Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

The Economic Analysis of Law

First published Mon Nov 26, 2001; substantive revision Tue May 16, 2006

Economic analysis of law applies the tools of microeconomic theory to the analysis of legal rules and institutions. Ronald Coase [1961] and Guido Calabresi [1961] are generally identified as the seminal articles but Commons [1924] and Hale [1952] among others had brought economic thinking to the study of law in the 1910s and 1920s. Moreover, as I will elaborate below, economic analysis of law derives from several different intellectual traditions in economics.

Richard Posner [1973] brought economic analysis of law to the attention of the general legal academy; by the late 1970s, his work had provoked a vigorous controversy within the legal academy. That controversy has usually defined the debate around the philosophical foundations of economic analysis of law. Posner made two claims: (I) Common law legal rules are, in fact, efficient; and (II) Legal rules ought to be efficient. In both claims, "efficient" means maximization of the social willingness-to-pay. In the course of the controversy, two other claims were articulated in Kornhauser [1984, 1985]: (III) Legal processes select for efficient rules; and (IV) individuals respond to legal rules economically. (In this third claim, "efficient" means "Pareto efficient.") Kornhauser identified this last, behavioral claim as central to the enterprise. A fifth claim is also implicit in the literature: (V) on the best interpretation of law, common law doctrines promote efficiency.[1] Notice that (V) differs from (I) in important respects. According to (V), an economic interpretation fits a doctrine not because, as asserted in (I), the legal rules in fact induce efficient behavior but because the rule would induce efficient behavior within the view of the world that seems to underlie the judicial decisions. (I) is an empirical claim that requires the analyst to determine whether the actual behavior induced by legal rules is efficient; it requires knowledge of how individuals do, in fact, behave and of which behavior in the real world would, in fact, be efficient. (V) requires only knowledge of the content of judicial opinions; the analyst interprets these opinions to extract an economic model that underlies the decision. (V) might be true even though legal rules induced inefficient behavior in the real world because the announced legal rule might be efficient within the implicit model used by judges.

These five claims do not correspond directly to traditional questions in the philosophy of law. The evaluative claim (II) that legal rules ought to be efficient would, if directed to judges, qualify as a theory of adjudication, one of the central concerns of anglo-american philosophy of law. Central philosophic questions concerning the concept of law, of its normativity, and the obligation to obey the law, however, are not directly addressed. The behavioral claim as well as the evolutionary claim (III) and the positive claim (II), by contrast, concern empirical issues that philosophers of law generally neglect. Nevertheless, the controversy within the legal academy has generally regarded economic analysis of law as providing a comprehensive theory of law that challenges traditional approaches to law. Indeed, an explanation of the vehemence of the controversy should identify differences in fundamental views concerning law.

1. Two Strands of Thought within Economic Analysis of Law

The vast literature of economic analysis of law is not easily characterized. For purposes of this essay, I identify two distinct strands of thought within economic analysis of law. I shall call one strand policy analysis and the second strand political economy.[2] These two strands may be differentiated along a number of dimensions.

First, policy analysis generally focuses on analysis of the effects of legal rules and institutions on outcomes. An outcome usually consists of the "objective" effects of the rule or institution on the behavior of "private" individuals. By contrast, political economy generally investigates the operation of political institutions such as courts, legislatures, the executive and administrative agencies; it usually focuses on the behavior of the public officials within those institutions. Ideally, one would trace the effects of different institutional rules and structures through the behavior of public officials to the effects on the behavior of private individuals. In practice, however, tracing effects of changes in institutional rules to final outcomes is too difficult and too uncertain. A change in the structure of legislative institutions, for example, would likely affect the content of the legislative programs enacted in the jurisdiction. To trace effects to final outcomes in terms of the behavior of private individuals would thus require the analyst to predict the set of statutes that would be enacted within various legislative structures.

Second, and related to the first, policy analysis generally assumes that public officials in general and judges in particular, are conscientious. Judges thus enforce the legal rules as they are announced, regardless of the judge's own view of the desirability of the legal rule or its impact on her personally. Political economy, by contrast, assumes that public officials have the same motivation as private individuals; they are self-interested. In the context of adjudication, as will be elaborated below, the political economist interprets self-interested judicial behavior as decisions that promote the policy preferences of the judge.

Third, policy analysis generally adopts a welfarist stance towards evaluation of legal rules while political economy has evolved from a more contractarian tradition. Policy analysts, when evaluating legal rules ask whether that legal rule induces behavior that satisfies some welfarist criterion, usually either Pareto efficiency or (constrained) social welfare maximization.[3] Political economy, however, has to a large extent emerged from an economic tradition, exemplified by James Buchanan,[4] that rejects the maximization of social welfare as a criterion and seeks to evaluate political institutions on grounds of consent or, more generally, within the contractarian tradition.

