Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Theories of Tort Law

First published Mon Sep 22, 2003; substantive revision Mon Oct 20, 2003

A tort is a legal wrong. Tort law is a branch of the civil law; the other main branches are contract and property law. Whereas in criminal law the plaintiff is always the state and the defendant, if found guilty of a crime, is punished by the state, in civil law the dispute is typically between private parties (though the government can also sue and be sued). In the case of torts, the plaintiff is the victim of an alleged wrong and the unsuccessful defendant is either directed by the court to pay damages to the plaintiff (the usual remedy) or else to desist from the wrongful activity (so-called "injunctive relief"). Examples include intentional torts such as battery, defamation, and invasion of privacy and unintentional torts such as negligence. Most contemporary tort theory focuses on the legal consequences of accidents, where the relevant forms of liability are negligence and strict liability. This entry likewise focuses on these forms of liability.

Misfortune happens and when it does its victims incur costs. Those costs can remain the burden of victims or they can be shifted to others. Sometimes the costs are borne by everyone (within a particular group or political community). Still other times those costs are borne by particular individuals, namely, those who are responsible for having caused them. The question is: Who is to bear the costs of life's misfortunes: victims, the community as a whole, those who are responsible for them, or someone else entirely? How are we to answer this question? What principles ought to guide the decision, and what institutions ought we create to realize these principles in practice?

1. Introduction

Let's set aside for the moment the costs of misfortune that are borne collectively and distributed throughout the community through tax systems that support, for example, social welfare and safety net programs more generally. Of those that remain, the question is whether the costs are to be borne by victims or some other particular person or persons. Tort law is one of the institutions political communities develop in order to allow victims the opportunity to shift the costs that befall them to others. Insurance is another such institution. Many individuals purchase ‘first party’ insurance to protect themselves against having to shoulder the full costs of some misfortunes that may befall them and to guard against others. Private health insurance provides a good example of first party insurance against risk to oneself. The contrast is with third party insurance — a contract into which one enters to guard against shouldering the full costs of misfortune one imposes on others for which one is held by law to be responsible.

Tort law and insurance are connected in the following way. Tort law establishes conditions under which victims can shift at least some of the costs they incur to others. All individuals realize that they may be subject to a judgment against them in torts and so many buy third party insurance to protect them from bearing the full costs of those judgments. In some jurisdictions purchasing third party insurance is mandatory. All individuals are likewise aware that they may be victims of another's actions and may not be able to secure a favorable judgment against their injurers — or they not deem it worth the effort to pursue redress through the courts. So many of them buy first party insurance to guard against some of the costs they would otherwise have to shoulder completely.

It is important to note that tort law provides an avenue of redress, not a guarantee of recovery. The victim must determine whether pursuing a remedy through torts is worth the effort and cost. Indeed, as an empirical matter most simply grin and bear the loss then move on. When a victim chooses the form of redress provided by tort law she is given the opportunity to shift her losses to another — provided the conditions the law sets out for doing so have been met. The conditions for shifting losses from victim-plaintiffs to injurer-defendants are expressed in ‘liability rules’. The law of torts distinguishes between two basic kinds of rules: those that impose ‘fault’ liability and those that impose ‘strict’ liability. In the next section we will characterize the difference between these liability rules precisely, but for now it may be helpful to illustrate the underlying distinction in familiar terms that do not rely on the technicalities of the law.

Suppose I made a mess of some sort on my property, then I turned to you and presented you with the bill for cleaning it up. In the absence of some prior agreement we might have made this would seem rather odd. After all, it is my mess, not yours. The burden, accordingly, is mine, not yours, to discharge. Now suppose that instead of making a mess on my property and presenting you with the bill, I simply move the mess I made to your property (or I make the mess on your property from the get-go), and simply walk away claiming the cleanup problem is now yours. If it was inappropriate of me to present you with the bill for the mess I made on my property, it hardly seems that I have improved matters by placing my mess on your property instead. It is, after all, my mess, and the responsibility of cleaning it up is mine. This is the underlying thought behind strict liability. One has a duty to clean up one's messes, and that responsibility does not appear to depend on how hard one has tried not to make a mess in the first place.

On the other hand, unless each of us stays in his respective dwelling, we are bound to make the occasional mess in each other's lives. You would not be justified in demanding of me that I never bump into you or make something of a mess in your life, nor would I be justified in making similar demands of you. What I can demand of you is that you take my interests into account and moderate your behavior accordingly. You need to take reasonable precautions not to harm me; you need to avoid being reckless with respect to my interests. And I am obligated to treat you similarly. That is, what we have a right to demand of one another is that we behave responsibly with respect to the other's interests. This is the underlying thought behind fault liability.

The question is which is the appropriate standard of liability in torts? Most tort theorists believe that we cannot answer that question without first answering another — namely, what are the goals or aims of tort law? The conditions of liability in torts justify imposing a duty of repair on those who satisfy them only if (a) the duties so imposed are the ones best suited to help tort law meet its goals, and (b) the goals are themselves justified. The primary focus of tort theory has been to identify the goals of tort law and to justify them as legitimate aims for the law to pursue. Once the goals are identified and justified, tort theory is then a matter of exploring the extent to which the conditions of liability in torts are appropriate instruments for pursuing them.

Put this way, tort theory is largely a normative activity that appears to eschew explanatory projects. Whereas explanatory projects in law can be pursued without raising justificatory questions, it is less clear that justificatory projects of this sort can be pursued completely independently of basic explanatory ones. Consider the claim that the goal of tort law is deterrence. The claim is not that deterrence is a legitimate goal for some logically possible tort law. The claim is that deterrence, for example, is the goal of this or that system of tort law; and making out such a claim requires showing that the law makes sense as the sort of thing that could pursue that goal or aim. That requires in turn establishing that various features of existing or idealized practice makes sense in the light of the goal one attributes to it. In that sense, the normative project requires that we address certain explanatory or conceptual questions. And so part of making the case that say, the efficient reduction of accident costs is the goal of tort law rests on showing that fundamental features of actual tort practice are best explained by seeing them in the light of efficiency.

