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Axiomatic Theories of Truth

First published Mon Dec 26, 2005; substantive revision Wed Dec 2, 2009

One way to investigate the concept of truth is by studying the truth predicate. Although there are various ways of studying the expression "is true", we focus in this entry on treating it as a primitive predicate which is governed by certain axioms and rules. The Liar and other paradoxes require that we formulate these axioms and rules very carefully. Many axiom systems for the truth predicate have been discussed in the literature and their respective properties have been investigated. Several philosophers have endorsed these ‘axiomatic theories of truth’. The formal results about these theories have turned out to be relevant for various philosophical questions, such as questions about the ontological status of properties, Gödel's theorems, and the theory of meaning.

1. Motivations

Truth is often defined in terms of correspondence, coherence or other notions. However, it is far from clear that a definition of truth can lead to a philosophically satisfactory theory of truth. Tarski's theorem on the undefinability of the truth predicate shows that a definition of such a predicate requires resources that go beyond those of the formal language for which truth is going to be defined. By contrast, the axiomatic approach does not presuppose that truth can be defined. Instead, a formal language is expanded by a new primitive predicate for truth, and axioms for that predicate are then laid down. It can then be investigated whether the primitive predicate satisfying those axioms could also be introduced by means of a definition; but definability is not presupposed on the axiomatic approach.

In semantic theories of truth (e.g., Tarski 1935, Kripke 1975), a truth predicate is defined for a language, the so-called object-language. This definition is carried out in a metalanguage or metatheory, which is typically taken to include set theory or at least another strong theory or expressively rich interpreted language. Tarski's theorem on the undefinability of the truth predicate shows that, given certain general assumptions, the resources of the metalanguage or metatheory must go beyond the resources of the object-language. So semantic approaches usually necessitate the use of a metalanguage that is more powerful than the object-language for which it provides a semantics.

Axiomatic theories of truth, by contrast, can be presented within very weak logical frameworks. These frameworks require very few resources, and in particular, avoid the need for a strong metalanguage and metatheory. Moreover, formal work on axiomatic theories of truth has helped to shed some light on semantic theories of truth. For instance, it has yielded information on what is required of a metalanguage that is sufficient for defining a truth predicate. Semantic theories of truth, in turn, provide us with the theoretical tools needed for investigating models of axiomatic theories of truth. Thus axiomatic and semantical approaches to truth are deeply intertwined.

This entry outlines the most popular axiomatic theories of truth and mentions some of the formal results that have been obtained concerning them. We give only hints as to their philosophical applications.

1.1 Truth, properties and sets

Theories of truth and predication are closely related to theories of properties and property attribution. To say that an open formula φ(x) is true of an individual a seems tantamount to saying that a has the property of being such that φ (this property is signified by the open formula). For example, one might say that "x is a poor philosopher" is true of Tom instead of saying that Tom has the property of being a poor philosopher. Quantification over (certain) properties can then be mimicked in a language with a truth predicate by quantifying over formulas. Instead of saying, for instance, that a and b have exactly the same properties, one says that exactly the same formulas are true of a and b. The reduction of properties to truth works also to some extent for sets of individuals.

There are also reductions in the other direction: Tarski (1935) has shown that certain second-order existence assumptions (e.g., comprehension axioms) may be utilized to define truth (see the entry on Tarski's definition of truth). The mathematical analysis of axiomatic theories of truth and second-order systems has exhibited many equivalences between these second-order existence assumptions and truth-theoretic assumptions.

These results show exactly what is required for defining a truth predicate that satisfies certain axioms, thereby sharpening Tarski's insights into definability of truth. In particular, proof-theoretic equivalences described in Section 3.3 below make explicit to what extent a metalanguage (or rather metatheory) has to be richer than the object language in order to be able to define a truth predicate.

The equivalence between second-order theories and truth theories also has bearing on traditional metaphysical topics. The reductions of second-order theories (i.e., theories of properties or sets) to axiomatic theories of truth may be conceived as forms of reductive nominalism, for they replace existence assumptions for sets or properties (e.g., comprehension axioms) by ontologically innocuous assumptions, in the present case by assumptions on the behaviour of the truth predicate.