Fourth, we might understand the distinction between policy analysis and political economy as a difference in the view of the instrumentalism of law. Policy analysis tends to proceed legal rule by legal rule. It asks, for example, how does a change in the standard of care affect the behavior of tortfeasors and tort victims? Or how does contracting behavior differ if the measure of damages shifts from expectation damages to reliance damages? The analyst thus imputes a purpose (usually, but not necessarily, of maximization of social welfare) to the promulgator of the legal rule. The analyst then assumes that the policymaker has chosen the legal rule that best promotes her (imputed) objective. Legal rules are then instrumental to the achievement of the posited goal; call this approach rule instrumentalism.

The political economist, by contrast, generally denies that any purpose can be attributed to the promulgator of a legal rule largely because legal rules are not promulgated by a single individual with power to control unilaterally the content of the rule. Certainly, from the perspective of political economy, legislators have no common purpose and one should not assume or expect that any statute maximizes social welfare. Legislation results from the interplay of interest groups that do not reflect all interests within society. Even if the legislature did reflect all interests within society, each interest does not have an equal (or proportionate) say in the formulation of the statute.[5] Finally, even if each interest did play a "proportionate" role in the formulation of the statute, Arrow's General Possibility Theorem teaches that the aggregation of interests might still not yield a coherent purpose. Political economy thus rejects rule instrumentalism.

One might attribute the rejection of rule instrumentalism within political economy to a commitment to an explanatory rather than a normative project. At the level of constitutional political economy, however, the research program usually adopts the perspective of a constitutional designer and this designer arguably has a view of law that includes institutional instrumentalism: i.e., legal institutions, rather than specific legal rules, promote the specific goals of the constitutional designer.[6] The constitutional designer seeks a political structure that promotes her goals. The project of constitutional political economy is thus normative in nature. Indeed the normative nature of the project dominates any explanatory aim. Many within the project — see Brennan and Buchanan [1981, 1985] — argue that one ought to adopt an economic theory of behavior of public officials and private individuals even if that theory is not the best explanatory theory.

These last two differences suggest that the two strands of economic analysis of law may endorse radically different positive and normative theories of adjudication. These theories are sketched and discussed in section 5 below.

More significantly, for purposes of this entry, however, is the basic similarity between these two strands of economic analysis of law. Both of these strands adopt the standard assumption of neo-classical economics that each individual seeks to maximize her preferences. Moreover, they generally assume that each individual acts in her own self-interest, narrowly defined. This approach presents the single, greatest obstacle to the articulation of a general theory of law that confronts economic analysis: it has no room for the normative aspect of law. It is this denial of the normativity of law that accounts for the vehement resistance that economic analysis provoked within the legal academy.

2. The Concept of Law

Though commentators often characterize economic analysis of law as providing a comprehensive theory of law, its narrower ambitions become apparent when one realizes that economic analysis of law has not explicitly addressed the question "What is law?". Indeed, economic analyses of law generally presuppose a concept of law in that the law is uncontroversially known to all actors.

As suggested in the next subsection, a straightforward legal positivism fits the concept of law implicit in policy analyses of legal rules. These analyses presume the law is known and investigate its causal consequences. The political economy project, however, suggests but has not yet systematically pursued, a distinct, social scientific approach to the concept of law. I discuss this more radical approach in the second subsection

2.1 Legal Positivism and Policy Analysis in Economic Analysis of Law

The policy analysis strand of economic analysis of law often implicitly adopts some variant of legal positivism as its understanding of the concept of law. Recall that the policy analysis treats the behavior of judges in particular (and sometimes public officials generally) differently from the behavior of those subject to the legal rules.

An economic analysis of the behavioral effects of a legal rule generally begins with the assumption that the legal rule is clearly known not only to judges and other public officials but also to those subject to the legal rule. This knowledge of private citizens might amount simply to the knowledge of what consequences follow from each possible action the agent might take. Actions that provoke a response from public officials generally, or judges in particular, have no special character to them; the citizen in her deliberations treats the consequences of rule-following or rule-breaking as she treats any other price. On Hart's account of legal positivism, however, a private citizen may adopt this detached attitude towards legal rules. The concept of law inherent in policy analysis is thus consistent with positivism.

