# Hermann Weyl

*First published Wed Sep 2, 2009*

Hermann Weyl was one of the greatest and most versatile
mathematicians of the 20^{th} century. His work had a vast
range, encompassing analysis, algebra, number theory, topology,
differential geometry, spacetime theory, quantum mechanics, and the
foundations of mathematics. His scientific writing is informed by a
rare literary and artistic sensibility—in his words,
“Expression and shape mean almost more to me than knowledge
itself”. He was unusual among scientists and mathematicians of
his time in being attracted to idealist philosophy: his idealist
leanings can be seen particularly in his work on the foundations of
mathematics. In his youth Kant's doctrines made a great
impression on him; later he was stirred both by Fichte's
metaphysical idealism and by Husserlian phenomenology. Although Weyl
came to question the certainties claimed by idealism, he cleaved always
to the primacy of intuition he had first learned from Kant, and to its
expression by Fichte as the “inner light” of individual
consciousness.

- 1. Weyl's Life and Achievements
- 2. Weyl's Metaphysics
- 3. Weyl's Work in the Foundations and Philosophy of Mathematics
- 4. Weyl's Contributions to the Foundations of Physics [Not yet available]
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Weyl's Life and Achievements

Hermann Weyl was born on November 9, 1885 in the small town of
Elmshorn near Hamburg. In 1904 he entered Göttingen University,
where his teachers included Hilbert, Klein and Minkowski. He remained
there as student and Privatdozent until his call in 1913 to a Chair at
the Federal Institute of Technology in Zürich. In that year he
published the first of his numerous books, *Die Idee der
Riemannschen Fläche* (The Idea of a Riemann Surface).
Weyl's years in Zürich were extraordinarily productive and
resulted in some of his finest work, especially in the foundations of
mathematics and physics. The year 1918 saw the publication of two
important works: *Das Kontinuum* (The Continuum) and
*Raum-Zeit-Materie* (Space-Time-Matter). In 1927 there appeared
his *Philosophie der Mathematik und Naturwissenschaften*
(Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science); and in 1928 his
ground-breaking *Gruppentheorie und Quantenmechanik* (Group
Theory and Quantum Mechanics). During his years in Zürich Weyl
received, and turned down, numerous offers of professorships by other
universities—including an invitation in 1923 to become Felix
Klein’s successor at Göttingen. It was only in 1930 that he
finally accepted the call to become Hilbert's successor there. His
second stay in Göttingen was to be brief. Repelled by Nazism,
“deeply revolted by the shame which this regime had brought to
the German name” (Weyl [1955], 300), he left Germany in 1933 to
accept an offer of permanent membership of the newly founded Institute
for Advanced Study in Princeton. Before his departure for Princeton he
published *The Open World* (1932); his tenure there saw the
publication of *Mind and Nature* (1934), *The Classical
Groups* (1939), *Algebraic Theory of Numbers*
(1940), *Meromorphic Functions and Analytic Curves* (1943),
*Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science* (1949; an
enlarged English version of the 1927 work), and *Symmetry*
(1952). In 1951 he formally retired from the Institute, remaining as an
emeritus member until his death, spending half his time there and half
in Zürich. He died in Zürich suddenly, of a heart attack, on
December 9, 1955.

## 2. Weyl's Metaphysics

Weyl was first and foremost a mathematician, and certainly not a
“professional” philosopher. But as a German intellectual
of his time it was natural for him to regard philosophy as a pursuit
to be taken seriously. In Weyl's case, unusually even for a German
mathematician, it was idealist philosophy that from the beginning
played a significant role in his thought. Kant, Husserl, Fichte, and,
later, Leibniz, were at various stages major influences on Weyl's
philosophical thinking. As a schoolboy Weyl had been impressed by
Kant's “Critique of Pure Reason.” He was especially taken
with Kant's doctrine that space and time are not inherent in the
objects of the world, existing as such and independently of our
awareness, but are, rather, forms of our intuition As he reports in
Insight and Reflection, (Weyl 1955), his youthful enthusiasm for Kant
crumbled soon after he entered Göttingen University in
1904. There he read Hilbert's Foundations of Geometry, a tour-de-force
of the axiomatic method, in comparison to which Kant's “bondage
to Euclidean geometry” now appeared to him naïve. After
this philosophical reverse he lapsed into an indifferent positivism
for a while. But in 1912 he found a new and exciting source of
philosophical enlightenment in Husserl's
phenomenology.^{[1]}
It was also at about this time that Fichte's metaphysical idealism
came to “capture his imagination.” Although Weyl later
questioned idealist philosophy, and became dissatisfied with
phenomenology, he remained faithful throughout his life to the primacy
of intuition that he had first learned from Kant, and to the
irreducibility of individual consciousness that had been confirmed in
his view by Fichte and Husserl.