1.2 Truth and reflection

According to Gödel's incompleteness theorems, the statement that Peano Arithmetic (PA) is consistent, in its guise as a number-theoretic statement (given the technique of Gödel numbering), cannot be derived in PA itself. But PA can be strengthened by adding this consistency statement or by stronger axioms. In particular, axioms partially expressing the soundness of PA can be added. These are known as reflection principles. An example of a reflection principle for PA would be the set of sentences BewPA(φ) → φ where φ is a formula of the language of arithmetic, φ a name for φ and BewPA(x) is the standard provability predicate for PA (“Bew” was introduced by Gödel and is short for the German word “beweisbar”, that is, “provable”).

The process of adding reflection principles can be iterated: One can add, for example, a reflection principle R for PA to PA; this results in a new theory PA+R. Then one adds the reflection principle for the system PA+R to the theory PA+R. This process can be continued into the transfinite (see Feferman 1962).

The reflection principles express—at least partially—the soundness of the system. The most natural and full expression of the soundness of a system involves the truth predicate and is known as the Global Reflection Principle (see Kreisel and Lévy 1968). The Global Reflection Principle for a formal system S states that all sentences provable in S are true:

x(BewS(x) → Tx)

BewS(x) expresses here provability of sentences in the system S (we omit discussion here of the problems of defining BewS(x)). The truth predicate has to satisfy certain principles; otherwise the global reflection principle would be vacuous. Thus not only the global reflection principle has to be added, but also axioms for truth. If the a natural theory of truth like T(PA) below is added, however, it is no longer necessary to mention the global reflection principle explicitly, as theories like T(PA) prove already the global reflection principle for PA. one may therefore view truth theories as reflection principles.

Thus instead of iterating reflection principles that are formulated entirely in the language of arithmetic, one can add by iteration new truth predicates and correspondingly new axioms for the new truth predicates. Thereby one might hope to make explicit all the assumptions that are implicit in the acceptance of a theory like PA. The resulting theory is called the reflective closure of the initial theory. Feferman (1991) has proposed that we use a single truth predicate and a single theory (KF), rather than a hierarchy of predicates and theories, in order to explicate the reflective closure of PA and other theories. (KF will be discussed below in Section 4.3.)

The relation of truth theories and (iterated) reflection principles also became prominent in the discussion of truth-theoretic deflationism (see Tennant 2002 and the follow-up discussion).

1.3 Truth-theoretic deflationism

Deflationist theories of truth can be developed in various ways. Many deflationists have proposed axiomatic approaches; in many cases, the T-sentences have been employed. T-sentences are equivalences of the form Tφ ↔ φ, where T is the truth predicate, φ is a sentence and φ is a name for the sentence φ. (More refined axioms have also been discussed by deflationists.) At first glance at least, the axiomatic approach seems much less ‘deflationary’ than those more traditional theories which rely on a definition of truth in terms of correspondence or the like. If truth can be explicitly defined, it can be eliminated, whereas an axiomatized notion of truth may bring all kinds of commitments.

If truth does not have any explanatory force, as some deflationists claim, the axioms for truth should not allow us to prove any new theorems that do not involve the truth predicate. Accordingly, by Horsten (1995), Shapiro (1998) and Ketland (1999) have suggested that a deflationary axiomatization of truth should be at least conservative. The new axioms for truth are conservative if they do not imply any additional sentences (free of occurrences of the truth-predicate) that aren't already provable without the truth axioms. Certain natural theories of truth, however, fail to be conservative (see Section 3.3 below and Field 1999 and Shapiro 2002 for further discussion).