The typical model, however, assumes that public officials conscientiously apply the legal rule under study. The public official does not identify the rule that would best promote her own preferences and then apply (or not apply) that rule; rather she "conscientiously" applies the rule that "ought" to govern the event. Conscientious application here simply implies that the official may uncontroversially apply an identified legal rule to the events in question.[7] This assumption might reflect a "partial equilibrium" approach to the analysis of the problem at hand. If the effects of the legal rule are the central focus of inquiry, the incentives and behavior of public officials who enforce that rule may be of less interest. The analysis of the institutional structures and processes that insure the "conscientious" application of law by public officials are left for later analysis.

Other aspects of the economic analysis of law are consistent with this positivist approach to the law. Economic analysis of social norms, for example, often provides a characterization of social norms that largely coincides with Hart's own scheme for distinguishing social rules that are legal rules from social rules that are not. Specifically, economic analysts of law point to the decentralized character of the promulgation and enforcement of legal rules as the properties that distinguish social norms from legal rules.

2.2 Towards a Social Scientific Concept of Law?

Two positions dominate philosophical debates over the concept of law. One set of positions, advanced by legal positivists such as Raz [1994] and Coleman [2001] argues that the articulation of a concept of law is an exercise in self-understanding. They pursue their position through conceptual analysis. The second position, advanced, for example, by Dworkin [2004], Murphy [2001], and Perry [2001], contends that we should adopt the concept of law that best advances our political aims.

Though the two positions disagree on the methodology for determining the concept of law, they apparently agree that a concept of law should provide a unitary answer to three distinct questions. Two of these questions are internal to any legal practice but one is not. The first internal question — the professional question — asks: which public, collectively chosen norms ought public officials and citizens use to guide their actions? The second internal question — the adjudicatory question — asks: how ought (or, occasionally, do) judges decide cases? The third, external question — the differentiation question — asks:how does law differ from other social phenomena such as coercion, morality, and politics?

Legal positivists generally and H.L.A. Hart [1961] in particular seek to answer the third, external question. Their answer, however, relies on an answer to the professional question. Positivist identify legal practices in terms of a rule of recognition used by the legal officials to identify the set of norms that governs their (public) actions. This account elides the answer to the first, professional question with the third, differentiation question. Moreover, the answer to the professional question provides at least a partial answer to the second, adjudicatory question. After all, legal adjudication must rely at least in part on legal norms and the rule of recognition clearly demarcates legal norms from other norms and grounds of decision.

Dworkin, by contrast, begins with a theory of adjudication. He provides an account of how judges decide cases. He then generalizes this account to an account of law through the recognition that all citizens, not only judges, must apply law. Each must answer the same questions that confront a judge in resolving a case. Finally, this account distinguishes law from other phenomena because law promotes a distinct political virtue, legality or, as Dworkin terms it, integrity.

Political economy, by contrast, pursues a substantially different project. It seeks to understand the ways in which society structures its political, economic and legal institutions. This project suggests neither a conceptual nor a political concept of law but a social-scientific one that would help us understand the social world in general, the emergence and persistence of social groups over time and the causes and consequences of different governmental structures. Political economy, or a general sociology, then seeks to answer a question similar to the third, external question of differentiation posed by the philosophical discussion of the concept of law. How do we differentiate structures of social governance from other phenomena within a society such as gangs and games? Similarly, to discover cross cultural and intertemporal regularities, the analyst must identify comparable structures within different societies. That is, our criteria for differentiation must work cross culturally and intertemporally.

An understanding of society and social phenomena, of course, may not require anything akin to the concept of law at issue in the philosophical debates. Two different reasons, however, suggest some relation between the philosophical debate and the social-scientific inquiry. One should recall that Hart [1961] characterized, perhaps off-handedly, his project as one in the descriptive sociology of law. Such a sociological project presumably requires a social scientific concept of law. Moreover, once one had articulated a viable and useful set of social scientific concepts one might ask what relation they bear to the issues at the center of the philosophical inquiries of the value of legality and of articulating the criterion that distinguishes legal from other grounds of decision.

Adopting Hart's discussion as a starting point, I shall in the rest of this subsection, sketch a social-scientific concept of a governance structure and suggest how it might relate both to the project of political economy and to the philosophical debate over the concept of law. (Kornhauser [2004] provides a more extended account.)

One of Hart's rhetorical devices provides a useful starting point for the development of a social scientific concept. To introduce the concept of a secondary rule, Hart [1961 recounts of a fable concerning the emergence of a legal system in a small community. He suggests that a small, homogeneous, stable and closely knit society requires no differentiated structures of governance. These structures emerge to resolve problems that arise in societies that are large, heterogeneous, or subject to environmental uncertainty. Though Hart identifies only three such problems, I shall identify four distinct functions that might be distributed across societal structures: (1) the characterization of socially acceptable (or unacceptable) behavior, a task the importance of which grows as the rate of change in society increases. (2) Policing of behavior to identify likely instances of deviant behavior; more anonymous societies may require more institutionalized policing; (3) Definitive adjudication of non-conformity to social norms. And (4) Sanctioning of deviant behavior.