Weyl never provided a systematic account of his philosophical views, and sorting out his overall philosophical position is no easy matter. Despite the importance of intuition and individual consciousness in Weyl's philosophical outlook, it would nevertheless be inexact to describe his outlook as being that of a “pure” idealist, since certain “realist” touches seem also to be present. Indeed his writings indicate that his metaphysics involves three elements, the first two of which may be considered “idealist”, and the third “realist”: these are, respectively, the Ego or “I”, the (Conscious) Other or “Thou”, and the external or “objective” world.

It is the first of these constituents, the Ego, to which Weyl ascribes primacy. Indeed, in Weyl's words,

The world exists only as met with by an ego, as one appearing to a consciousness; the consciousness in this function does not belong to the world, but stands out against the being as the sphere of vision, of meaning, of image, or however else one may call it. (Weyl 1934, 1)

The Ego alone has direct access to the given, that is, to the raw
materials of the existent which are presented to consciousness with an
immediacy at once inescapable and irreducible. The Ego is singular in
that, from its own standpoint, it is unique. But in an act of
self-reflection, through grasping (in Weyl's words) “what I
am for myself”, the Ego comes to recognize that it has a
*function*, namely as “conscious-existing carrier of the
world of phenomena.” It is then but a short step for the Ego to
transcend its singularity through the act of defining an
“ego” to be an entity performing that same
function *for itself*. That is, an ego is precisely what I am
for myself (in other words, what the Ego is for itself)—again a
“conscious-existing carrier of the world of
phenomena”— and yet *other* than
myself. “Thou” is the term the Ego uses to
address, and so to identify, an ego in this sense. “Thou”
is thus the Ego generalized, the Ego refracted through itself. The Ego
grasps that it exists within a world of Thous, that is, within a world
of other Egos similar to itself. While the Ego has, of necessity, no
direct access to any Thou, it can, through analogy and empathy, grasp
what it is to be Thou, a conscious being like oneself. By that very
fact the Ego recognizes in the Thou the same luminosity it sees in
itself.

The relationship of the Ego with the external world, the realm of
“objective” reality, is of an entirely different nature.
There is no analogy that the Ego can draw—as it can with the
Thou—between itself and the external world, since that world
(presumably) lacks consciousness. The external world is radically
other, and opaque to the
Ego^{[2]}.
Like Kant's noumenal realm, the external
world is outside the immediacy of consciousness; it is, in a word,
*transcendent*. Since this transcendent world is not directly
accessible to the Ego, as far as the latter is concerned the existence
of that world must arise through *postulation*, “a matter
of metaphysics, not a judgment but an act of acknowledgment
or
belief.”^{[3]}
Indeed, according to Weyl, it is not strictly necessary for the Ego to
postulate the existence of such a world, even given the existence of a
world of Thous:

For as long as I do not proceed beyond what is given, or, more exactly, what is given at the moment, there is no need for the substructure of an objective world. Even if I include memory and in principle acknowledge it as valid testimony, if I furthermore accept as data the contents of the consciousness of others on equal terms with my own, thus opening myself to the mystery of intersubjective communication, I would still not have to proceed as we actually do, but might ask instead for the ‘transformations’ which mediate between the images of the several consciousnesses. Such a presentation would fit in with Leibniz's monadology. (Weyl 1949, 117.)