According to many deflationists, truth serves merely the purpose of expressing infinite conjunctions. It is plain that not all infinite conjunctions can be expressed because there are uncountably many (non-equivalent) infinite conjunctions over a countable language. Since the language with an added truth predicate has only countably many formula, not every infinite conjunction can be expressed by a different finite formula. The formal work on axiomatic theories of truth has helped to specify exactly which infinite conjunctions can be expressed with a truth predicate. Feferman (1991) provides a proof-theoretic analysis of a fairly strong system. (Again, this will be explained in the discussion about KF in Section 4.3 below.)

2. The base theory

2.1 The choice of the base theory

On most axiomatic theories approaches, truth is conceived as a predicate of objects. There is an extensive philosophical discussion on the category of objects to which truth applies: propositions conceived as objects that are independent of any language, types and tokens of sentences and utterances, thoughts, and many other objects have been proposed. Since the structure of sentences considered as types is relatively clear, sentence types have often been used as the objects that can be true. In many cases there is no need to make very specific metaphysical commitments, because only certain modest assumptions on the structure of these objects are required, independently from whether they are finally taken to be syntactic objects, propositions or still something else. The theory that describes the properties of the objects to which truth can attributed is called the base theory. The formulation of the base theory does not involve the truth predicate or any specific truth-theoretic assumptions. The base theory could describe the structure of sentences, propositions and the like, so that notions like ‘negation’can then be used in the formulation of the truth-theoretic axioms.

In a formal setting truth is often taken as a predicate applying to the Gödel number of sentences. Peano arithmetic has proved to be a versatile theory of objects to which truth is applied, mainly because adding truth-theoretic axioms to Peano arithmetic yields interesting systems and because Peano arithmetic is equivalent to many straightforward theories of syntax and even theories of propositions.

Of course, we can also investigate theories which result by adding the truth-theoretic axioms to much stronger theories like set theory. Usually there is no chance of proving the consistency of set theory plus further truth-theoretic axioms because the consistency of set theory itself cannot be established without assumptions transcending set theory. In many cases not even relative consistency proofs are feasible. However, if adding certain truth-theoretic axioms to PA yields a consistent theory, it seems at least plausible that adding analogous axioms to set theory will not lead to an inconsistency. Therefore, the hope is that research on theories of truth over PA will give an some indication of what will happen when we extend stronger theories with axioms for the truth predicate.

So, even though many of the results outlined below can be stated in a much more general way, Peano arithmetic will be used as the base theory in this entry; this will keep the presentation more perspicuous. All theories considered below–including the truth-theoretic axioms–are formulated in classical logic, if not stated otherwise.

2.2 Notational conventions

For the sake of definiteness I assume that the language of arithmetic has exactly ¬, ∧ and ∨ as connectives and ∀ and ∃ as quantifiers. It has as individual constant only the symbol 0 for zero; its only function symbols is the unary successor symbol S; addition and multiplication are expressed by predicate symbols. Therefore the only closed terms of the language of arithmetic are the numerals 0, S(0), S(S(0)), S(S(S(0))),….

The language of arithmetic does not contain the unary predicate symbol T. So let LT be the language of arithmetic augmented by the new unary predicate symbol T for truth. If φ is a sentence of LT, φ is a name for φ in the language LT ; formally speaking, it is the numeral of the Gödel number of φ. In general, Greek letters like φ and ψ are variables of the metalanguage, that is, the language I am using for talking about theories of truth and the language in which this entry is written (i.e., English enriched by some symbols). φ and ψ range over formulas of the formal language LT.

In what follows, we use small, upper case italic letters like A, B,… as variables in LT ranging over sentences (or their Gödel numbers, to be precise). Thus ∀A(…A…) stands for ∀x(SentT(x) → …x…), where SentT(x) expresses in the language of arithmetic that x is a sentence of the language of arithmetic extended by the predicate symbol T. The syntactical operations of forming a conjunction of two sentences and similar operations can be expressed in the language of arithmetic. Since the language of arithmetic does not contain any function symbol apart from the symbol for successor, these operations must be expressed by sutiable predicate expressions. Thus one can say in the language LT that a negation of a sentence of LT is true if and only if the sentence itself is not true. We would write this as

A(TA] ↔ ¬TA).