Governance within a society requires that the society somehow accomplish each of these four tasks. A society might do so in a number of different ways. A governance structures is the set of institutional structures within a society that address one or more of the four problems of adaptation, detection, application, and sanction that are the central elements of governance. An institutional structure is a decision-making protocol that specifies procedures relevant to the resolution of one or more of the problems of adaptation, detection, application, and sanction. Clear understanding requires a distinction here between institutional structures, realized institutions, and functioning institutions. This distinction parallels the distinction between game forms, games, and plays of a game in the theory of games. As noted before, an institutional structure is simply the basic rules or protocol for governance; a realized institution is an institutional structure situated in a given society and populated by particular individuals; a functioning institution is a realized institution as it operates in a society in actual conditions.

A crude taxonomy of governance structures might distinguish them along two dimensions: the degree of institutional differentiation in the structure and the mechanism of internal, “bureaucratic” control.

A governance structure may be more or less differentiated from other institutions (such as those governing exchange or reproduction) in a society.. Hart considered two extremes: a simple society with no differentiation of governance from other institutions and modern, municipal legal systems that have distinct institutions for adapatation, policing, adjudication, and sanctioning. Indeed, a society such as the United States has multiple legislative, executive and judicial institutions that relate in complex ways.

Hart similarly contrasted two motivations for compliance with law or legal obligations: incentives that rely on the self-interest of individuals and acceptance of rules as guides to action. For Hart, law required that a core set of public officials had to accept the rule of recognition as an authoritative guide to action.

Political economy, by contrast, aims to explain all legal phenomena in terms of the self-interest of agents. On this account, of course, legal rules do not play any role in the explanation of behavior of either private individuals or public officials. An individual faced with a choice considers the costs and benefits that each option presents to her. These costs and benefits will include "legal costs and benefits" but these costs and benefits are not determined by rules; they are the result of the incentives that private and public officials face. Rules are only rules of thumb that express the response of average individuals under normal circumstances to particular events. Which rules of thumb are used, of course, may greatly affect the social equilibrium achieved in a particular jurisdiction.

Political economy thus seeks a concept of governance that relies only on incentives; it consequently denies the existence of legal systems in Hart's sense. It might nonetheless acknowledge a different conception of law. Some political economists, for example, suggest that legality in the sense of an impartial "rule of law" promotes economic growth. The political economist then might identify law or legal systems with governance structures that realize such a rule of law (in given circumstances).

3. The Obligation to Obey the Law

In the previous section, I discussed the role that legal rules played in the practical deliberations of private agents. On that account, the sanctions imposed for non-compliance with the rule provided agents with prudential reasons to conform the legal rule. Independent of those sanctions, however, the agent had no reason to obey the law. I argued further that, within the political economy strand of economic analysis of law, public officials had only prudential reasons for conformity to their public obligations. From the perspective of the last section, then, no one has a general obligation to obey the law.

In this section, I suggest that economic analysis nonetheless offers a structure within which one may articulate prudential accounts for a general obligation to obey the law.

3.1 Equilibrium Selection

Legal positivism grounds law in social practice. Its difficulty in explaining the normativity of law emerges directly from this attention to the social nature of law; social facts themselves, it would seem, cannot give rise to any obligation. Various authors (e.g., Postema [1982]) have tried to resolve this conundrum through an analysis of convention as a coordination game.

In a coordination game, the interests of all players are coincident; each player ranks the possible outcomes of the game identically. The difficulty for the players arises because they do not know which of the multiple equilibria of the game to play. Consider, for example, an island in a pristine legal state-there are no legal rules. The individuals must decide on which side of the road to drive. Formulated as a game, each individual has two strategies: drive on the right (R) and drive on the left (L). Each has an identical evaluation of the outcomes of the strategy choices of everyone. Each ranks the outcomes in which everyone chooses the same side of the road — all R or all L — highest and each ranks the outcome in which half choose R and half choose L worst.[10] This game has two equilibria: all choose R and all choose L. Unfortunately, knowledge that two equilibria exist does not help agents determine which strategy to adopt, or, alternatively which equilibrium to play.