As noted above tort law has both strict and fault liability rules. Thus, we have at least two projects. The first project is to distinguish between fault and strict liability as conditions of liability in torts. The second is to explore the extent to which the central features of tort law — including the rules of fault and strict liability — can be explained by the putative goals of tort law.

2. The Difference between Fault and Strict Liability

There are three basic elements in a tort: wrong, harm and an appropriate relationship between the injurer's wrong and the harm to the victim. To harm someone is to set back a legitimate interest of hers. The law does not recognize all harms as grounds for a claim in torts. If you beat me in tennis or in competition for the affections of another, I may be harmed, and you may be the cause of it, but I have no claim in torts to repair for my broken heart or my bruised ego. Even if the interests harmed are protected by the law, claims to repair for the losses one imposes on others require more than risk and harm; they require a wrong — the violation of a duty not to harm or not to impose risks of a certain kind on others. You have no duty not to harm me through competition in business or the affections of another, and so in harming me you do not thereby wrong me. There is no overstating the importance of the idea of a wrong — or of a breach of duty — to tort law.

The central idea in tort law is that liability is based not so much on acting badly or wrongfully, but on committing a wrong. At the same time, a victim's claim to recover for harm to her depends on the wrong the injurer has committed being a wrong to her. It is not enough that the injurer has committed a wrong and that she (the victim) has suffered as a consequence. The defendant's liability to the victim and the victim's claim against the defendant depend on the defendant's having breached a duty of care to the victim.

Just as harm without wrong is no tort, wrongs without harms are typically not torts either. Suppose for a moment that every motorist has a duty to exercise reasonable care in driving his or her car, and that the intended beneficiaries of the duty include all the pedestrians and other drivers who might be put at risk by one's failure to drive with adequate care. Now imagine two people who drive recklessly and in so doing breach the duty we suppose they have, but that one motorist causes damage whereas the other escapes injuring anyone. By hypothesis, both have breached a duty to those whose security is put at risk, and in doing so both have committed wrongs. Only one driver harms someone as a result of the wrongs he commits and thus only he subjects himself to tort liability.

So torts require both wrong and, in most cases, harm. A notable exception to the harm requirement is the case in which injunctive relief is awarded in order to prevent harm that is virtually certain but yet to occur. As a general rule though torts require both wrongs and harms. They require more as well: for liability in torts can be imposed only if the harm has been caused in the appropriate way by the wrong. A's wrong must be what the law calls the ‘proximate’ cause of B's harm.

These are the elements of a tort, but the question is how are they represented in the context of the rules of strict and fault liability. On the conventional view, the difference between fault and strict liability is that in strict liability, but not in fault liability, a defendant can be liable even if he has done nothing wrong. The common understanding, then, is that strict liability is liability without wrong, and fault liability alone is liability based on the injurer's wrong. But then the conventional view seems incompatible with the claim that all torts involve wrongs.

There is a distinction between wrongs and wrongdoings — a difference between committing a wrong and acting wrongfully. To act wrongfully is to act without justification or excuse. Wrongdoing reflects badly on an agent for his actions. On the other hand, to commit a wrong is to breach a duty, to invade another's right. One can breach a duty for good reason, with adequate justification, or under excusing conditions. Rights in other words can be invaded innocently (or justifiably) on the one hand, or wrongfully (or unjustifiably) on the other. This distinction is sometimes expressed in terms of the difference between rights-infringements and rights-violations. Whether my action invades your right is one thing; whether, if it does, the action reflects poorly or favorably on me is another.

Let's apply this distinction to the conventional understanding of the difference between strict and fault liability. When liability is imposed strictly, the question is whether the defendant has invaded the plaintiff's right. A plaintiff under strict liability does not have to establish the fault of the defendant, though a judgment of strict liability does not necessarily mean that the defendant has acted innocently or justifiably. According to the conventional view, under fault liability, the plaintiff has to establish not only that he was wronged by the defendant but that in doing so the defendant acted wrongfully, that is, without justification or excuse.

But this way of explaining the distinction between fault and strict liability leads us even further astray. For if the victim's being wronged by the defendant is adequate to ground his claim to repair (other things being equal) in some cases, why is it not enough in all cases? Concern for the character of the defendant's action may be appropriate to the question whether, in addition to incurring a duty to make his victims whole, he should be punished, held up to ridicule or banished from the community. Under strict liability, the breach of the duty is what is relevant to the duty to repair. In other words, if a practice of strict liability is justified at all, then the duty to make repair cannot depend on whether the injurer has acted justifiably or not. If that is so, why should the duty of repair in fault liability require more than it does in strict liability? When fault is treated as an element of a tort distinct from the breach of duty, either fault liability requires too much or strict liability too little.

The conventional understanding of the difference between fault and strict liability goes astray precisely because it distinguishes the breach of the duty from the fault requirement. The better view is that the difference between fault and strict liability is a difference in the content of the underlying duty of care. To see this, consider the cases of blasting, on the one hand, and motoring on the other. In a case like blasting — an activity traditionally falling under strict liability — the blaster has a duty-not-to-harm-by-blasting. This is the content of the duty of care blasters owe those whom their blasting puts in danger. On the other hand, in the case of motoring — a familiar example of an activity covered fault liability — the motorist is thought to have a duty-not-to-harm-by-faultily-motoring. That these duties have different content is illustrated by their respective success and failure conditions. A blaster fails to discharge his duty when his blasting, regardless of the care he takes, injures someone to whom he owes the duty. A motorist fails to discharge his duty when he harms another negligently, recklessly or intentionally through his driving. The blaster can satisfy his obligations only by not harming another. The motorist can meet hers either by not harming anyone or, in the event she harms someone, by not having done so negligently, recklessly or intentionally. And this is just another way of saying that the contents of the respective duties differ. The fault requirement is thus an aspect of the underlying duty, not a reflection on the character of the defendant's action.