But once the existence of the transcendent world is postulated, its
opacity to the Ego can be partly overcome by constructing a
representation of it through the use of *symbols*, the procedure
called by Weyl *symbolic construction*, (or
*constructive cognition)*^{[4]}
and which he regarded as the cornerstone of
scientific explanation. He outlines the process as follows (Weyl 1934,
53):

- Upon that which is given, certain reactions are performed by which the given is in general brought together with other elements capable of being varied arbitrarily. If the results to be read from these reactions are found to be independent of the variable auxiliary elements they are then introduced as attributes inherent in the things themselves (even if we do not actually perform those reactions on which their meaning rests, but only believe in the possibility of their being performed).
- By the introduction of symbols, the judgements are split up and a part of the manipulations is made independent of the given and its duration by being shifted onto the representing symbols which are time resisting and simultaneously serve the purpose of preservation and communication. Thereby the unrestricted handling of notions arises in counterpoint to their application, ideas in a relatively independent manner confront reality.
- Symbols are not produced simply “according to demand” wherever they correspond to actual occurrences, but they are embedded into an ordered manifold of possibilities created by free construction and open towards infinity. Only in this way may we contrive to predict the future, for the future is not given actually.

Weyl's procedure thus amounts to the following. In step 1, a
given configuration is subjected to variation. One then identifies
those features of the configuration that remain unchanged under the
variation—the *invariant* features; these are in turn,
through a process of reification, deemed to be properties of an
unchanging substrate—the “things themselves”. It is
precisely the invariance of such features that renders them (as well as
the “things themselves”) capable of being represented by
the “time resisting” symbols Weyl introduces in step 2. As
(written) symbols these are communicable without temporal distortion
and can be subjected to unrestricted manipulation without degradation.
It is the flexibility conferred thereby which enables the use of
symbols to be conformable with reality. Nevertheless (step 3) symbols
are not haphazardly created in response to immediate stimuli; they are
introduced, rather, in a structured, yet freely chosen manner which
reflects the idea of an underlying order—the “one real
world”—about which not everything is, or can be,
known—it is, like the future, “open towards
infinity”. Weyl observes that the reification implicit in the
procedure of symbolic construction leads inevitably to its iteration,
for “the transition from step to step is made necessary by the
fact that the objects at one step reveal themselves as manifestations
of a higher reality, the reality of the next step” (Weyl (1934),
32–33). But in the end “systematic scientific explanation will
finally reverse the order: first it will erect its symbolical world by
itself, without any reference, then, skipping all intermediate steps,
try to describe which symbolical configurations lead to which data of
consciousness” (*ibid*.). In this way the symbolic world becomes
(mistakenly) identified with the transcendent world.

It is symbolic construction which, in Weyl's vision, allows us
access to the “objective” world presumed to underpin our
immediate perceptions; indeed, Weyl holds that the objective world,
being beyond the grasp (the “lighted circle”) of intuition,
can *only* be presented to us in symbolic
form^{[5]}.
We can see a double dependence
on the Ego in Weyl's idea of symbolic construction to get hold of
an objective world beyond the mental. For not only is that world
“constructed” by the Ego, but the materials of
construction, the symbols themselves, as signs intended to convey
meaning, have no independent existence beyond their graspability by a
consciousness. By their very nature these symbols cannot point directly
to an external world (even given an unshakable belief in the existence
of that world) lying beyond consciousness. Weyl's metaphysical
triad thus reduces to what might be called a *polarized
dualism*, with the mental (I, Thou) as the primary, independent
pole and objective reality as a secondary, dependent
pole^{[6]}.

In his later years Weyl attempted to enlarge his metaphysical triad (I, Thou, objective world) to a tetrad, by a process of completion, as it were, to embrace the “godhead that lives in impenetrable silence”, the objective counterpart of the Ego, which had been suggested to him by his readings of Eckhart. But this effort remained uncompleted.