Announcement of a legal rule in this context can coordinate the players' actions. It gives each a reason to choose as the rule dictates if it affects the individual's beliefs concerning which strategy the other agents will adopt. On this account, the social fact that individuals accept the law provides each individual with a reason to act. This reason is independent of any sanction that the law might impose for non-compliance. Moreover, this reason is prudential in that it best promotes the agent's own welfare and moral, in the sense that it best promotes the well-being of all. This coincidence results from the coincidence of interests of all agents.

Law understood as a coordination device at best provides a partial account of the grounds of normativity. Obviously, many if not most laws concern conduct in which the interests of agents do not coincide. Coordination cannot provide agents with a reason to act in this case. Moreover, it is not clear that the acceptance of a rule of recognition by public officials constitutes a coordination game. Consider a specific judge J. That judge may think rule R is the best rule of recognition. Consistent with that belief she considers a world in which all judges accept R as best. Nothing guarantees that a second judge J′ consider R best. He may think R′ better. J′ will also believe that a world in which all judges accept R′ is best. But it is not obvious that J must consider a world in which all accept R′ as preferable to one in which a majority accept R.

Finally, note that the argument is incomplete. It requires that individuals have sufficiently common knowledge of the law and that others know the law for it to have any plausibility. Even under these circumstances, however, the argument still requires that each infer from this common knowledge that each individual will comply.

3.2 Bounded Rationality and the Conservation of Decision Resources.

In the simplest model in which such an account exists, agents face a cost to deliberation. The more complex the deliberative calculation, the more costs the agent incurs. When the marginal cost of deliberation is sufficiently high, the agent might do better to follow a rule of thumb that quickly, and cheaply, identifies a good but not optimal, action.[11] If the expected benefit from choosing the optimal action (relative to the good action) is less than the cost, it is prudent for the agent to adopt the rule of thumb. More sophisticated accounts of an economic rationale for rule-following rely on more complex models of bounded rationality.

To complete an economic account of the authority of law requires that one explain why the agent should consider legal rules as the relevant rules to which she should defer. One might argue that those who promulgate legal rules have special expertise that makes it likely that they will enact rules that are better than the rules that the agent herself would formulate. For some legal rules-technical rules concerning health and safety promulgated by administrative agencies-this argument may have merit. After all the decision at issue depends on a mass of technical data that is not easily assimilable or manipulable. For many other legal rules promulgated by legislatures and courts, however, this argument may not apply.

Several other features of this argument merit attention. First, it parallels the argument for authority offered by Joseph Raz.[12] Moreover, as in Raz's argument, authority is specific to legal rules rather than to law in general. An agent might believe the law more expert than she with respect to some decisions than to others. In fact agents with different expertise themselves would find different legal rules authoritative.

Second, on this account of authority, the legal rule affects the agent's deliberation not because of the sanction for non-compliance-as in the view of legal rules as incentives—but because compliance with the legal rule even in the absence of a sanction is in the agent's interest. This feature of the account of authority conforms to notions, developed further below, of the way in which rules enter the deliberative process. But this feature also limits the applicability of the account to those legal rules that bear on the agent's immediate interest. Many legal rules direct the agent to adopt actions that raise her own costs; in the absence of a sanction for non-compliance her own interest would dictate non-compliance. So, for example, a rule requiring that an agent adopt due care in certain activities may raise the agent's costs.[13]

The prudential account of authority outlined above primarily addresses private individuals. One might ask the parallel question concerning the obligation to obey the law of public officials. In some respects, this question has greater significance than the question concerning private individuals because many acknowledge that the motivation of private individuals to obey the law is usually prudential, the desire to avoid sanction. Moreover, on some jurisprudential accounts, most notably H.L.A. Hart's version of legal positivism, the attitudes and behavior of public officials determine the existence and nature of law.

The economic account of authority, however, does not provide a compelling explanation of official behavior. Consider how the economic account applies to public officials. The relevant obligations here are the official obligations of the individual: the judicial obligation to decide cases according to the dictates of stare decisis and other obligatory practices; the executive official's obligation to apply the law. Two difficulties arise immediately. How is compliance with these official obligations in the individual's interest? Why must the agent follow a rule rather than optimize in each instance? This second difficulty is less troublesome than the first; Ronald Heiner [1986], for example, has offered a prudential account, grounded in bounded rationality, of the judicial obligation to adhere to stare decisis.[14]

One might attempt to resolve the first difficulty concerning the agent's interest by arguing that compliance with official obligation is in the individual's interest because she desires to maintain her employment. But this explanation rests on an incentive argument. The sanction of dismissal induces compliance rather than a normative motivation to comply with one's obligation; it is another prudential account. The prudential account of authority thus fails to overcome this first difficulty. It is not clear then that the prudential account of authority can ground a positivist conception of law.