The force the interests of others imposes on our duty to moderate our behavior varies with the circumstances. Sometimes, the likelihood or magnitude of harm to others is so great that the duty we have to others is not to harm them as a result of the actions we choose to undertake. At other times, the balance of interests indicates that we need to take reasonable precautions to guard against harm to others, and no more. Understood in this way, the problem is familiar and not in the least unique to tort law. It is a matter of ordinary morality that the content of our duties to others varies as a consequence of a range of familiar factors. Noting this does not solve the problem of telling us why sometimes the duty is strict and other times it demands only reasonable care. But the difference is that between points on a continuum, and so the stark contrasts that are implied in the conventional view are inapt.

3. Framework for a Theory of Tort Law

It is customary in tort theory to distinguish substantive from structural and procedural aspects of tort law. The rules of strict and fault liability are substantive features of tort law. The bilateral structure of a tort suit — the fact that victims sue those they identify as their injurers and do not instead seek repair from a common pool of resources (as is the case in New Zealand) is a structural feature of our tort law. The fact that the burden of bringing forward a claim and of making the prima facie case falls to the plaintiff is a procedural feature of tort law, and so on. We have already identified the most basic substantive concern of a tort theory, and that is to justify, insofar as possible, the rules of fault and strict liability. It is not the only substantive feature of the practice that has drawn the attention of theorists, as the following summary of substantive concerns helps to make clear.

Mischief, even great mischief, that does not materialize into harm, may be wrongful, but it is not tortuous. Similarly, a reckless and irresponsible defendant who is fortunate to escape causing major damage to others, is only liable for the minor damages he causes. This in stark contrast to the generally focused and attentive actor whose minor mischief occasions a great deal of misfortune. The general principle of tort is that both are liable for the full costs of the harms their conduct has occasioned. Yet, the burdens they face bear no relationship to the degree of their relative wrongdoing. Why should fortuity play so pervasive and powerful a role in tort law?

A defendant judged liable in torts incurs a duty to make good the full costs of the harms that result from his wrong. The liability takes the form of the imposition of a duty of repair. The defendant, however, is often able to discharge his duty through an insurance mechanism. The contrast with the criminal law can be illuminating. It is unimaginable that we would permit individuals to purchase insurance against the likelihood of criminal liability. What explains the difference?

4. Theories of Torts: Economic Analysis

Competing theories of tort law offer accounts of these various features of tort law. The degree to which they illuminate our practice is relative to their perspective on legal practice It is helpful to understand tort law through the lens of a judge deciding cases based on prior rulings and doctrine, from the perspective of potential litigants seeking the vindication of claims, and from the perspective of the legal reformer trying to formulate the best rules for imposing liability. Economic analysis of law is unconvincing if its aim is to illuminate the law from the perspective of either judge or litigant. It is much more plausible when viewed through the lens of a particular kind of legal reformer. We will get the most from economic analysis if we remind ourselves that the economic analyst is asking questions of the following sort: what substantive liability rules are most likely to have the greatest impact on reducing the incidence of accidents at the lowest cost? What procedural rules at a trial are most likely to induce those with the most relevant information to reveal it, or most likely to lead to optimal investments in information or safety; and so on. These are the questions of a reformer less interested in the actual state of tort law than in how the law can be improved.

The economic approach to tort law, like the economic approach to law more generally, attributes a particular goal to the law: namely, efficiency. In the case of tort law, efficiency is understood as optimal cost reduction. The aim of tort law is to minimize the sum of the costs of accidents and the costs of avoiding them. This is to be accomplished in part by creating a system of incentives adequate to induce individuals to invest appropriately in determining what the optimal precautions are and to take them.

The distinguishing feature of economic analysis is the account it provides of fault: the formula it offers for determining whether an actor has adequately taken into account the interests of others. In general, to be at fault in torts is to fail to take others interests appropriately into account and to adjust one's conduct accordingly. Reasonable persons take the interests of others appropriately into account and adjust their behavior accordingly. To be at fault is to fail to behave as would a reasonable person of ordinary prudence. It is a failure to accord others the appropriate level of care to guard against harming their interests.

Economic analysts focus primarily on the concept of negligence. Negligence is the failure to take adequate care and adequate care consists in taking cost-justified precautions. Precautions are cost-justified whenever their cost is less than the costs of the harm risked (by not taking precautions) discounted by the probability of the harm's occurrence. Once we understand negligence as the failure to take cost-justified precautions we need to ask what justifies imposing liability on those who have failed to take appropriate precautions.

From an economic point of view, the costs of the accident for which one is responsible are sunk. There is nothing to be done about them. All that we can do is shift the costs from the victim upon whom they have fallen to someone else. From the economic point of view, such a decision must be based on the impact of cost imposition on the incentives of individuals to invest appropriately in safety. Individuals ought to bear sunk costs only if imposing those costs on them will have the desired impact on the reduction of costs in the future. The responsibility relationship is backward looking; the cost reduction aim is forward looking. It may turn out that having the property of being responsible for a harm may be reliably connected to the property of being an effective cost-avoider. Even in that case, being responsible for a loss is not the ground of liability, but is instead a reliable indicator that the injurer possesses the property that is the ground of liability. Beyond that, if having the property of being responsible for a harm is a reliable indicator that one has the property of being a good cost-avoider (even of harms of the particular sort for which one is responsible), it does not follow, without more, that one should be held liable for the particular harm for which one is responsible. One could just as well be held to bear the costs of a similar injury, or one could be held to bear the costs adequate to induce investments in cost reduction — and those costs may or may not coincide with the costs associated with the harm for which one is responsible. So it cannot be part of an economic argument that the party who is at fault must pay for the costs of harms that are his fault because he is responsible for them. Rather, liability is imposed on those at fault in order to put in place the right incentives on the defendant and those similarly situated.

If we assume that actors are fully rational and informed, imposing liability on those at fault will have the desired effect on others. Here's the argument. If we assume that agents are fully rational, then under the economic conception of rationality it follows that they will maximize benefits or minimize costs. If agents are fully informed, they know the costs of liability and the costs of precautions. Ex ante, all agents will choose the lesser of these costs. The relationship between precaution costs and potential liability based on fault is as follows. An agent will be at fault only if the costs of precautions are less than the costs of the harm discounted by the probability of occurrence. To avoid being at fault the rational agent takes the precautions, which, in addition, are the lesser costs he faces. If the costs of precautions exceed the cost of the harm discounted by the probability of its occurrence, then he will not take precautions, but then he will not be negligent either. Should harm to another result, he will not be required to shoulder the victim's costs. That will be for the victim to do (an important consequence of fault liability to which we shall return below.) So the rational and informed agent will take precautions whenever it would be efficient for him to do so, not otherwise.