During his long philosophical voyage Weyl stopped at a number of ports
of call: in his youth, Kantianism and positivism; then Husserlian
phenomenological idealism; later Brouwerian intuitionism and finally a
kind of theological existentialism. But apart from his brief flirtation
with positivism (itself, as he says, the result of a disenchantment
with Kant's “bondage to Euclidean geometry”),
Weyl's philosophical orientation remained in its essence idealist
(even granting the significant realist elements mentioned above).
Nevertheless, while he continued to acknowledge the importance of
phenomenology, his remarks in *Insight and Reflection* indicate
that he came to regard Husserl's doctrine as lacking in two
essential respects: first, it failed to give due recognition to the
(construction of) transcendent external world, with which Weyl, in his
capacity as a natural scientist, was concerned; secondly, and perhaps
in Weyl's view even more seriously, it failed to engage with the
enigma of selfhood: the fact that I am the person I am. Grappling with
the first problem led Weyl to identify symbolic construction as
providing sole access to objective reality, a position which brought
him close to Cassirer in certain respects; while the second problem
seems to have led him to existentialism and even, through his reading
of Eckhart, to a kind of religious mysticism.

## 3. Weyl's work in the foundations and philosophy of mathematics

Towards the end of his *Address on the Unity of Knowledge*,
delivered at the 1954 Columbia University bicentennial celebrations,
Weyl enumerates what he considers to be the essential constituents of
knowledge. At the top of his
list^{[7]}
comes

…intuition, mind's ordinary act of seeing what is given to it. (Weyl 1954, 629)

In particular Weyl held to the view that intuition, or
*insight*—rather than *proof*—furnishes the
ultimate foundation of *mathematical* knowledge. Thus in his
*Das Kontinuum* of 1918 he says:

In the Preface to Dedekind (1888) we read that “In science, whatever is provable must not be believed without proof.” This remark is certainly characteristic of the way most mathematicians think. Nevertheless, it is a preposterous principle. As if such an indirect concatenation of grounds, call it a proof though we may, can awaken any “belief” apart from assuring ourselves through immediate insight that each individual step is correct. In all cases, this process of confirmation—and not the proof—remains the ultimate source from which knowledge derives its authority; it is the “experience of truth”. (Weyl 1987, 119)

Weyl's idealism naturally inclined him to the view that the
ultimate basis of his own subject, mathematics, must be found in the
intuitively given as opposed to the transcendent. Nevertheless, he
recognized that it would be unreasonable to require all mathematical
knowledge to possess intuitive immediacy. In *Das Kontinuum*,
for example, he says:

The states of affairs with which mathematics deals are, apart from the very simplest ones, so complicated that it is practically impossible to bring them into full givenness in consciousness and in this way to grasp them completely. (Ibid., 17)

Nevertheless, Weyl felt that this fact, inescapable as it
might be, could not justify extending the bounds of mathematics to
embrace notions, such as the actual infinite, which cannot be given
fully in intuition even in principle. He held, rather, that such
extensions of mathematics into the transcendent are warranted only by
the fact that mathematics plays an indispensable role in the physical
sciences, in which intuitive evidence is necessarily transcended. As he
says in The Open
World^{[8]}:

… if mathematics is taken by itself, one should restrict oneself with Brouwer to the intuitively cognizable truths … nothing compels us to go farther. But in the natural sciences we are in contact with a sphere which is impervious to intuitive evidence; here cognition necessarily becomes symbolical construction. Hence we need no longer demand that when mathematics is taken into the process of theoretical construction in physics it should be possible to set apart the mathematical element as a special domain in which all judgments are intuitively certain; from this higher standpoint which makes the whole of science appear as one unit, I consider Hilbert to be right. (Weyl 1932, 82).

In *Consistency in Mathematics* (1929), Weyl characterized
the mathematical method as

the a priori construction of the possible in opposition to the a posteriori description of what is actually given.^{[9]}

The problem of identifying the limits on constructing “the
possible” in this sense occupied Weyl a great deal. He was
particularly concerned with the concept of the mathematical
*infinite*, which he believed to elude
“construction” in the naive set-theoretical sense
^{[10]}.
Again to quote a passage from *Das Kontinuum:*

No one can describe an infinite set other than by indicating properties characteristic of the elements of the set…. The notion that a set is a “gathering” brought together by infinitely many individual arbitrary acts of selection, assembled and then surveyed as a whole by consciousness, is nonsensical; “inexhaustibility” is essential to the infinite. (Weyl 1987, 23)

But still, as Weyl attests towards the end of *The Open World*,
“the demand for totality and the metaphysical belief in reality
inevitably compel the mind to represent the infinite as closed being
by symbolical construction”. The conception of the completed
infinite, even if nonsensical, is inescapable.