The square brackets indicate that the operation of forming the negation of A is expressed in the language of arithmetic. Since the language of arithmetic does not contain a function symbol representing the function that sends sentences to their negations, appropriate paraphrases involving predicates must be given.

Thus, for instance the expression

AB(T[AB] ↔ (TATB))

is a single sentence of the language LT saying that a conjunction of sentences of LT is true if and only if both sentences are true. In contrast,

Tφ ∧ ψ ↔ (TφTφ)

is only a schema. That is, it stands for the set of all sentences that are obtained from the above expression by substituting sentences of LT for the Greek letters φ and ψ. The single sentence ∀AB(T[AB] ↔ (TATB)) implies all sentences which are instances of the schema, but the instances of the schema do not imply the single universally quantified sentence. In general, the quantified versions are stronger than the corresponding schemata.

3. Typed theories of truth

In typed theories of truth only axioms are considered that allow one to prove the truth of sentences not containing the same truth predicate.

3.1 Definable truth predicates

Certain truth predicates can be defined within the language of arithmetic. Predicates suitable as truth predicates for sublanguages of the language of arithmetic can be defined within the language of arithmetic, as long as the quantificational complexity of the formulas in the sublanguage is restricted. In particular, there is a formula Tr0(x) that expresses that x is true atomic sentence of the language of arithmetic, that is, a sentence of the form n=k, where k and n are identical numerals. For further information on partial truth predicates see, for instance, Hájek and Pudlak (1993), Kaye (1991) and Takeuti (1987).

The definable truth predicates are truly redundant, because they are expressible in PA. All truth predicates in the following are not definable in the language of arithmetic, and therefore not redundant at least in the sense that they are not definable.

3.2 The T-sentences

The typed T-sentences are all equivalences of the form Tφ ↔ φ, where φ is a sentence not containing the truth predicate. Tarski 1935 called any theory proving these equivalences ‘materially adequate.’ Tarski 1935 criticised an axiomatization of truth relying on the T-sentences only, not because he aimed at a definition rather than an axiomatization of truth, but because such a theory seemed too weak. Thus although the theory is materially adequate, Tarski thought that the T-sentences are deductively too weak. He observed, in particular, that the T-sentences do not prove the law of excluded middle, that is, the sentence ∀A(TA ∨ TA]) where the quantifier ∀A is restricted to sentences not containing T. That the sentence ¬∀A(TA ∨ TA]) is consistent with Peano arithmetic augmented by the T-sentences follows from the Compactness Theorem. For in a finite set of T-sentences the truth predicate can be interpreted by a partial truth predicate that satisfies ¬Tφ ∧ ¬T¬φ for all sentences φ exceeding a certain complexity. Tarski's criticism of the T-sentences as only axioms for truth shows that he expected a good theory of truth not only to satisfy his material adequacy condition but that he also expected it to prove principles like the law of excluded middle.

Theories of truth based on the T-sentences, and their formal properties, have also recently been a focus of interest in the context of so-called deflationary theories of truth. The T-sentences Tφ ↔ φ (where φ does not contain T) are not conservative over first-order logic with identity, that is, they prove a sentence not containing T that is not logically valid. For the T-sentences prove that the sentences 0=0 and ¬0=0 are different and that therefore at least two objects exist. That is, the T-sentences are not conservative over the empty base theory. If the T-sentences are added to PA, the resulting theory is conservative over PA. This means that the theory does not prove T-free sentences that are not already provable in PA. This result even holds if in addition to the T-sentences also all induction axioms containing the truth predicate are added. This may be shown by appealing to the Compactness Theorem again. If the theory PA plus all T-sentences proved an arithmetical sentence φ not provable in PA, then a finite subtheory (with finitely many T-sentences) proves φ. But the finite subtheory can be relatively interpreted (translated) in PA by interpreting T by an appropriate partial truth predicate; the arithmetical vocabulary is not affected by this interpretation. This shows that φ is provable in PA already, which contradicts the assumption.