In contrast to fault, strict liability is imposed whether or not an agent ought to have taken precautions. Why might we want to hold someone liable who has in fact invested in cost-justified precautions? The economic answer to this puzzle in effect is that there is more than one way to skin a cat. Skinning a cat, in this context, amounts to inducing individuals to take cost-justified precautions.

An agent subject to strict liability has to bear the full costs of his activities — the costs to him of engaging in it and the costs his engaging in it imposes on others. All the costs are his. The question he faces, then, is whether there is anything he might do to reduce the costs he faces. That depends on whether there are precautions he can take, their costs and their expected effectiveness. In other words, if the costs of precautions are less than the harms likely to occur discounted by the probability of their occurrence, then he will take the precautions. He does so because these costs are lower than those he would otherwise expect. Notice that those precautions are in fact the cost justified ones. And so under strict liability the rational and informed agent will also be induced to take all and only cost justified precautions. In this respect fault and strict liability give the same results. The only difference between the two is that under fault liability the costs of accidents not worth preventing are borne by victims, whereas under strict liability, those same costs are borne by injurers. In fault liability, the costs of accidents that are no one's fault are the burden of victims; in strict liability, they are the burden of injurers.

If strict liability can induce efficient investments in safety, why would we have a rule of fault liability? If fault liability is capable of inducing individuals to take optimal precautions, why impose strict liability? The two rules have different distributional consequences. From the economic point of view, the distributional consequences are not important in their own right, but they can be important because of their impact on activity levels. The choice of strict or fault liability is in one sense a choice between making activities more or less expensive relative to each other. Take ranching and farming for example. A rule of strict liability imposed on ranchers for the damage their straying cows impose on corn crops makes ranching more expensive relative to farming. This means that even if, at any level of ranching and farming, both strict and fault liability could be efficient in reducing accidents at that level, a rule of strict liability will make ranching relatively more expensive and reduce the overall level of it (in relation to farming). This means more farming and more farming accidents and fewer ranching related accidents. And so on. If efficiency depends on activity levels, then fault and strict liability need not be equally efficient. Or put another way, because fault and strict liability have differential impacts on activity levels, they can be used differentially whenever appropriate to secure an efficient overall allocation of risks.

The implications of fault and strict liability are more complicated once we distinguish between one and two party accidents. A one party accident is one in which in order optimally to reduce the probability of its occurrence only one of the parties to the accident need take appropriate precautions. In contrast, in a two party accident, securing the optimal reduction in the probability of the accident's occurrence requires that both parties take appropriate precautions. Setting aside the problem of activity levels, we can be taken to have shown that in the case of one party accidents both strict and fault liability can be efficient. The same is not true in the case of two party accidents, where strict liability is not efficient. In strict liability, the victim is always compensated his full damages and therefore has no incentive to invest in precautions, yet the situation requires him to do so.

In contrast, the rule of fault liability is efficient in the two party case in that it induces both injurers and victims to make optimal investments in safety. The rule of fault liability imposes liability on the injurer only if he is at fault. If the injurer is rational, he will always take the cost justified precautions. We established this result above in the discussion of the one party accident case. Thus, the rational injurer will never be at fault. If people are always rational, then the costs of whatever accidents occur will fall to their victims.

Victims must assume, then, that the costs of all accidents will be theirs to bear. Notice that this puts the victim in the exact position the injurer is in under strict liability. On the assumption that the injurer will never be at fault, the victim will always be responsible for all of his costs. And just like the injurer in strict liability, the victim must decide which, if any, precautions to take. Whenever precaution costs are lower than the expected costs of the harm victims will opt for them, otherwise not. In precisely the same way that strict liability encourages injurers to take optimal precautions, fault liability encourages the victim to do the same.

If fault liability is efficient, so too is strict liability with the defense of plaintiff or contributory negligence. Here is another simple proof. This proof relies on the fact that the rule of fault liability imposed on defendants can be redescribed as the rule that victims are strictly liable for the costs of harms that befall them unless they can establish the fault of their injurer. What we call fault liability can just as easily be characterized as strict liability for victims with the defense of injurer fault. But if this rule is efficient, then so too is the rule of strict (injurer) liability with the defense of victim fault. They are the same rule. All that changes is that every occurrence of ‘victim’ is replaced with ‘injurer’ and vice versa. One rule is efficient if and only if the other is. The rule of fault liability is efficient, and therefore the rule of strict liability with plaintiff fault must be as well. In those cases in which both rules are efficient, the choice between the two depends on other features of the rules: in particular, costs associated with their administration.[1]

Notwithstanding the fact that it illuminates important features of legal practice and remains an invaluable tool in the assessment and reform of the law, economic analysis has spawned considerable criticism. Let's begin with two straightforward objections. Economic analysis reduces reasonable risk taking to rational risk taking. In doing so, it treats the care I owe you as identical to the care I would ‘owe’ myself. Suppose I engage in an activity whose benefit to me is 100 and whose costs to me varies. Whenever the costs to me are under 100 it will be rational for me to absorb the costs and continue on. As soon as the costs to me exceed the benefits, it will no longer be rational for me to engage in the activity.

Economic analysis draws no distinction between the case in which the costs and benefits are mine alone and the case in which the benefits are mine to enjoy and the costs yours to endure. But what is reasonable to expect of me when all the costs are mine to bear may not be what is reasonable to demand of me when the benefits are mine to enjoy and the costs yours to bear. To be sure, there is no difference between these cases from the point of view of collective rationality, but that is just the point. There is no reason to identify the reasonable with the rational in the torts context, where one party (the injurer) secures the benefits (in the form of freedom from the costs of precautions) and the other party (the victim) bears the costs (in the form of the costs of injuries more likely to occur). Economic analysis in effect imposes the fungability of costs on the practice of torts without showing that in fact the practice treats costs in this way. That is one reason for thinking that economic analysts are reformers, not analysts of tort law.