4. Theories of Adjudication

4.1 Adjudication in Political Economy

As noted earlier the political economy strand of economic analysis of law itself contains two strands that are in tension with each other. On the one hand, the political economy strand seeks only to explain legal phenomena rather than to prescribe either the structure of legal institutions nor the content of particular legal rules. One might find within this strand of political economy a positive theory of adjudication but not a normative theory. Indeed, the positive theory advanced argues that judges seek to promote their interests. Usually, these interests are defined as policy interests, that is, an interest to promote particular policies.

The second strand of political economy, constitutional political economy, does have normative aims. It assumes that political actors will act in a self-interested fashion within existing political institutions but that agents will act more impartially in the design of the political institutions within which they will work.[15] A normative theory of adjudication does emerge from this strand of political economy but it differs significantly from the normative theory endorsed by the policy analysis strand of economic analysis of law. For constitutional political economy, a normative theory of adjudication must be a structural one; it should describe the structure of adjudication. The theory thus cannot dictate directly judicial motivation because, according to political economy, judges will always act self-interestedly. Adjudicative institutions, however, can be designed to align better the interests of judges with the interests of the designer of the constitution.

In 1975, Landes and Posner offered a justification for the independence of the judiciary that is often understood as a normative theory of adjudication within the tradition of constitutional political economy. On the account of Landes and Posner, an independent judiciary serves the interest of legislators who seek to impose their policies on the jurisdiction for periods that exceed the length of their majority in the legislature. As a consequence, they find it in their interest to have the judiciary enforce the original bargain struck in all legislation.

This argument contains a normative theory of statutory interpretation. Judges ought to enforce the bargains reached by the legislature that enacted the statute. On this account, a judge ignores the views of the current legislative majority. She also eschews interpretation of the statute in terms of her own policy preferences.

One should note that, from the perspective of constitutional political economy, the argument of Landes and Posner is incomplete. They ground their theory of judicial independence in the interests of legislators. The interests of legislators within extant legislative institutions may not coincide with the interests of the constitutional designer.

4.2 Adjudication in Policy Analysis

A normative theory of adjudication was among the earliest claims advanced in the economic analysis of law. Posner [1973, 1979, 1980, 1985, 1990, 1995] asserted claim II in the introduction: the common law ought to be efficient. He interpreted efficiency as "wealth maximization" but then interpreted wealth maximization as "willingness to pay." This interpretive stance yielded an argument that judges in (common law) cases ought to choose the legal rule that maximized the ratio of benefits to costs as measured by the sum of individual willing nesses to pay.

Posner's claim evoked great controversy in the late 1970s and early 1980s. (See, e.g., Symposium [1980]). Twenty years later, Kaplow and Shavell [2001] revived and revised Posner's claim. The revision had two components. First, and most important, they chose welfarism generally rather than cost-benefit analysis in particular as the normative basis for adjudication. Welfarism requires that evaluation depend solely on the well-being of individuals. Cost-benefit analysis is thus a form of welfarist evaluation; but Kaplow and Shavell's argument allows them to avoid various criticisms of cost-benefit analysis. Second, Kaplow and Shavell do not argue primarily for a normative theory of adjudication. Rather they contend that evaluation of legal rules and institutions by scholars ought to be welfarist. They suggest however that judges by and large have the same evaluative obligation as the third party analyst.

4.21 A brief critique of cost-benefit analysis as a theory of adjudication

Cost-benefit analysis attempts to implement a Kaldor-Hicks evaluative criterion. According to the Kaldor-Hicks criterion, a distribution of goods (broadly understood) X is superior to a distribution of goods Y if and only if there exists a third distribution of goods Z such that (a) Z is a redistribution of the distribution X; and (b) Z is Pareto preferred to Y.[16]

Cost-benefit analysis proceeds in two steps. First, for each individual, it identifies a particular representation of the individual's ordinal ranking of the options open to the policy maker. Second, it aggregates these representations of each individual's preferences into a social ranking.

The first step is unproblematic. Consider agent K. K has preferences over states of the world. A representation of these preferences assigns a number to each state of the world such that K prefers state X to state Y if and only if the number assigned to state X is higher than the number assigned to state Y. Cost-benefit analysis assigns as numbers the agent's willingness to pay. This procedure thus links the range of numbers that the agent may assign to the agent's wealth as willingness to pay is defined in part in terms of the agent's ability to pay.[17] The procedure for assigning numbers on the basis of an individual's willingness to pay in fact yields a representation of that agent's preferences.

