sustained, comprehensive, and influential attack on absolute space was made by Ernst Mach in his Science of Mechanics (1883).

In a lengthy discussion of Newton's Scholium on absolute space, Mach accuses Newton of violating his own methodological precepts by going well beyond what the observational facts teach us concerning motion and acceleration. Mach at least partly misinterpreted Newton's aims in the Scholium, and inaugurated a reading of the bucket argument (and by extension the globes argument) that has largely persisted in the literature since. Mach viewed the argument as directed against a ‘strict’ or ‘general-relativity’ form of relationism, and as an attempt to establish the existence of absolute space. Mach points out the obvious gap in the argument when so construed: the experiment only establishes that acceleration (rotation) of the water with respect to the Earth, or the frame of the fixed stars, produces the tendency to recede from the center; it does not prove that a strict relationist theory cannot account for the bucket phenomena, much less the existence of absolute space. (The reader will recall that Newton's actual aim was simply to show that Descartes' two kinds of motion are not adequate to accounting for rotational phenomena.) Although Mach does not mention the globes thought experiment specifically, it is easy to read an implicit response to it in the things he does say: nobody is competent to say what would happen, or what would be possible, in a universe devoid of matter other than two globes. So neither the bucket nor the globes can establish the existence of absolute space.

8.1 Two Interpretations of Mach on Inertia

Both in Mach's interpretations of Newton's arguments and in his replies, one can already see two anti-absolute space viewpoints emerge, though Mach himself never fully kept them apart. The first strain, which we may call ‘Mach-lite’, criticizes Newton's postulation of absolute space as a metaphysical leap that is neither justified by actual experiments, nor methodologically sound. The remedy offered by Mach-lite is simple: we should retain Newton's mechanics and use it just as we already do, but eliminate the unnecessary posit of absolute space. In its place we need only substitute the frame of the fixed stars, as is the practice in astronomy in any case. If we find the incorporation of a reference to contingent circumstances (the existence of a single reference frame in which the stars are more or less stationary) in the fundamental laws of nature problematic (which Mach need not, given his official positivist account of scientific laws), then Mach suggests that we replace the 1st law with an empirically equivalent mathematical rival:

Mach's Equation of Inertia
Mach's Equation (1960, 287)

The sums in this equation are to be taken over all massive bodies in the universe. Since the top sum is weighted by distance, distant masses count much more than near ones. In a world with a (reasonably) static distribution of heavy distant bodies, such as we appear to live in, the equation entails local conservation of linear momentum in ‘inertial’ frames. The upshot of this equation is that the frame of the fixed stars plays exactly the role of absolute space in the statement of the 1st law. (Notice that this equation, unlike Newton's first law, is not vectorial.) This proposal does not, by itself, offer an alternative to Newtonian mechanics, and as Mach himself pointed out, the law is not well-behaved in an infinite universe filled with stars; but the same can perhaps be said of Newton's law of gravitation (see Malament 1995, and Norton 1993).[1] But Mach did not offer this equation as a proposed law valid in any circumstances; he avers, “it is impossible to say whether the new expression would still represent the true condition of things if the stars were to perform rapid movements among one another.” (p. 289)

It is not clear whether Mach offered this revised first law as a first step toward a theory that would replace Newton's mechanics, deriving inertial effects from only relative motions, as Leibniz desired. But many other remarks made by Mach in his chapter criticizing absolute space point in this direction, and they have given birth to the Mach-heavy view, later to be christened “Mach's Principle” by Albert Einstein.[2] The Mach-heavy viewpoint calls for a new mechanics that invokes only relative distances and (perhaps) their 1st and 2nd time derivatives, and thus ‘generally relativistic’ in the sense sometimes read into Leibniz's remarks about motion. Mach wished to eliminate absolute time from physics too, so he would have wanted a proper relationist reduction of these derivatives also. The Barbour-Bertotti theories, discussed below, provide this.

Mach-heavy apparently involves the prediction of novel effects due to ‘merely’ relative accelerations. Mach hints at such effects in his criticism of Newton's bucket:

Newton's experiment with the rotating vessel of water simply informs us that the relative rotation of the water with respect to the sides of the vessel produces no noticeable centrifugal forces, but that such forces are produced by its relative rotation with respect to the mass of the earth and the other celestial bodies. No one is competent to say how the experiment would turn out if the sides of the vessel [were] increased until they were ultimately several leagues thick. (1883, 284.)