Now the economic arguments we have considered talk loosely of fault and strict liability, but nowhere invoke the notion of a duty. As we have already seen, the duty element of a tort has two dimensions. The first concerns those to whom I owe a duty of care; the second concerns the content of that duty. As we noted above, the fault standard is part of the content of some of our duties to others; it does not mark out the class of individuals to whom I have a duty. The distinction between the scope and content of the duty of care is central to the American tort case, Palsgraf v. Long Island R.R.. Famously, Judge Cardozo argued that each of us has a duty to moderate our actions by taking into account only the interests of those who fall within the ambit of foreseeable risk. I have to guard against injuring those who fall within the zone of danger associated with my conduct. Others may be injured by what I do, and what I do may have been lamentable or mischievous, but those who fall outside the ambit of foreseeable risk have no claim in torts against me. They have no claim, not because I did not act badly or carelessly. Ex hypothesi, I have. They have no claim against me because I did not wrong them. I did not wrong them because I had no duty to take their interests into account in regulating my conduct. This point cannot be emphasized enough. The only individuals who can in torts have a claim against me are those to whom I have a duty of care. It is only with respect to those individuals that I must exercise reasonable care.

The problem for economic analysis is that the duty restriction on liability is incompatible with the goal of inducing individuals to take appropriate precautions. In order to encourage injurers to take appropriate precautions, each must face the full costs of his activity. But the duty requirement allows injurers to displace at least some of the costs of their conduct, costs that efficiency requires them to internalize. This is one reason that economic analysis has no place for the duty requirement.

Relatedly, tort law imposes the costs associated with the actual causal upshots of an individual's action. From an economic point of view, it is the risk of harm and not actual harm that should matter. One has to be careful not to misunderstand this point. Harms are of interest to the economic analyst. But the harms that matter from an economic point of view are the ones that have not yet occurred — the ones that can be optimally avoided by inducing individuals to take proper precautions — and not the harm that occasioned the case at hand. If what matters is reducing the incidence of future harms, then the main concern of economic analysis should be conduct that risks harm. Some conduct that risks harm actually causes harm as well, but not all conduct that risks harm does. Harm that has occurred is of interest only insofar as it provides reliable evidence of riskiness of the underlying conduct. In our tort practice, however, harm, not the risk of it, is a ground of liability and not merely an epistemic convenience. To the extent that the fact of harm is central to the practice of tort law and not an artifact of our limited epistemic capacities, the economic analysis falls short.

Finally, let us turn to the structure of tort law. Tort law has a bilateral structure. If the victim of another's mischief brings an action in torts, he brings it against the person he alleges has harmed him. In making out his case, the plaintiff argues that the defendant breached a duty of care owed to him, and that the breach has resulted in the harm of which he complains. From the normative point of view, the most basic relationship in torts is that between the injurer and the victim whom he has wronged. From the economic point of view, the most basic relationship is that between each litigant, taken separately, and the goal of minimizing the sum of accident and accident avoidance costs. That is, economic analysis separates the injurer from the victim. The relevant normative questions are: (1) what is the relationship between the injurer's conduct and the goals of tort law (cost reduction), and (2) what is the relationship between the victim's conduct and the goals of tort law?

The relationship between particular victims and injurers matters to economic analysis only insofar as features of it might provide evidence of the ability of either to reduce accident costs. Since the aim of accident law is optimally to reduce accident costs, the loss should be imposed on that individual who is in the best position to reduce costs at the lowest cost. This means that from an economic point of view, there is no reason why the victim should be suing the person he alleges injured him.

5. Theories of Torts: Corrective Justice

According to the principle of corrective justice, an individual who has wronged another has a duty to repair the wrongful losses occasioned thereby. The corrective justice account thus illuminates not just the bilateral structure of tort litigation, but tort law's emphasis on harm caused rather than harm risked.

Arguably, central to tort law is the moral notion of ‘ownership’, not the moral notion of ‘blame’. Tort law picks out a particular way of recognizing one's ‘ownership’ of some of the untoward outcomes for which one is responsible. It does this by imposing a duty to make good the costs one's wrongs have imposed on those one has wronged. And so, rather than trying to determine whether the injurer has satisfied the conditions that would warrant blaming him for what he has done, tort law inquires into whether the injurer has satisfied conditions necessary to impose on him a duty to repair the plaintiff's loss. In short, the law asks whether the loss is attributable to him as his doing: whether, to use the currently fashionable phrase, he is ‘outcome responsible’ for it. In the prevailing view, to be outcome responsible, the outcome must be foreseeable and avoidable.[2] This emphasis on the ascription of responsibility for outcomes rather than on ascriptions of blame or culpability makes sense within the corrective justice account of tort law in ways in which it would not within a traditional retributive view.

According to economic analysis, all liabilities are simply one or another cost. There is no significant normative difference among punishments, sanctions, duties of repair and taxes. All that matters is the way in which each impacts rational decision-making. But there are important normative differences among these kinds of costs that this crude picture misses. Tort law imposes a duty of repair, and while it is true that a person who is under a duty to act is constrained in the set of actions open to him, duties are neither punishments nor sanctions. In contrast with tort law, criminal wrongdoers are subject to punishment for their crimes, and while this means that they are not at liberty to prevent others from punishing them, they have no duty to be punished or to permit others to punish them.

There are other significant differences between the duty of repair in torts and punishment as a criminal sanction. The duty of repair in torts is a debt of repayment one owes those one has wronged and has injured as a result. Like other debts of repayment, it can be discharged by third parties — and not only if the debt holder has authorized repayment. By contrast ‘debts’ incurred as a result of criminal mischief cannot be discharged by third parties. I cannot serve your prison sentence justly. To be sure, I might be imprisoned for a crime you have committed, and my love for you may lead me to substitute myself for you when the time comes for you to begin your prison term. But both cases involve injustice: the first to me, the second to the world as a whole.