The second step of cost-benefit analysis is more problematic. To aggregates the individual willingnesses to pay, cost-benefit analysis simply sums the individual willingnesses to pay. One can see immediately several difficulties with this procedure. First, each ranking is ordinal; the numbers have no significance beyond the order. If K assigns a number 2 to state X, a number 4 to state Y and a number 16 to state Z, we cannot conclude anything about K's intensity of preference; she does not prefer Z to Y six times as much as she prefers Y to X. It therefore seems odd that one can add agent K's willingness to pay to agent J's willingness to pay.

Second, cost-benefit analysis adopts a method of interpersonal comparisons of well-being that is particularly unconvincing. Interpersonal comparison of well-being requires that one identify the appropriate representation of each individual's preference ordering and compare those representations. Cost-benefit analysis however does not identify representations on moral or political grounds; rather it chooses the representations that contingently arise from the actual distribution of wealth and income in the society.[18] If Tom is poor while Bill is wealthy, it is unclear why the representations of the well-being of each that derives from willingness to pay provide interpersonally comparable measures. Equally, if Tom and Bill are equally wealthy but Tom is disabled and Bill is not, the willingness to pay of each may still not be interpersonally comparable.

4.22 A Structural Critique of Welfarist theories of adjudication

One might construct a normative theory of adjudication at either of two levels. First, one might take as given the general structure of adjudication within a particular judicial system and ask what obligations the judges within that system ought to have. Second, one might more fundamentally design the judicial system from scratch. On this second account, the institutional environment in which judges act as well as the obligations of judges within that institutional environment would be subject to evaluation.

Most normative theories of adjudication are of the first type. They take the institutional structure in which adjudication occurs largely as given and then identify the obligations of judges within that system. Phrased differently, normative theories of adjudication are interpretive of an ongoing practice rather than efforts to design a practice from scratch. Welfarist theories of adjudication face several difficulties when understood as interpretive theories of existing (common law) practice.[19]

First, the structure of adjudication does not generally provide adequate or appropriate information for the selection of rules that maximize social welfare. Adjudication in a common law system usually focuses on a past transaction between particular parties. This transaction may not be typical of transactions that were litigated; it certainly will not be typical of the entire population of transactions that a rule would govern. Under a given rule, for instance, the set of transactions that do not lead to litigation are likely to differ systematically from the set of transactions that do give rise to litigation. Equally important, different legal rules are apt to generate different sets of transactions. The current structure of adjudication does not provide any information that would help a decision maker assess these differences across potential legal rules.

Second, the selection procedure for judges does not identify individuals with the appropriate training and background to make accurate calculations of social welfare. Judges in common law countries have generally not been trained systematically in economics and statistics, two disciplines necessary (but not sufficient) for the determination of social welfare under alternative legal rules.

Third, and related, judges usually face severe constraints in the set of legal rules they may consider in any adjudication. When confronted by a tort case, for example, the court usually considers a limited number of legal regimes; perhaps it will reformulate the standard of care or shift from a regime of negligence to one of strict liability. A court, however, is unlikely to adopt a complex scheme of no-fault insurance or to impose a different insurance scheme even though these more radical transformations of social institutions would provide higher overall welfare.

5. Evaluation of Legal Rules and Institutions

The evaluative tradition in economics is resolutely welfarist. That tradition extends to the policy analysis branch of economic analysis of law. In the prior section, I considered the manifestation of this tradition in the advocacy of cost-benefit analysis as a normative theory of adjudication. In this section, I consider arguments for welfarism as an evaluative standard against which to appraise legal rules and institutions. Welfarism here is not advocated as a theory of adjudication. Consequently, the structural critique of section 5.22 does not apply. The argument here thus lies almost wholly on philosophic territory.

The argument for welfarism as the evaluative criterion for legal rules and institutions has two key elements.[20] The first identifies an individual's well-being with her preferences. Thus, an individual K has greater well-being in state X than in state Y, if and only if she prefers state X to state Y. The second, key element of the argument welfarism is a strategy of incorporation. The strategy of incorporation includes within the agent's preference ordering anything that the agent considers relevant to her decisions. The individual's preferences thus correspond to her all-things-considered judgments; that is, K prefers state X to state Y if and only if K believes, all things considered, that state X is better than (or ought to be promoted rather than) state B. K's all-things-considered judgments, of course, will included many considerations that, in ordinary language, are not usually considered as in K's self-interest or even as contributing to her well-being. So, for example, her all-things-considered judgments will incorporate concerns for the well-being of others as well as considerations of justice and deontological constraints on action.