3.3. Satisfaction classes

In order to obtain systems that also prove universally quantified truth-theoretic principles like the law of excluded middle, one can turn the inductive clauses of Tarski's definition of truth into axioms. In the following axioms, AtomSentPA(A) expresses that A is an atomic sentence of the language of arithmetic, SentPA(A) expresses that A is a sentence of the language of arithmetic.

  1. A(AtomSentPA(A) → (TATr0(A)))
  2. A(SentPA(A) → (TA] ↔ ¬TA))
  3. AB(SentPA(A) ∧ SentPA(B) → (T[A ∧ B] ↔ (TA ∧ TB)))
  4. AB(SentPA(A) ∧ SentPA(B) → (T[AB] ↔ (TATB)))
  5. A(v)(SentPA(A(0)) → (T[∀vA(v)] ↔ ∀xT[A(x)]))
  6. A(v)(SentPA(A(0)) → (T[∃vA(v)] ↔ ∃xT[A(x)]))

Axiom 1 says that an atomic sentence of the language of Peano arithmetic is true if and only if it is true according to the arithmetical truth predicate for this language (Tr0 was defined in Section 3.1). Axioms 2 – 6 claim that truth commutes with all connectives and quantifiers. Axiom 5 says that a universally quantified sentence of the language of arithmetic is true if and only if all its numerical instances are true. Underlining the variable in square brackets indicates it is bound from the outside. More precisely, [A(x)] stands for the result of replacing the variable v in A(v) by the numeral of x. SentPA(A(0)) says that A(v) is a formula with at most v free (because after replacing v by the constant 0, A(v) becomes a sentence).

The theory given by all axioms of PA and the Axioms 1–6 is known as PA + “there is a full satisfaction class”; it does not have any induction axioms involving the truth predicate.

If these axioms are to be formulated for a language like set theory that lacks names for all objects, then (5) and (6) require the use of a satisfaction relation rather than a unary truth predicate.

Axioms in the style of 1–6 above played a central role in Donald Davidson's theory of meaning and in several deflationist approaches to truth.

Although not all models of PA can be expanded to models of PA + “there is a full satisfaction class” (Lachlan 1981), the theory is conservative over PA. Kotlarski, Krajewski, and Lachlan (1981) proved this by model-theoretic means and Halbach (1999) showed this by proof-theoretic finitary means.

Of course PA + “there is a full satisfaction class” is unnatural insofar as it does not contain the induction axioms in the language with the truth predicate. There are various labels for the system that is obtained by adding all induction axioms involving the truth predicate to the system PA + “there is a full satisfaction class”: T(PA), PA(S) or PA + “there is a full inductive satisfaction class”. This theory is no longer conservative over its base theory PA. For instance one can formalise the soundness theorem or global reflection principle for PA, that is, the claim that all sentences provable in PA are true. The global reflection principle for PA in turn implies the consistency of PA, which is not provable in pure PA by Gödel's Second Incompleteness Theorem. Thus T(PA) is not conservative over PA. T(PA) is much stronger than the mere consistency statement for PA: T(PA) is equivalent to the second-order system ACA of arithmetical comprehension (see Takeuti 1987 and Feferman 1991). More precisely, T(PA) and ACA are intertranslatable in a way that preserves all arithmetical sentences. ACA is given by the axioms of PA with full induction in the second-order language and the following comprehension principle:

Xy(yX ↔ φ(x))

where φ(x) is any formula (in which x may or may not be free) that does not contain any second-order quantifiers, but possibly free second-order variables. More precisely, quantification over sets can be defined in T(PA) as quantification over formulas with one free variable and membership as the truth of the formula as applied to a number.

This kind of ‘nominalist’ reduction shows that truth can play a role in the foundations of mathematics that is similar to fragments of second-order quantification. Whereas set existence axioms like the above comprehension principle seem to bring ontological commitment, truth-theoretic axioms seem ontologically innocent. The reduction of T(PA) to ACA makes also explicit what is needed to define arithmetical truth. If one thinks of ACA as the metalanguage (or -theory) of the language of arithmetic, then ACA exhibits all the assumptions that are needed to define a truth predicate satisfying the axioms of T(PA).