Nor can one guard against liability to criminal sanction by purchasing insurance. In contrast, it is common to purchase insurance to guard against the burdens of tort liability. Indeed, in some cases purchasing third party insurance is mandatory. Not only is it a mistake to lump together sanctions, taxes and liability judgments as interchangeable implements in the legal reformer's tool box, the practices for which each is appropriate are governed by different norms. Failure to notice the differences in character of these ‘costs’ disables one from understanding the underlying norms governing our differing legal and social institutions.

The emphasis on duties of repair as well as on the range of ways in which those duties can be discharged consonant with justice is illuminated by the principle of corrective justice in ways in which these features of tort law are not illuminated by either retributive or economic theory. The claim is that corrective justice explains the relationship between the duty to prevent or avoid harm on the one hand, and the duty to repair its costs on the other. It is a principle that grounds duties of repair, not the duties of care that are the bases of those duties of repair. Though it grounds duties of repair, it does not mandate a mechanism by which those duties are to be discharged.

It is tempting to think of corrective justice as a goal of tort law in the same way that economists think of efficiency or optimal deterrence as a goal of tort law. The better view is that corrective justice is not a goal of the law in the way in which efficiency might be. Rather, corrective justice itself is a principle of justification; it seeks to articulate grounds upon which a certain category of duties rest. It claims that certain duties of repair or repayment are grounded on one's responsibility for them. The grounds of the duty to repair are: (1) the fact that one has a prior duty to take into account the interests of another and to mitigate one's own conduct accordingly; (2) the fact that one has failed to do so; (3) the fact that one's failure to do so results (in an appropriate way) in harm to another; and (4) the harm that results is one for which can be charged to an agent as his doing, or, in the contemporary jargon, for which he is outcome responsible. No one claims that these grounds must be satisfied if ever an agent is to have a duty of repair or repayment. Corrective justice grounds some, but, very likely, not all of our duties of repair.

If this is the way to think about corrective justice, how ought we think about its relationship to fault and strict liability? The question is whether the duties of repair and the conditions under which they arise in tort law are ones which are by and large grounded in the principle of corrective justice so conceived. As I argued above, both strict and fault liability in torts involve wrongs, that is, the breach of an underlying duty of care. The fault in fault liability is not a modifier of the character of the injurer but a constraint on the content of the underlying duty of care he owes the plaintiff. The difference between fault and strict liability standards is a difference in the nature of the content of the underlying duties we owe one another.

In strict liability, the defendant is thought to owe the plaintiff a duty of the form A not to harm by X-ing. It is natural to think that the duty is absolute or unconstrained. But it is in fact constrained in several ways, and in each of the ways it is constrained, the duty in strict liability resonates with the conditions of a duty of repair in corrective justice. The blaster is liable strictly, not to everyone who is injured by his conduct, but only to those to whom he owed a duty not to harm by blasting: those who fall within the ambit of foreseeable risk. Second, he is not liable to all those that he injures because he blasts, but only to those that are injured in the appropriate way by his blasting. In strict liability, there are the requirements of a wrong to a plaintiff (class), a harm, the appropriate causal connection between the two, and other elements of responsibility for the outcome, including forseeability and avoidability.

These same elements are present in all the classic cases of fault liability. The only difference, as we have noted, above is that in fault liability the content of the underlying duty not to harm differs from the duty in cases of strict liability. In fault, the duty is not to harm faultily, that is, negligently, recklessly or intentionally. In both the duty of repair requires the breach of a duty (a wrong), and responsibility for the outcome (the injury or harm being caused in the appropriate way by that aspect of the conduct that made it a wrong). Arguably, the duties imposed in tort law are paradigmatically duties of corrective justice. The bilateral structure of tort law and the pattern of practical reasoning embodied within it is transparent under the light of corrective justice, while cloudy at best, and mysterious at worst when viewed in the dim light of economic analysis. Moreover, the same principle explains both the structure and substance of tort law, and thus provides explanatory economy as well as consistency.

The corrective justice approach to tort law has been the object of serious criticism. I want to focus on three of the most important kinds of these. The first set of objections focuses on the concept of wrong at work in the principle of corrective justice. The second raises questions about the claim that corrective justice is a matter of justice. The third raises broader doubts about the claim that the goal or purpose of tort law is to achieve corrective justice. Let's consider these in turn.

As I have characterized it, corrective justice sets out grounds upon which a certain category of duties of repair or repayment are justified. One of the grounds of a duty to repair is the existence of a wrong, that is, the breach of a duty of care to another. One might say that whereas corrective justice theorists have been extremely concerned to specify appropriately the conditions under which it is fair to impose duties to avoid or prevent untoward consequences, they have offered precious little guidance regarding the actual duties to avoid or prevent harm that we owe to one another. This complaint has been expressed in two slightly different forms of criticism. The first is that to the extent that corrective justice offers only an account of what ought to be done when some individuals wrong others and not an account of what constitutes a wrong in the relevant sense, the principle of corrective justice is empty or merely formal. The second is that since the principle of corrective justice appears to leave open what counts as a wrong, it may be that the wrongs that give rise to a duty of repair are merely the failures to take cost justified precautions, in which case the principle of corrective justice collapses into the principle of efficiency.[3] A related objection is that corrective justice offers us no way of determining when a rule of strict liability is appropriately imposed and when a rule of fault liability is. In other words, corrective justice may tell us that strict and fault liability both involve the breach of a duty of care and that the difference between them concerns the content of the relevant duty, but it offers us no guidance as to why some activities call for the duty of care typified by strict liability whereas others call for a duty of care of the sort associated with fault liability. If nothing else, the economic analysis, as we have seen above, gives very clear guidance on this question.

In one form or another, the first objection is by far the most pervasive objection to corrective justice accounts of tort law. Were it a sound objection, it would be devastating. In fact, it is not a serious objection, and rests on an important misunderstanding. There is in morality, as elsewhere, a significant, if limited, division of labor. It is not the burden of corrective justice to explain the content of our duties not to harm others or to determine their scope. It is instead a principle that grounds some of the duties we incur in the event that we fail to comply with our duties not to harm others. We have a responsibility in general to mitigate our conduct by the impact it is likely to have on the interests of others. This is a matter of common sense morality and simple fairness. This general duty we have to others is not itself a matter of corrective justice. Nor are the specific duties we have to particular persons to take into account the impact of our conduct on their interests in concrete ways matters of corrective justice. It is a good question of morality, just what it is we owe one another concretely in order to discharge our general obligations of fairness to one another. How must I mitigate my conduct in the light of your (presumably, legitimate) interests? And which of those interests must I take into account?