The suggestion here seems to be that the relative rotation in stage (i) of the experiment might immediately generate an outward force (before any rotation is communicated to the water), if the sides of the bucket were massive enough.

Mach's thick-sided bucket
Mach's thick-sided bucket

More generally, Mach-heavy involves the view that all inertial effects should be derived from the motions of the body in question relative to all other massive bodies in the universe. The water in Newton's bucket feels an outward pull due (mainly) to the relative rotation of all the fixed stars around it. Mach-heavy is a speculation that an effect something like electromagnetic induction should be built into gravity theory. (Such an effect does exist according to the General Theory of Relativity, and is called ‘gravitomagnetic induction’. The recently finished Gravity Probe B mission was designed to measure the gravitomagnetic induction effect due to the Earth's rotation.) Its specific form must fall off with distance much more slowly than 1/r2, if it is to be empirically similar to Newtonian physics; but it will certainly predict experimentally testable novel behaviors. A theory that satisfies all the goals of Mach-heavy would appear to be ideal for the vindication of strict relationism and the elimination of absolute quantities of motion from mechanics.

8.2 Implementing Mach-heavy

Direct assault on the problem of satisfying Mach-heavy in a classical framework proved unsuccessful, despite the efforts of others besides Mach (e.g., Friedländer 1896, Föpl 1904, Reissner 1914, 1915), until the work of Barbour and Bertotti in the 1970s and 80s. (Between the late 19th century and the 1970s, there was of course one extremely important attempt to satisfy Mach-heavy: the work of Einstein that led to the General Theory of Relativity. Since Einstein's efforts took place in a non-classical (Lorentz/Einstein/Minkowski) spacetime setting, we discuss them in the next section.) Rather than formulating a revised law of gravity/inertia using relative quantities, Barbour and Bertotti attacked the problem using the framework of Lagrangian mechanics, replacing the elements of the action that involve absolute quantities of motion with new terms invoking only relative distances, velocities etc. Their first (1977) theory uses a very simple and elegant action, and satisfies everything one could wish for from a Mach-heavy theory: it is relationally pure (even with respect to time: while simultaneity is absolute, the temporal metric is derived from the field equations); it is nearly empirically equivalent to Newton's theory in a world such as ours (with a large-scale uniform, near-stationary matter distribution); yet it does predict novel effects such as the ones Mach posited with his thick bucket. Among these is an ‘anisotropy of inertia’ effect — accelerating a body away from the galactic center requires more force than accelerating it perpendicular to the galactic plane — large enough to be ruled out empirically.

Barbour and Bertotti's second attempt (1982) at a relational Lagrangian mechanics was arguably less Machian, but more empirically adequate. In it, solutions are sought beginning with two temporally-nearby, instantaneous relational configurations of the bodies in the universe. Barbour and Bertotti define an ‘intrinsic difference’ parameter that measures how different the two configurations are. In the solutions of the theory, this intrinsic difference quantity gets minimized, as well as the ordinary action, and in this way full solutions are derived despite not starting from a privileged inertial-frame description. The theory they end up with turns out to be, in effect, a fragment of Newtonian theory: the set of models of Newtonian mechanics and gravitation in which there is zero net angular momentum. This result makes perfect sense in terms of strict relationist aims. In a Newtonian world in which there is a nonzero net angular momentum (e.g., a lone rotating island galaxy), this fact reveals itself in the classic “tendency to recede from the center”. Since a strict relationist demands that bodies obey the same mechanical laws even in ‘rotating’ coordinate systems, there cannot be any such tendency to recede from the center (other than in a local subsystem), in any of the relational theory's models. Since cosmological observations, even today, reveal no net angular momentum in our world, the second Barbour & Bertotti theory can lay claim to exactly the same empirical successes (and problems) that Newtonian physics had. The second theory does not predict the (empirically falsified) anisotropy of inertia derivable from the first; but neither does it allow a derivation of the precession of the orbit of Mercury, which the first theory does (for appropriately chosen cosmic parameters).

8.3 Mach-lite versus Mach-heavy

Mach-lite, like the relational interpretations of Newtonian physics reviewed in section 5, offers us a way of understanding Newtonian physics without accepting absolute position, velocity or acceleration. But it does so in a way that lacks theoretical clarity and elegance, since it does not delimit a clear set of cosmological models. We know that Mach-lite makes the same predictions as Newton for worlds in which there is a static frame associated with the stars and galaxies; but if asked about how things will behave in a world with no frame of fixed stars, or in which the stars are far from ‘fixed’, it shrugs and refuses to answer. (Recall that Mach-lite simply says: “Newton's laws hold in the frame of reference of the fixed stars.”) This is perfectly acceptable according to Mach's philosophy of science, since the job of mechanics is simply to summarize observable facts in an economical way. But it is unsatisfying to those with stronger realist intuitions about laws of nature.