Much stronger fragments of second-order arithmetic can be interpreted by type-free truth systems, that is, by theories of truth that prove not only the truth of arithmetical sentences but also the truth of sentences of the language LT with the truth predicate.

3.4 Hierarchical theories

The above mentioned theories of truth can be iterated by introducing indexed truth predicates. One adds to the language of PA truth predicates indexed by ordinals (or ordinal notations) or one adds a binary truth predicate that applies to ordinal notations and sentences. In this respect the hierarchical approach does not fit the framework outlined in Section 2, because the language does not feature a single unary truth predicate applying to sentences but rather many unary truth predicates or a single binary truth predicate (or even a single unary truth predicate applying to pairs of ordinal notations and sentences).

In such a language an axiomatization of Tarski's hierarchy of truth predicates can be formulated. On the proof-theoretic side iterating truth theories in the style of T(PA) corresponds to iterating elementary comprehension, that is, to iterating ACA. The system of iterated truth theories corresponds to the system of ramified analysis (see Feferman 1991).

Visser (1989) has studied non-wellfounded hierarchies of languages and axiomatizations thereof. If one adds the T-sentences Tnφ ↔ φ to the language of arithmetic where φ contains only truth predicates Tk with k > n to PA, a theory is obtained that does not have a standard (ω-)model.

Typed theories of truth containing more than one truth predicate do not exclude paradoxical sentences in principle. For instance, a language might have two predicates T1 and T2 such that Tn applies only provably to sentences not containinig Tn for (n=1 and n=2). But this restriction does not rule out that T1 provably applies to sentences containing T2 and vice versa. So loops and paradoxes are not excluded. If one of the predicates is not interpreted as truth predicate but rather as a predicate for necessity or the like, this situation may be more interesting. Little is known about paradoxes arising from the interaction of two predicates.

4. Self-referential truth

The truth predicates in natural languages do not come with any type restriction. Therefore typed theories of truth (axiomatic as well as semantic theories) have been thought to be inadequate for analysing the truth predicate of natural language. This is one motive for investigating type-free theories of truth, that is, systems of truth that allow one to prove the truth of sentences involving the truth predicate. Some type-free theories of truth have much higher expressive power than the typed theories that have been surveyed in the previous section (at least as long as indexed truth predicates are avoided). Therefore type-free theories of truth are much more powerful tools in the reduction of other theories (for instance, second-order ones).

4.1 Type-free T-sentences

The set of all T-sentences Tφ ↔ φ, where φ is any sentence of the language LT, that is, where φ may contain T, is inconsistent with PA (or any theory that proves the diagonal lemma) because of the Liar paradox. Therefore one might try to drop from the set of all T-sentences only those that lead to an inconsistency. In other words, one may consider maximal consistent sets of T-sentences. McGee (1992) showed that there are uncountably many maximal sets of T-sentences that are consistent with PA. So the strategy does not lead to a single theory. Even worse, given an arithmetical sentence (i.e., a sentence not containing T) that can neither be proved or disproved in PA, one can find a consistent T-sentence that decides this sentence (McGee 1992). This implies that many consistent sets of T-sentences prove false arithmetical statements. Thus the strategy to drop just the T-sentences that yield an inconsistency is doomed.

A set of T-sentences that does not imply any false arithmetical statement may be obtained by allowing only those φ in T-sentences Tφ ↔ φ that contain T only positively, that is, in the scope of an even number of negation symbols. However, this theory is deductively weak and does not prove certain generalisations. In this respect it is similar to the set of typed T-sentences considered in Section 3.2. In general, it seems hard to specify a consistent set of type-free T-sentences that is both, natural and deductively strong.