### 3.1 *Das Kontinuum*

Another mathematical “possible” to which Weyl gave a
great deal of thought is the *continuum*. During the period
1918–1921 he wrestled with the problem of providing the
mathematical continuum—the real number line—with a
logically sound formulation. Weyl had become increasingly critical of
the principles underlying the set-theoretic construction of the
mathematical continuum. He had come to believe that the whole
set-theoretical approach involved vicious
circles^{[11]} to
such an extent that, as he says, “every cell (so to speak) of
this mighty organism is permeated by contradiction.” In *Das
Kontinuum* he tries to overcome this by providing analysis with
a *predicative* formulation—not, as Russell and Whitehead
had attempted, by introducing a hierarchy of logically ramified types,
which Weyl seems to have regarded as excessively complicated—but
rather by confining the comprehension principle to formulas whose
bound variables range over just the initial given entities
(numbers). Accordingly he restricts analysis to what can be done in
terms of natural numbers with the aid of three basic logical
operations, together with the operation of substitution and the
process of “iteration”, i.e., primitive recursion. Weyl
recognized that the effect of this restriction would be to render
unprovable many of the central results of classical
analysis—e.g., Dirichlet's principle that any bounded set of
real numbers has a least upper
bound^{[12]}—but
he was prepared to accept this
as part of the price that must be paid for the security of
mathematics.

As Weyl saw it, there is an unbridgeable gap between intuitively given
continua (e.g. those of space, time and motion) on the one hand, and
the “discrete” exact concepts of mathematics (e.g. that of
natural
number^{[13]})
on the other. The presence of this chasm
meant that the construction of the mathematical continuum could not
simply be “read off” from intuition. It followed, in
Weyl's view, that the mathematical continuum must be treated as
if it were an element of the transcendent realm, and so, in the end,
justified in the same way as a physical theory. It was not enough that
the mathematical theory be *consistent*; it must also be
*reasonable*.

*Das Kontinuum* embodies Weyl's attempt at formulating a
theory of the continuum which satisfies the first, and, as far as
possible, the second, of these requirements. In the following passages
from this work he acknowledges the difficulty of the task:

… the conceptual world of mathematics is so foreign to what the intuitive continuum presents to us that the demand for coincidence between the two must be dismissed as absurd. (Weyl 1987, 108)

… the continuity given to us immediately by intuition (in the flow of time and of motion) has yet to be grasped mathematically as a totality of discrete “stages” in accordance with that part of its content which can be conceptualized in an exact way. (

Ibid., 24)^{[14]}Exact time- or space-points are not the ultimate, underlying atomic elements of the duration or extension given to us in experience. On the contrary, only reason, which thoroughly penetrates what is experientially given, is able to grasp these exact ideas. And only in the arithmetico- analytic concept of the real number belonging to the purely formal sphere do these ideas crystallize into full definiteness. (

Ibid., 94)When our experience has turned into a real process in a real world and our phenomenal time has spread itself out over this world and assumed a cosmic dimension, we are not satisfied with replacing the continuum by the exact concept of the real number, in spite of the essential and undeniable inexactness arising from what is given. (

Ibid., 93)

As these quotations show, Weyl had come to accept that it was in
principle impossible to furnish the continuum as presented to
intuition with an exact mathematical formulation : so, with
reluctance, he lowered his sights. In *Das Kontinuum* his goal
was, first and foremost, to establish the *consistency* of the
mathematical theory of the continuum by putting the
*arithmetical* notion of real number on a firm logical
basis. Once this had been achieved, he would then proceed to show that
this theory is *reasonable* by employing it as the foundation
for a plausible account of continuous process in the objective
physical
world.^{[15]}