If there is, in fact, a distinguishable privileged frame of reference in which the laws of mechanics take on a specially simple form, without that frame being determined in any way by relation to the matter distribution, a realist will find it hard to resist the temptation to view motions described in that frame as the ‘true’ or ‘absolute’ motions. If there is a family of such frames, disagreeing about velocity but all agreeing about acceleration, she will feel a temptation to think of at least acceleration as ‘true’ or ‘absolute’. If such a realist believes motion to be by nature a relation rather than a property (and as we saw in the introduction, not all philosophers accept this) then she will feel obliged to accord some sort of existence or reality to the structure — e.g., the structure of Galilean spacetime — in relation to which these motions are defined. For philosophers with such realist inclinations, the ideal relational account of motion would therefore be some version of Mach-heavy.

9. Relativity and Motion

The Special Theory of Relativity (STR) is notionally based on a principle of relativity of motion; but that principle is ‘special’ — meaning, restricted. The relativity principle built into STR is in fact nothing other than the Galilean principle of relativity, which is built into Newtonian physics.[3] In other words, while there is no privileged standard of velocity, there is nevertheless a determinate fact of the matter about whether a body has accelerated or non-accelerated (i.e., inertial) motion. In this regard, the spacetime of STR is exactly like Galilean spacetime (defined in section 5 above). In terms of the question of whether all motion can be considered purely relative, one could argue that there is nothing new brought to the table by the introduction of Einstein's STR — at least, as far as mechanics is concerned.

9.1 Relations Determine State of Motion?

As Dorling (1978) first pointed out, however, there is a sense in which the standard absolutist arguments against ‘strict’ relationism using rotating objects (buckets or globes) fail in the context of STR. Maudlin (1993) used the same considerations to show that there is a way of recasting relationism in STR that appears to be very successful.

STR incorporates certain novelties concerning the nature of time and space, and how they mesh together; perhaps the best-known examples are the phenomena of ‘length contraction’, ‘time dilation’, and the ‘relativity of simultaneity.’[4] Since in STR both spatial distances and time intervals — when measured in the standard ways — are observer-relative (observers in different states of motion ‘disagreeing’ about their sizes), it is arguably most natural to restrict oneself to the invariant spacetime separation given by the interval between two points: [dx2 + dy2 + dz2dt2] — the four-dimensional analog of the Pythagorean theorem, for spacetime distances. If one regards the spacetime interval relations between masses-at-times as one's basis on which space-time is built up as an ideal entity, then with only mild caveats relationism works: the ‘relationally pure’ facts suffice to uniquely fix how the material systems are embeddable (up to isomorphism) in the ‘Minkowski’ spacetime of STR. The modern variants of Newton's bucket and globes arguments no longer stymie the relationist because (for example) the spacetime interval relations among bits of matter in Newton's bucket at rest are quite different from the spacetime interval relations found among those same bits of matter after the bucket is rotating. For example, the spacetime interval relation between a bit of water near the side of the bucket, at one time, and itself (say) a second later is smaller than the interval relation between a center-bucket bit of water and itself one second later (times referred to inertial-frame clocks). The upshot is that, unlike the situation in classical physics, a body at rest cannot have all the same spatial relations among its parts as a similar body in rotation. We cannot put a body or system into a state of rotation (or other acceleration) without thereby changing the spacetime interval relations between the various bits of matter at different moments of time. Rotation and acceleration supervene on spacetime interval relations.

It is worth pausing to consider to what extent this victory for (some form of) relationism satisfies the classical ‘strict’ relationism traditionally ascribed to Mach and Leibniz. The spatiotemporal relations that save the day against the bucket and globes are, so to speak, mixed spatial and temporal distances. They are thus quite different from the spatial-distances-at-a-time presupposed by classical relationists; moreover they do not correspond to relative velocities (-at-a-time) either. Their oddity is forcefully captured by noticing that if we choose appropriate bits of matter at ‘times’ eight minutes apart, I-now am at zero distance from the surface of the sun (of eight minutes ‘past’, since it took 8 minutes for light from the sun to reach me-now). So we are by no means dealing here with an innocuous, ‘natural’ translation of classical relationist quantities into the STR setting. On the other hand, in light of the relativity of simultaneity (see note[4]), it can be argued that the absolute simultaneity presupposed by classical relationists and absolutists alike was, in fact, something that relationists should always have regarded with misgivings. From this perspective, instantaneous relational configurations — precisely what one starts with in the theories of Barbour and Bertotti — would be the things that should be treated with suspicion.