4.2 The Friedman-Sheard theory and revision semantics

An obvious strengthening of T(PA) may be obtained by dropping the restriction of the universal quantifiers to arithmetical sentences. According to the resulting axioms, the truth predicate commutes with all connectives and quantifiers even for formulas containing the truth predicate. More precisely the following axioms are obtained:

  1. A(AtomSentPA(A) → (TATr0(A)))
  2. A(TA] ↔ ¬TA)
  3. AB(T[AB] ↔ (TATB))
  4. AB(T[AB] ↔ (TATB))
  5. A(v)(Sent(A(0)) → (T[∀vA(v)] ↔ ∀xT[A(x)])
  6. A(v)(Sent(A(0)) → (T[∃vA(v)] ↔ ∃xT[A(x)]))

Sent(A(0)) says that A(v) is a formula with at most the variable v free. According to the conventions in Section 2.2, the quantifiers like ∀A range over sentences of the language LT with the truth predicate. These axioms, however, do not say anything about the truth of atomic sentences involving the truth predicate. The only axiom concerning the truth of atomic sentences is axiom (1) immediately above. The following axiom for atomic sentences containing T seems to be in line with the other axioms:

A(T[TA] ↔ TA)

But the axiom is inconsistent with the axioms (1)–(6) and PA. Instead the rule corresponding to the inconsistent axiom can be added consistently:

If φ is a theorem, one may infer Tφ, and conversely, if Tφ is a theorem, one may infer φ.

The system generated by the axioms (1)–(6) and this bipartite rule is called FS (“Friedman-Sheard”). Friedman and Sheard studied FS under a slightly different axiomatization and proved its consistency. It follows from results due to McGee (1985) that FS is ω-inconsistent, that is, FS proves ∃x¬φ(x), but proves also φ(0), φ(1), φ(2),… for a formula φ(x) of LT. The arithmetical theorems of FS, however, are all correct. Halbach (1994) determined its proof-theoretic strength to be that of the theory of ramified analysis up to all finite levels or the theory ramified truth for all finite levels (i.e., finitely iterated T(PA); see Section 3.4). If either direction of the rule is dropped but the other kept, FS still retains its proof-theoretic strength (Sheard 2001).

It is a virtue of FS that it is thoroughly classical: It is formulated in classical logic; if a sentence is provably true in FS, then the sentence itself is provable in FS; and conversely if a sentence is provable, then it is also provably true. Its drawback is its ω-inconsistency. FS may be seen as an axiomatization of rule-of-revision semantics for all finite levels (see the entry on the revision theory of truth).

4.3 The Kripke-Feferman theory

The semantical construction captured by T(PA) is Tarski's inductive definition of truth. In this definition one starts with the true atomic sentence of the arithmetical language and then one declares true the complex sentences depending on whether its components are true or not. For instance, if φ and ψ are true, their conjunction φ ∧ψ will be true as well. In the case of the quantified sentences their truth value is determined by the truth values of their instances (one could render the quantifier clauses purely compositional by using a satisfaction predicate); for instance, a universally quantified sentence will be declared true if and only if all its instances are true. One can now extend this inductive definition of truth to the language LT by declaring a sentence of the form Tφ true if φ is already true. Moreover one will declare ¬Tφ true if ¬φ is true. By making this idea precise, one obtains a variant of Kripke's (1975) theory of truth with the so called Strong Kleene valuation scheme (see the entry on many-valued logic). If axiomatized it leads to the following system, which is known as KF (“Kripke-Feferman”), of which several variants appear in the literature:

  1. A(AtomSentPA(A) → (TATr0(A)))
  2. A(AtomSentPA(A) → (TA] ↔ ¬Tr0(A)))
  3. A(T[TA] ↔ TA)
  4. A(TTA] ↔ TA])
  5. A(T[¬¬A] ↔ TA)
  6. AB(T[AB] ↔ (TATB))
  7. AB(T[¬(AB)] ↔ (TA] ∨ TB]))
  8. AB(T[AB] ↔ (TATB))
  9. AB(T[¬(AB)] ↔ (TA] ∧ TB]))
  10. A(v)(Sent(A(0)) → (T[∀vA(v)] ↔ ∀xT[A(x)])
  11. A(v)(Sent(A(0)) → (T[¬∀vA(v)] ↔ ¬∀xT[A(x)])
  12. A(v)(Sent(A(0)) → (T[∃vA(v)] ↔ ∃xT[A(x)]))
  13. A(v)(Sent(A(0)) → (T[¬∃vA(v)] ↔ ¬∃xT[A(x)]))
  14. A¬(TATA])