In §6 of *Das Kontinuum* Weyl presents his conclusions as to
the relationship between the intuitive and mathematical
continua. He poses the question: Does the mathematical
framework he has erected provide an adequate representation of physical
or temporal continuity as it is *actually experienced*? In
posing this question we can see the continuing influence of Husserl and
phenomenological doctrine. Weyl begins his investigation by noting
that, according to his theory, if one asks whether a given function is
continuous, the answer is not fixed once and for all, but is, rather,
dependent on the extent of the domain of real numbers which have been
defined up to the point at which the question is posed. Thus the
continuity of a function must always remain *provisional*; the
possibility always exists that a function deemed continuous
*now* may, with the emergence of “new” real numbers,
turn out to be discontinuous *in the future*.
^{[16]}

To reveal the discrepancy between this formal account of continuity based on real numbers and the properties of an intuitively given continuum, Weyl next considers the experience of seeing a pencil lying on a table before him throughout a certain time interval. The position of the pencil during this interval may be taken as a function of the time, and Weyl takes it as a fact of observation that during the time interval in question this function is continuous and that its values fall within a definite range. And so, he says,

This observation entitles me to assert that during a certain period this pencil was on the table; and even if my right to do so is not absolute, it is nevertheless reasonable and well-grounded. It is obviously absurd to suppose that this right can be undermined by “an expansion of our principles of definition”—as if new moments of time, overlooked by my intuition could be added to this interval, moments in which the pencil was, perhaps, in the vicinity of Sirius or who knows where. If the temporal continuum can be represented by a variable which “ranges over” the real numbers, then it appears to be determined thereby how narrowly or widely we must understand the concept “real number” and the decision about this must not be entrusted to logical deliberations over principles of definition and the like. (Weyl 1987, 88)

To drive the point home, Weyl focuses attention on the fundamental
continuum of *immediately given phenomenal time*, that is, as he
characterizes it,

… to that constant form of my experiences of consciousness by virtue of which they appear to me to flow by successively. (By “experiences” I mean what I experience, exactly as I experience it. I do not mean real psychical or even physical processes which occur in a definite psychic-somatic individual, belong to a real world, and, perhaps, correspond to the direct experiences.) (Ibid., 88)

In order to correlate mathematical concepts with phenomenal
time in this sense Weyl grants the possibility of introducing a rigidly
punctate “now” and of identifying and exhibiting the
resulting temporal points. On the collection of these temporal points
is defined the relation of *earlier than* as well as a
congruence relation of *equality of temporal intervals*, the
basic constituents of a simple mathematical theory of time. Now Weyl
observes that the discrepancy between phenomenal time and the concept
of real number would vanish if the following pair of conditions could
be shown to be satisfied:

- The immediate expression of the intuitive finding that during
a certain period I saw the pencil lying there were construed in such a
way that the phrase “during a certain period” was replaced
by “in every temporal point which falls within a certain time
span OE. [Weyl goes on to say parenthetically here that he admits
“that this no longer reproduces what is intuitively present, but
one will have to let it pass,
*if it is really legitimate to dissolve a period into temporal points*.”) - If
*P*is a temporal point, then the domain of rational numbers to which*l*belongs if and only if there is a time point*L*earlier than*P*such that*OL = l.OE*can be constructed arithmetically in pure number theory on the basis of our principles of definition, and is therefore a real number in our sense. (

*Ibid*., 89)

Condition 2 means that, if we take the time span *OE* as a
unit, then each temporal point *P* is correlated with a definite
real number. In an addendum Weyl also stipulates the converse.