If we now return to our questions about motions — about the nature of velocities and accelerations — we find, as noted above, that matters in the interval-relational interpretation of STR are much the same as in Newtonian mechanics in Galilean spacetime. There are no well-defined absolute velocities, but there are indeed well-defined absolute accelerations and rotations. In fact, the difference between an accelerating body (e.g., a rocket) and an inertially moving body is codified directly in the cross-temporal interval relations of the body with itself. So we are very far from being able to conclude that all motion is relative motion of a body with respect to other bodies. It is true that the absolute motions are in 1-1 correlation with patterns of spacetime interval relations, but it is not at all correct to say that they are, for that reason, eliminable in favor of merely relative motions. Rather we should simply say that no absolute acceleration can fail to have an effect on the material body or bodies accelerated. But this was already true in classical physics if matter is modeled realistically: the cord connecting the globes does not merely tense, but also stretches; and so does the bucket, even if imperceptibly, i.e., the spatial relations change.

Maudlin does not claim this version of relationism to be victorious over an absolutist or substantivalist conception of Minkowski spacetime, when it comes time to make judgments about the theory's ontology. There may be more to vindicating relationism than merely establishing a 1-1 correlation between absolute motions and patterns of spatiotemporal relations.

9.2 The Relationist Roots of STR and GTR

The simple comparison made above between STR and Newtonian physics in Galilean spacetime is somewhat deceptive. For one thing, Galilean spacetime is a mathematical innovation posterior to Einstein's 1905 theory; before then, Galilean spacetime had not been conceived, and full acceptance of Newtonian mechanics implied accepting absolute velocities and, arguably, absolute positions, just as laid down in the Scholium. So Einstein's elimination of absolute velocity was a genuine conceptual advance. Moreover, the Scholium was not the only reason for supposing that there existed a privileged reference frame of ‘rest’: the working assumption of almost all physicists in the latter half of the 19th century was that, in order to understand the wave theory of light, one had to postulate an aetherial medium filling all space, wave-like disturbances in which constituted electromagnetic radiation. It was assumed that the aether rest frame would be an inertial reference frame; and physicists felt some temptation to equate its frame with the absolute rest frame, though this was not necessary. Regardless of this equation of the aether with absolute space, it was assumed by all 19th century physicists that the equations of electrodynamic theory would have to look different in a reference frame moving with respect to the aether than they did in the aether's rest frame (where they presumably take their canonical form, i.e., Maxwell's equations and the Lorentz force law.) So while theoreticians labored to find plausible transformation rules for the electrodynamics of moving bodies, experimentalists tried to detect the Earth's motion in the aether. Experiment and theory played collaborative roles, with experimental results ruling out certain theoretical moves and suggesting new ones, while theoretical advances called for new experimental tests for their confirmation or — as it happened — disconfirmation.

As is well known, attempts to detect the Earth's velocity in the aether were unsuccessful. On the theory side, attempts to formulate the transformation laws for electrodynamics in moving frames — in such a way as to be compatible with experimental results — were complicated and inelegant.[5] A simplified way of seeing how Einstein swept away a host of problems at a stroke is this: he proposed that the Galilean principle of relativity holds for Maxwell's theory, not just for mechanics. The canonical (‘rest-frame’) form of Maxwell's equations should be their form in any inertial reference frame. Since the Maxwell equations dictate the velocity c of electromagnetic radiation (light), this entails that any inertial observer, no matter how fast she is moving, will measure the velocity of a light ray as c — no matter what the relative velocity of its emitter. Einstein worked out logically the consequences of this application of the special relativity principle, and discovered that space and time must be rather different from how Newton described them. STR undermined Newton's absolute time just as decisively as it undermined his absolute space (see note [4]).