One can hold the view that drawing up a list of such concrete duties is the task of moral philosophy. Others may hold that moral philosophy is unlikely to be able to provide us with a definitive list, that at least part of duties we have to others will depend on the practices we happen to have. In any case, these underlying duties are not themselves duties of repair; they are duties of care. It is not a burden of corrective justice to identify or ground them.

Quite the contrary, in fact. Once we have concrete requirements to take the interests of others into account in this or that way in regulating our own affairs, we face the altogether different question of whether, and in what ways, the breach of these duties impacts the normative relationships between the parties . What, in other words, are the normative consequences of a breach? Here is where the principle of corrective justice makes its claim. It holds that in the event certain conditions attend the breach, a second order duty of repair exists. Whereas the underlying duties of care establish in part normative relations between the parties, the breach of such a duty creates a different but related normative relationship. Or so the principle of corrective justice claims

We could adopt practices in which the losses suffered by victims as the result of the breach of some are to borne collectively by us all; or we could adopt practices in which the victims are left to bear their own costs. Or we could adopt a practice in which particular wrongdoers have the duty to make good the costs they have imposed. Or we could adopt some mixture of these responses, and others as well. In fact that is precisely what we do. If we adopt a practice of imposing a duty of repair on wrongdoers, such a practice is (were other conditions satisfied) defensible as a matter of corrective justice.

It is a further question whether commitment to the principle of corrective justice demands that we have such practices. It is one thing to claim that our practices of tort law — the ones we actually have and not all logically possible ones — are usefully or even best illuminated by a principle of corrective justice; quite another to claim that corrective justice requires that we have an institution of tort law — that is, an institution that imposes legally enforceable duties of repair that could be defended on the grounds of corrective justice. The principle of corrective justice justifies some of the legally enforceable duties to repair we might incur. It does not claim that we suffer an injustice in the event we do not recognize such duties in our legal practices. So, for example, there is no reason to suppose that a no-fault scheme of liability for accidentally imposed losses that distributes the costs of accidents through general tax coffers would be incompatible with corrective justice. Such an institutional arrangement is best seen as reflecting the idea that we are less concerned with the source of misfortune than with the urgency such misfortunes create for those who bear them.

To be sure, there are differences between these cases. In the former, no one may be responsible for the misfortune one suffers; in the latter case, someone is. Corrective justice embodies important moral values for it emphasizes not only the notion of misfortune and loss, but the idea that we owe duties of care to one another and the fact that some of the misfortunes that others suffer are our doing. Corrective justice connects us to our actions and the impact our actions have on others in ways in which other principles of justice, for example, distributive justice, do not. In arguing that corrective justice does not mandate a system of tort law I am not saying that nothing would be lost from the moral point of view. Whether something is lost depends on whether we elsewhere express in our institutional life and practices the moral values that are embodied in the principle of corrective justice. Those values can be expressed adequately in a range of formal and informal practices. They need not be expressed through a tort law. For what a tort law does is express those values in a particular way. It ties together one's duties to take into account the impact of one's conduct on others and one's responsibility for what happens to others in the event one fails to do so in a particular way, namely, by imposing a duty to make good the loss. We could separate the former from the latter, however. We could have practices of making formal apologies, of offering services or other forms of aid or restitution, while at the same time allocating the costs of misfortune more efficiently through a general tax coffer. If we have a tort system, it is not because such a system is mandated by corrective justice. If such a system it is defensible it is because, on balance, such a practice is a defensible way of expressing the values embodied in corrective justice and of doing so in ways that are cost effective and accident cost avoiding, and so on.

The second objection was that if the principle of corrective justice is compatible with an economic theory of the underlying wrongs or duties of care we owe one another, then corrective justice is reduced to economic analysis. Whereas no set of underlying duties falls out of the principle of corrective justice, the principle constrains the set of duties that can be protected or secured by it. The general form of the constraint can be put abstractly. The underlying claims of right and duty sustained by the principle of corrective justice must be such that the imposition of a duty of repair occasioned by their breach are requirements of justice and not merely something that we can provide good instrumental reasons for.

It may be helpful to illustrate the general point by considering a different, and less controversial example (at least in this regard): that is, the relationship between criminal punishment and retributivism. Retributivism can only be plausible as an account of criminal punishment if the crimes identified by the law are the sort that makes it in general clear why punishing someone for them would be deserved. If, for example, there were no excuses in the criminal law — if all liability to criminal sanction were strict in that sense — and if only the most trivial offences were crimes, retributivism would be an implausible account of our criminal practices. The plausibility of retributivism as an account of criminal punishment depends on the conduct deemed criminal by the law and the conditions of responsibility for those crimes being appropriate to an attribution of culpability or blame. This example illustrates two important points. First, no one criticizes retributivism as empty because it does not provide a full accounting of the wrongs for which punishment would be deserved. Second, even though it does not provide an accounting of the underlying wrongs for which punishment would be appropriate, it does constrain membership in that set.

The same is true of corrective justice. While corrective justice is not a theory of the wrongs it rectifies, it can only make sense of tort law if in general the kinds of wrongs identified in torts are ones that must as a matter of justice be repaired. Another way to put this point is to say that even though corrective justice does not have nor must it provide a theory of the wrongs that are identified in torts, it in fact sets out what are the clear or paradigmatic cases of such wrongs. It clearly meets that requirement, for the wrongs it picks out as paradigmatic — trespass against property, the intentional torts of battery and assault, negligent regard for the interests of others, and so on — are the bread and butter of tort law.