Apart from the truth-theoretic axioms, KF comprises all axioms of PA and all induction axioms involving the truth predicate. The system is credited to Feferman on the basis of two lectures for the Association of Symbolic Logic, one in 1979 and the second in 1983, as well as in subsequent manuscripts. Feferman published his version of the system under the label Ref(PA) (“weak reflective closure of PA”) only in 1991, after several other versions of KF had already appeared in print (e.g., Reinhardt 1986, Cantini 1989, who both refer to this unpublished work by Feferman). Feferman's version does not contain the consistency axiom (14), which does not contribute to the proof-theoretic strength of KF anyway (see Cantini 1989 for more on the consistency axiom).

KF itself is formulated in classical logic, but it describes a partial notion of truth. For instance, one can prove ¬TL ∧ ¬T¬L, if L is the Liar sentence, that is, a sentence such that L↔¬TL. Thus KF proves that neither the liar sentence nor its negation is true. ¬TL ∨ ¬L is also a theorem of KF, which reveals the partial character of the axiomatized notion of truth. In particular, the set of all sentences φ such that T-sentences Tφ is provable in KF is not closed under classical logic but under partial logic, although KF itself is formulated in classical logic.

Feferman (1991) showed that KF is proof-theoretically equivalent to the theory of ramified analysis through all levels below ε0 or a theory of ramified truth through the same ordinals. Thus KF is by far stronger than FS, let alone T(PA). Feferman (1991) deviced also a strengthening of KF that is as strong as full predicative analysis, that is ramified analysis or truth up to the ordinal Γ0.

4.4 Axiomatizations of Kripke's theory with supervaluations

KF is intended to be an axiomatization of Kripke's (1975) semantical theory. This theory is based on partial logic, more precisely on partial logic with the Strong Kleene evaluation scheme. In Strong Kleene logic not every sentence φ ∨ ¬φ is a theorem; in particular, this disjunction is not true if A lacks a truth value. Consequently TL ∨ ¬L (where L is the Liar sentence) is not a theorem of KF and its negation is even provable. Cantini (1990) has proposed a system VF that is inspired by the supervaluations scheme. In VF all classical tautologies are provably true and TL ∨ ¬L, for instance, is a theorem of VF. VF can be formulated in LT and uses classical logic. VF is no longer a compositional theory of truth, for the following is not a theorem of VF:

AB(T[AB] ↔ (TATB))

Nor could it be consistently added to VF, for TL ∨ ¬L is a theorem of VF and this equivalence would imply TLT¬L, which of course is not correct, because according to the intended semantics neither the liar sentence nor its negation is true: both lack a truth value.

Extending a result due to Friedman and Sheard (1987) Cantini showed that VF is much stronger than KF: VF is proof-theoretically equivalent to the theory ID1 of non-iterated inductive definitions, which is not predicative. This and further results suggest that predicativity of subsystems of second-order arithmetic on the one hand and the compositionality of theories of truth over PA might be closely related.

VF seems to be the strongest theory of truth based on PA in the literature. This does not mean that it is not possible to formulate stronger theories. Recursion-theoretic results on rule-of-revision semantics suggest that a theory axiomatizing a notion of truth capturing this semantical construction might be very strong.


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Related Entries

compositionality | Gödel, Kurt: completeness theorem | Gödel, Kurt: incompleteness theorem | liar paradox | paradoxes: and contemporary logic | properties | Tarski, Alfred: truth definitions | truth: deflationary theory of