9.3 From Special Relativity to General Relativity

Einstein's STR was the first clear and empirically successful physical theory to overtly eliminate the concepts of absolute rest and absolute velocity while recovering most of the successes of classical mechanics and 19th century electrodynamics. It therefore deserves to be considered the first highly successful theory to explicitly relativize motion, albeit only partially. But STR only recovered most of the successes of classical physics: crucially, it left out gravity. And there was certainly reason to be concerned that Newtonian gravity and STR would prove incompatible: classical gravity acted instantaneously at a distance, while STR eliminated the privileged absolute simultaneity that this instantaneous action presupposes.

Several ways of modifying Newtonian gravity to make it compatible with the spacetime structure of STR suggested themselves to physicists in the years 1905-1912, and a number of interesting Lorentz-covariant theories were proposed (set in the Minkowski spacetime of STR). Einstein rejected these efforts one and all, for violating either empirical facts or theoretical desiderata. But Einstein's chief reason for not pursuing the reconciliation of gravitation with STR's spacetime appears to have been his desire, beginning in 1907, to replace STR with a theory in which not only velocity could be considered merely relative, but also acceleration. That is to say, Einstein wanted if possible to completely eliminate all absolute quantities of motion from physics, thus realizing a theory that satisfies at least one kind of ‘strict’ relationism. (Regarding Einstein's rejection of Lorentz-covariant gravity theories, see Norton 1992; regarding Einstein's quest to fully relativize motion, see Hoefer 1994.)

Einstein began to see this complete relativization as possible in 1907, thanks to his discovery of the Equivalence Principle. Imagine we are far out in space, in a rocket ship accelerating at a constant rate g = 9.98 m/s2. Things will feel just like they do on the surface of the Earth; we will feel a clear up-down direction, bodies will fall to the floor when released, etc. Indeed, due to the well-known empirical fact that gravity affects all bodies by imparting a force proportional to their matter (and energy) content, independent of their internal constitution, we know that any experiment performed on this rocket will give the same results that the same experiment would give if performed on the Earth. Now, Newtonian theory teaches us to consider the apparent downward, gravity-like forces in the rocket ship as ‘pseudo-forces’ or ‘inertial forces’, and insists that they are to be explained by the fact that the ship is accelerating in absolute space. But Einstein asked: “Is there any way for the person in the rocket to regard him/herself as being ‘at rest’ rather than in absolute (accelerated) motion?” And the answer he gave is: Yes. The rocket traveler may regard him/herself as being ‘at rest’ in a homogeneous and uniform gravitational field. This will explain all the observational facts just as well as the supposition that he/she is accelerating relative to absolute space (or, absolutely accelerating in Minkowski spacetime). But is it not clear that the latter is the truth, while the former is a fiction? By no means; if there were a uniform gravitational field filling all space, then it would affect all the other bodies in the world — the Earth, the stars, etc, imparting to them a downward acceleration away from the rocket; and that is exactly what the traveler observes.

In 1907, Einstein published his first gravitation theory (Einstein 1907), treating the gravitational field as a scalar field that also represented the (now variable and frame-dependent) speed of light. Einstein viewed the theory as only a first step on the road to eliminating absolute motion. In the 1907 theory, the theory's equations take the same form in any inertial or uniformly accelerating frame of reference. One might say that this theory reduces the class of absolute motions, leaving only rotation and other non-uniform accelerations as absolute. But, Einstein reasoned, if uniform acceleration can be regarded as equivalent to being at rest in a constant gravitational field, why should it not be possible also to regard inertial effects from these other, non-uniform motions as similarly equivalent to “being at rest in a (variable) gravitational field”? Thus Einstein set himself the goal of expanding the principle of equivalence to embrace all forms of ‘accelerated’ motion.

Einstein thought that the key to achieving this aim lay in further expanding the range of reference frames in which the laws of physics take their canonical form, to include frames adapted to any arbitrary motions. More specifically, since the class of all continuous and differentiable coordinate systems includes as a subclass the coordinate systems adapted to any such frame of reference, if he could achieve a theory of gravitation, electromagnetism and mechanics that was generally covariant — its equations taking the same form in any coordinate system from this general class — then the complete relativity of motion would be achieved. If there are no special frames of reference in which the laws take on a simpler canonical form, there is no physical reason to consider any particular state or states of motion as privileged, nor deviations from those as representing ‘absolute motion’. (Here we are just laying out Einstein's train of thought; later we will see reasons to question the last step.) And in 1915, Einstein achieved his aim in the General Theory of Relativity (GTR).