We can draw three conclusions from this discussion. First, corrective justice is not empty. It relies on the basic notion of a division of labor in moral theory. Within its domain, it is as substantive a principle as one can find. Second, it is not compatible with all underlying theories of wrong. In fact it imposes significant constraints on what can fall within the class of wrongs for which repair can be a requirement of justice. Finally, it does not require another full theory of underlying wrongs in order to fill out its content. That is, because corrective justice identifies a set of paradigms of wrong compatible with it, the content of corrective justice does not depend on a full moral theory of wrongs. Rather, the notion of a wrong compatible with corrective justice may be filled out by our practices of corrective justice — including tort law.[4]

We turn now to the question of whether corrective justice is an independent ideal of justice. Here the worry is that what makes corrective justice seem like a principle of justice undermines its claim to independence, and whatever supports its independence undermines its claim to being a principle of justice. Corrective justice is a principle that requires correction in an underlying distribution of holdings. The wrongs that are the concern of corrective justice, one might think, are violations of duties we owe one another to respect the rights we have in those holdings. If those holdings are just, then corrective justice requires us to protect it. But in doing so, it does no more than return individuals to the positions to which they were entitled — as a matter of distributive justice. Understood in this way, corrective justice is the ex post component of distributive justice. That is, the claim to repair is a requirement of distributive, not corrective, justice. Or, put the other way, there is no independent principle of corrective justice. On the other hand, if the underlying distribution is not just, then corrective justice can sustain, enforce or entrench unjust distributions of resources. In that case, corrective justice is an independent principle, but it seeks to impose duties to support unjust institutions. Independent, yes, a principle of justice, no.

In meeting this objection, corrective justice theorists have typically taken either of two approaches. The first is to identify the domain of distributive justice with the initial or underlying distribution of holdings and corrective justice with the norms governing the ex post transfer of those holdings. Corrective justice is a matter of transactional justice in this sense. Whatever the underlying distribution of holdings may be, we recognize legitimate and illegitimate means of transferring them. These are separate, if related, concerns. If agreement or gift moves resources from one person to another, that is a legitimate form of transfer. If the result is a more uneven or unfair overall distribution of resources, that is a concern of distributive, not transactional justice. Similarly, if fraud or force moves resources from one person to another, that is an illegitimate form of transfer. If the result is more equitable from the point of view of distributive justice, that does not mean that the benefits and costs of the fraud ought not to not be annulled. They must be as a matter of transactional justice. And so on.

One problem with this line of argument is that it explains the sense in which corrective justice is a principle of justice by drawing what may well be an artificial distinction between transactional and distributive justice. On most plausible views of distributive justice, it concerns the mechanisms and institutions of resource allocation — including markets, and non-voluntary transfer practices. In other words, the mechanisms of transfer are part of distributive justice. So the distinction between the transactional and the distributive may be artificial at best.[5]

The second solution is based on a distinction between the justice of a distribution and its legitimacy. A legitimate distribution of resources may fall short of being a fully just one. While it may be true that no one can have a moral duty to repair losses when doing so merely entrenches a patently unjust distribution of resources, it is also not true that an individual can have a duty to repair losses only if doing so protects a less than fully just distribution of resources. Individuals can have duties to repair losses that support legitimate institutions for distributing holdings, and a system of holdings can be legitimate even if it falls short of the demands of justice.

Whereas a legitimate distribution of resources is adequate to confer on each individual a right against others for repair in the event of wrongful harm to his share, the legitimacy of the system of holdings does not confer on each individual a right against the government to prohibit redistribution. Indeed, the government always has a right, indeed one could argue that it has a duty, to redistribute holdings if justice requires doing so. If a distribution is not just, the state can redistribute for the purposes of achieving justice without triggering claims to repair by those whose interests it hinders or harms. But a distribution that is legitimate if not fully just is adequate to ground private remedies in order to sustain the interests individuals have in their holdings and to secure their expectations accordingly.

It is a further question what the standard of legitimacy is. What must be true of a distribution of holdings before protecting or securing it by coercive rectificatory practices is permissible as a matter of justice? This is too big a topic to address here. We can say, though, that the notion of legitimacy I have in mind is the same as that which generally justifies coercion — e.g. in the name of the criminal law — in legitimate but not fully just states. If these conditions are not met, we might nevertheless endorse practices of repair that protect holdings, but not as a matter of justice. Rather doing so might be desirable to increase security or as a step along the way to institutions that offer a legitimate promise of prosperity and equality, or the like. Duties of repair are always matters of ‘correction’, but they are not matters of corrective justice unless the conditions of legitimacy in the institutions of resource allocation are satisfied.[6]

We come finally to one last objection to the corrective justice account of tort law. Here the worry is that if achieving corrective justice were the concern of tort law, then prosecuting wrongful conduct would be the province of the state. In fact, the state's role in torts is primarily a passive one. Tort law gives victims an option to pursue redress. The law does not aim to achieve justice; it merely provides a mechanism for victims to pursue redress. If tort law meant to promote justice, it would more actively pursue wrongdoers and prosecute cases against them. Victims would be encouraged to appear as witnesses in such prosecutions, and because they have an interest in having the prosecutions succeed, they would do so. But victims are the prosecutors in torts, not witnesses for the prosecution. On this view, if we want to understand tort law, we need to uncover the reasons we might have for providing victims with opportunities for pursuing the particular form of redress tort law gives.[7]

This is an interesting line of argument, and I cannot give it the care it warrants here. I would note, however, that one response would begin by acknowledging that at bottom tort law provides victims with a form of redress. The particular form of redress it provides, however, is what one would expect as a matter of corrective justice. Beyond that, the reason the law does not prosecute on a victim's behalf or on the behalf of the principle of corrective justice, may have more to do with considerations of personal autonomy and privacy than it has to do with the underlying aims of tort law. That is, there are constraints on political power that limit the authority of the state to sue on behalf of an unwilling victim. It may be that the most the state can do consistent with respect for personal autonomy and privacy is to provide victims with the opportunity to seek repair and to insure that warranted claims to repair are enforceable by the law. Lastly, we want to distinguish between the claim that the law of torts embodies a principle of corrective justice and the very different claim that tort law aims to achieve or pursue corrective justice. Tort law may have no such aims; it may have no aims at all. But it would be a mistake to infer that tort law does not embody a principle of corrective justice, or that it is best explained, therefore, by the principle of corrective justice.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

causation: in the law | justice: distributive | legal philosophy: economic analysis of law | privacy