The success of this argument for welfarism depends on the success of this strategy of incorporation of every reason for action into an agent's preference ordering. I shall raise here two objections to this strategy of incorporation. First, the resulting extended preference ordering does not correspond to a concept of well-being that is morally compelling because not all concerns incorporated into the individual's preferences play the appropriate role in her deliberations. Second, aggregation of these extended preference orderings does not treat the moral reasons incorporated in the extended preference ordering appropriately.

A complete argument that the extended preference ordering does not correspond to a morally compelling conception of well-being would require articulation of the concept of well-being, a task well beyond the scope of this entry. For purposes of this critique, it may suffice to note the varying levels of choice at which various concerns apply. The strategy of incorporation requires that one incorporate a moral concern into an individual's extended preference ordering when that moral concern motivates an individual's choices. While it may be the case that the individual in fact prefers a world in which the given moral concern motivates to one in which it does not, the preference for the moral concern arises in the choice of institutional or social arrangements not in the choice within a given set of institutions or social arrangements. The choice within the given institutions may reduce the agent's well-being rather than promote it.

Turn now to the second objection. Even if extended preference orderings do not correspond to well-being, a defender of welfarism might argue that it is appropriate to aggregate these orderings rather than ones that capture the conception of well-being. This argument, however, misunderstands the distinction between judgment and preference.[21] Many of the concerns that enter into an agent's all-things-considered decisions are judgments rather than preferences. Appropriate techniques of aggregation of judgment differ from those of aggregation of preferences.

Crudely, preference differs from judgment in two respect. First, an expression of preference is personal. The individual expresses a preference that is valid for her; she makes no claim about the validity of this preference for others. Liza's statement that she prefers to be a jazz musician to a lawyer makes no claims concerning Henry's preferred profession. Judgments generally have a greater scope. If Liza claims that jazz musicians contribute more to social welfare than lawyers, she is not expressing a preference that this be so; she asserts that it is true for everyone (at least within current social arrangements).

Second, an individual is sovereign over her own preferences but not over her judgments. An individual has final say over her preferences but not over her judgments. Henry's assertion that he prefers to be a lawyer rather than a jazz musician provides no reason for Liza to reconsider her statement that she prefers to be a jazz musician. If, however, Henry asserts that lawyers contribute more to social welfare than jazz musicians, Liza does have reason to reconsider her contrary judgment. Only one of them can be correct.[22]

Many of the concerns that, under the strategy of incorporation, are included in an individual's extended preference ordering sound in judgment rather than preference. Concerns for distributive justice, for example, reflect moral judgments and not expressions of preference.[23] Similarly, respect for deontological constraints on action sound in judgment not preference. Moreover, these moral judgments depend on proof and argument.

The distinction between preference and judgment points to several difficulties with this argument for welfarism . First, to the extent that individual well-being is understood subjectively, it is likely to be a matter of preference not judgment. Yet the extended preference orderings that constitute the domain of the social welfare function include judgments; this conflation of judgment and preferences provides an argument in addition to the one above that these orderings are not equivalent to well-being.

Second, the methods of aggregation of judgment are likely to differ from the methods of aggregation of preference. Rational aggregation of judgments is likely to parallel rational aggregation of belief. When individuals have different beliefs, one does not generally resolve the conflict through some simple process of aggregation.[24] Rather, the individuals pool information; then each individual updates her beliefs in light of the new information. Ideally, this process leads to convergence of belief. Similarly, the process of moral argument ideally leads to the revision of individual moral judgments.

6. Concluding Remarks

Though the controversy over economic analysis of law has waned, its project continues to disquiet many scholars who study legal phenomena. The prior discussion identifies two distinct sources for that disquiet.

Many legal scholars object to the normative theory of adjudication advanced by policy analysts. These scholars generally reject the welfarism to which policy analysis is committed. The prior discussion suggests, however, that a rejection of welfarism as a moral theory is neither necessary nor sufficient for the rejection of the normative theory of adjudication advanced by policy analysts.

The methodology of economic analysis of law poses a more significant challenge to traditional accounts of law. Economic analysis of law provokes disquiet because the model of self-interested maximization of preferences does not admit a concept of normativity but explaining the normativity of law is a central pre-occupation of philosophy of law. The logic of this commitment to self-interested maximization of preferences would appear to lead to a denial of the need for a distinct concept of law in the explanation and evaluation of social institutions.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

consequentialism | game theory | game theory: and ethics | legal obligation and authority | legal philosophy | nature of law | nature of law: interpretivist theories | well-being


Research for this entry was supported by the Filomen d'Agostino and Max E. Greenberg Research Fund of New York University School of Law.