9.4 General Relativity and Relativity of Motion

There is one key element left out of this success story, however, and it is crucial to understanding why most physicists reject Einstein's claim to have eliminated absolute states of motion in GTR. Going back to our accelerating rocket, we accepted Einstein's claim that we could regard the ship as hovering at rest in a universe-filling gravitational field. But a gravitational field, we usually suppose, is generated by matter. How is this universe-filling field linked to generating matter? The answer may be supplied by Mach-heavy. Regarding the ‘accelerating’ rocket which we decide to regard as ‘at rest’ in a gravitational field, the Machian says: all those stars and galaxies, etc., jointly accelerating downward (relative to the rocket), ‘produce’ that gravitational field. The mathematical specifics of how this field is generated will have to be different from Newton's law of gravity, of course; but it should give essentially the same results when applied to low-mass, slow-moving problems such as the orbits of the planets, so as to capture the empirical successes of Newtonian gravity. Einstein thought, in 1916 at least, that the field equations of GTR are precisely this mathematical replacement for Newton's law of gravity, and that they fully satisfied the desiderata of Mach-heavy relationism. But it was not so. (See the entry on early philosophical interpretations of general relativity.)

In GTR, spacetime is locally very much like flat Minkowski spacetime. There is no absolute velocity locally, but there are clear local standards of accelerated vs non-accelerated motion, i.e., local inertial frames. In these ‘freely falling’ frames bodies obey the usual rules for non-gravitational physics familiar from STR, albeit only approximately. But overall spacetime is curved, and local inertial frames may tip, bend and twist as we move from one region to another. The structure of curved spacetime is encoded in the metric field tensor gab, with the curvature encoding gravity at the same time: gravitational forces are so to speak ‘built into’ the metric field, geometrized away. Since the spacetime structure encodes gravity and inertia, and in a Mach-heavy theory these phenomena should be completely determined by the relational distribution of matter (and relative motions), Einstein wished to see the metric as entirely determined by the distribution of matter and energy. But what the GTR field equations entail is, in general, only a partial-determination relation.

We cannot go into the mathematical details necessary for a full discussion of the successes and failures of Mach-heavy in the GTR context. But one can see why the Machian interpretation Einstein hoped he could give to the curved spacetimes of his theory fails to be plausible, by considering a few simple ‘worlds’ permitted by GTR. In the first place, for our hovering rocket ship, if we are to attribute the gravity field it feels to matter, there has got to be all this other matter in the universe. But if we regard the rocket as a mere ‘test body’ (not itself substantially affecting the gravity present or absent in the universe), then we can note that according to GTR, if we remove all the stars, galaxies, planets etc. from the world, the gravitational field does not disappear. On the contrary, it stays basically the same locally, and globally it takes the form of empty Minkowski spacetime, precisely the quasi-absolute structure Einstein was hoping to eliminate. Solutions of the GTR field equations for arbitrary realistic configurations of matter (e.g., a rocket ship ejecting a stream of particles to push itself forward) are hard to come by, and in fact a realistic two-body exact solution has yet to be discovered. But numerical methods can be applied for many purposes, and physicists do not doubt that something like our accelerating rocket — in otherwise empty space — is possible according to the theory.[6] We see clearly, then, that GTR fails to satisfy Einstein's own understanding of Mach's Principle, according to which, in the absence of matter, space itself should not be able to exist. A second example: GTR allows us to model a single rotating object in an otherwise empty universe (e.g., a neutron star). Relationism of the Machian variety says that such rotation is impossible, since it can only be understood as rotation relative to some sort of absolute space. In the case of GTR, this is basically right: the rotation is best understood as rotation relative to a ‘background’ spacetime that is identical to the Minkowski spacetime of STR, only ‘curved’ by the presence of matter in the region of the star.

On the other hand, there is one charge of failure-to-relativize-motion sometimes leveled at GTR that is unfair. It is sometimes asserted that the simple fact that the metric field (or the connection it determines) distinguishes, at every location, motions that are ‘absolutely’ accelerated and/or ‘absolutely rotating’ from those that are not, by itself entails that GTR fails to embody a folk-Leibniz style general relativity of motion (e.g. Earman (1989), ch. 5). We think this is incorrect, and leads to unfairly harsh judgments about confusion on Einstein's part. The local inertial structure encoded in the metric would not be ‘absolute’ in any meaningful sense, if that structure were in some clear sense fully determined by the relationally specified matter-energy distribution. Einstein was not simply confused when he named his gravity theory. (Just what is to be understood by “the relationally specified matter-energy distribution” is a further, thorny issue, which we cannot enter into here.)

GTR does not fulfill all the goals of Mach-heavy, at least as understood by Einstein, and he recognized this fact by 1918 (Einstein 1918). And yet … GTR comes tantalizingly close to achieving those goals, in certain striking ways. For one thing, GTR does predict Mach-heavy effects, known as ‘frame-dragging’: if we could model Mach's thick-walled bucket in GTR, it seems clear that it would pull the water slightly outward, and give it a slight tendency to begin rotating in the same sense as the bucket (even if the big bucket's walls were not actually touching the water. While GTR does permit us to model a lone rotating object, if we model the object as a shell of mass (instead of a solid sphere) and let the size of the shell increase (to model the ‘sphere of the fixed stars’ we see around us), then as Brill & Cohen (1966) showed, the frame-dragging becomes complete inside the shell. In other words: our original Minkowski background structure effectively disappears, and inertia becomes wholly determined by the shell of matter, just as Mach posited was the case. This complete determination of inertia by the global matter distribution appears to be a feature of other models, including the Friedman-Robertson-Walker-Lemâitre Big Bang models that best match observations of our universe.

Finally, it is important to recognize that GTR is generally covariant in a very special sense: unlike all other prior theories (and unlike many subsequent quantum theories), it postulates no fixed ‘prior’ or ‘background’ spacetime structure. As mathematicians and physicists realized early on, other theories, e.g., Newtonian mechanics and STR, can be put into a generally covariant form. But when this is done, there are inevitably mathematical objects postulated as part of the formalism, whose role is to represent absolute elements of spacetime structure. What is unique about GTR is that it was the first, and is still the only ‘core’ physical theory, to have no such absolute elements in its covariant equations. The spacetime structure in GTR, represented by the metric field (which determines the connection), is at least partly ‘shaped’ by the distribution of matter and energy. And in certain models of the theory, such as the Big Bang cosmological models, some authors have claimed that the local standards of inertial motion — the local ‘gravitational field’ of Einstein's equivalence principle — are entirely fixed by the matter distribution throughout space and time, just as Mach-heavy requires (see, for example, Wheeler and Cuifollini 1995).

Absolutists and relationists are thus left in a frustrating and perplexing quandary by GTR. Considering its anti-Machian models, we are inclined to say that motions such as rotation and acceleration remain absolute, or nearly-totally-absolute, according to the theory. On the other hand, considering its most Mach-friendly models, which include all the models taken to be good candidates for representing the actual universe, we may be inclined to say: motion in our world is entirely relative; the inertial effects normally used to argue for absolute motion are all understandable as effects of rotations and accelerations relative to the cosmic matter, just as Mach hoped. But even if we agree that motions in our world are in fact all relative in this sense, this does not automatically settle the traditional relationist/absolutist debate, much less the relationist/substantivalist debate. Many philosophers (including, we suspect, Nerlich 1994 and Earman 1989) would be happy to acknowledge the Mach-friendly status of our spacetime, and argue nevertheless that we should understand that spacetime as a real thing, more like a substance than a mere ideal construct of the mind as Leibniz insisted. (Nerlich (1994) and Earman (1989), we suspect, would take this stance.) Some, though not all, attempts to convert GTR into a quantum theory would accord spacetime this same sort of substantiality that other quantum fields possess.

10. Conclusion

This article has been concerned with tracing the history and philosophy of ‘absolute’ and ‘relative’ theories of space and motion. Along the way we have been at pains to introduce some clear terminology for various different concepts (e.g., ‘true’ motion, ‘substantivalism’, ‘absolute space’), but what we have not really done is say what the difference between absolute and relative space and motion is: just what is at stake? Recently Rynasiewicz (2000) has argued that there simply are no constant issues running through the history that we have discussed here; that there is no stable meaning for either ‘absolute motion’ or ‘relative motion’ (or ‘substantival space’ vs ‘relational space’). While we agree to a certain extent, we think that nevertheless there are a series of issues that have motivated thinkers again and again; indeed, those that we identified in the introduction. (One quick remark: Rynasiewicz is probably right that the issues cannot be expressed in formally precise terms, but that does not mean that there are no looser philosophical affinities that shed useful light on the history.)

Our discussion has revealed several different issues, of which we will highlight three as components of the ‘absolute-relative debate’. (i) There is the question of whether all motions and all possible descriptions of motions are equal, or whether some are ‘real’ — what we have called, in Seventeenth Century parlance, ‘true’. There is a natural temptation for those who hold that there is ‘nothing but the relative positions and motions between bodies' (and more so for their readers) to add ‘and all such motions are equal’, thus denying the existence of true motion. However, arguably — perhaps surprisingly — no one we have discussed has unreservedly held this view (at least not consistently): Descartes considered motion ‘properly speaking’ to be privileged, Leibniz introduced ‘active force’ to ground motion (arguably in his mechanics as well as metaphysically), and Mach's view seems to be that the distribution of matter in the universe determines a preferred standard of inertial motion. (Again, in general relativity, there is a distinction between inertial and accelerated motion.)

That is, relationists can allow true motions if they offer an analysis of them in terms of the relations between bodies. Given this logical point, and given the historical ways thinkers have understood themselves, it seems unhelpful to characterize the issues in (i) as constituting an absolute-relative debate, hence our use of the term ‘true’ instead of ‘absolute’. So we are led to the second question: (ii) is true motion definable in terms of relations or not? (Of course the answer depends on what kind of definitions will count, and absent an explicit definition — Descartes' proper motion for example — the issue is often taken to be that of whether true motions supervene on relations, as Newton's globes are often supposed to refute.) It seems reasonable to call this issue that of whether motion is absolute or relative. Descartes and Mach are relationists about motion in this sense, while Newton is an absolutist. Leibniz is also an absolutist about motion in his metaphysics, and if our reading is correct, also about the interpretation of motion in the laws of collision. This classification of Leibniz's views runs contrary to his customary identification as relationist-in-chief, but we will clarify his relationist credentials below. Finally, we have discussed (ii) in the context of relativity, first examining Maudlin's proposal that the embedding of a relationally-specified system in Minkowski spacetime is in general unique once all the spacetime interval-distance relations are given. This proposal may or may not be held to satisfy the relational-definability question of (ii), but in any case it cannot be carried over to the context of general relativity theory. In the case of GTR we linked relational motion to the satisfaction of Mach's Principle, just as Einstein did in the early years of the theory. Despite some promising features displayed by GTR, and certain of its models, we saw that Mach's Principle is not fully satisfied in GTR as a whole. We also noted that in the absence of absolute simultaneity, it becomes an open question what relations are to be permitted in the definition (or supervience base) — spacetime interval relations? Instantaneous spatial distances and velocities on a 3-d hypersurface? (In recent works, Barbour has argued that GTR is fully Machian, using a 3-d relational-configuration approach. See Barbour, Foster and Murchadha 2002.)

The final issue is that of (iii) whether absolute motion is motion with respect to substantival space or not. Of course this is how Newton understood acceleration — as acceleration relative to absolute space. More recent Newtonians share this view, although motion for them is with respect to substantival Galilean spacetime (or rather, since they know Newtonian mechanics is false, they hold that this is the best interpretation of that theory). Leibniz denied that motion was relative to space itself, since he denied the reality of space; for him true motion was the possession of active force. So despite his ‘absolutism’ (our adjective not his) about motion he was simultaneously a relationist about space: ‘space is merely relative’. Following Leibniz's lead we can call this debate the question of whether space is absolute or relative. The drawback of this name is that it suggests a separation between motion and space, which exists in Leibniz's views, but which is otherwise problematic; still, no better description presents itself.

Others who are absolutists about motion but relationists about space include Sklar (1974) and van Fraassen (1985); Sklar introduced a primitive quantity of acceleration, not supervenient on motions relative to anything at all, while van Fraassen let the laws themselves pick out the inertial frames. It is of course arguable whether any of these three proposals are successful; (even) stripped of Leibniz's Aristotelian packaging, can absolute quantities of motion ‘stand on their own feet’? And under what understanding of laws can they ground a standard of inertial motion? Huggett (2006) defends a similar position of absolutism about motion, but relationism about space; he argues — in the case of Newtonian physics — that fundamentally there is nothing to space but relations between bodies, but that absolute motions supervene — not on the relations at any one time — but on the entire history of relations.


Works cited in text

Notable Philosophical Discussions of the Absolute-Relative Debates

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Descartes, René: physics | general relativity: early philosophical interpretations of | Newton, Isaac: views on space, time, and motion | space and time: inertial frames | space and time: the hole argument | Zeno of Elea: Zeno's paradoxes