But can temporal intuition itself provide evidence for the truth or falsity of these two conditions? Weyl thinks not. In fact, he states quite categorically that

… everything we are demanding here is obvious nonsense: to these questions, the intuition of time provides no answer—just as a man makes no reply to questions which clearly are addressed to him by mistake and, therefore, are unintelligible when addressed to him. (Ibid., 90)

The grounds for this assertion are by no means immediately evident,
but one gathers from the passages following it that Weyl regards the
experienced *continuous flow* of phenomenal time as constituting
an insuperable barrier to the whole enterprise of representing the
continuum as experienced in terms of individual points, and even to the
characterization of “individual temporal point” itself. As
he says,

The view of a flow consisting of points and, therefore, also dissolving into points turns out to be mistaken: precisely what eludes us is the nature of the continuity, the flowing from point to point; in other words, the secret of how the continually enduring present can continually slip away into the receding past. Each one of us, at every moment, directly experiences the true character of this temporal continuity. But, because of the genuine primitiveness of phenomenal time, we cannot put our experiences into words. So we shall content ourselves with the following description. What I am conscious of is for me both a being-now and, in its essence, something which, with its temporal position, slips away. In this way there arises the persisting factual extent, something ever new which endures and changes in consciousness. (Ibid., 91–92)

Weyl sums up what he thinks can be affirmed about “objectively
presented time”—by which he presumably means
“phenomenal time described in an objective
manner”—in the following two assertions, which he claims
apply equally, mutatis mutandis, to every intuitively given continuum,
in particular, to the continuum of spatial extension. (*Ibid*.,
92):

- An individual point in it is non-independent, i.e., is pure nothingness when taken by itself, and exists only as a “point of transition” (which, of course, can in no way be understood mathematically);
- It is due to the essence of time (and not to contingent imperfections in our medium) that a fixed temporal point cannot be exhibited in any way, that always only an approximate, never an exact determination is possible.

The fact that single points in a true continuum
“cannot be exhibited” arises, Weyl asserts, from the fact
that they are not genuine individuals and so cannot be characterized by
their properties. In the physical world they are never defined
absolutely, but only in terms of a coordinate system, which, in an
arresting metaphor, Weyl describes as “the unavoidable residue of
the eradication of the ego.” This metaphor, which Weyl was to
employ more than
once^{[17]},
again reflects the continuing influence of
phenomenological doctrine in his thinking : here, the thesis that the
existent is given in the first instance as the contents of a
consciousness.

### 3.2 Weyl and Brouwerian Intuitionism

By 1919 Weyl had
come to embrace Brouwer's views on the intuitive continuum. Given
the idealism that always animated Weyl's thought, this is not
surprising, since Brouwer assigned the thinking subject a central position in
the creation of the mathematical
world^{[18]}.

In his early thinking Brouwer had held that that the continuum is
presented to intuition as a whole, and that it is impossible to
construct all its points as individuals. But later he radically
transformed the concept of “point”, endowing points with
sufficient fluidity to enable them to serve as generators of a
“true” continuum. This fluidity was achieved by admitting
as “points”, not only fully defined discrete numbers such
as 1/9, *e*, and the like—which have, so to speak,
already achieved “being”—but also
“numbers” which are in a perpetual state of
“becoming” in that the entries in their decimal (or
dyadic) expansions are the result of free acts of choice by a subject
operating throughout an indefinitely extended time. The resulting
choice sequences cannot be conceived as finished, completed objects:
at any moment only an initial segment is known. Thus Brouwer obtained
the mathematical continuum in a manner compatible with his belief in
the primordial intuition of time—that is, as an unfinished, in
fact unfinishable entity in a perpetual state of growth, a
“medium of free development”. In Brouwer's vision, the
mathematical continuum is indeed “constructed”, not,
however, by initially shattering, as did Cantor and Dedekind, an
intuitive continuum into isolated points, but rather by assembling it
from a complex of continually changing overlapping parts.

Brouwer's impact looms large in Weyl's 1921 paper, On the New Foundational Crisis of Mathematics. Here Weyl identifies two distinct views of the continuum: “atomistic” or “discrete”; and “continuous”. In the first of these the continuum is composed of individual real numbers which are well-defined and can be sharply distinguished. Weyl describes his earlier attempt at reconstructing analysis in Das Kontinuum as atomistic in this sense:

Existential questions concerning real numbers only become meaningful if we analyze the concept of real number in this extensionally determining and delimiting manner. Through this conceptual restriction, an ensemble of individual points is, so to speak, picked out from the fluid paste of the continuum. The continuum is broken up into isolated elements, and the flowing-into-each other of its parts is replaced by certain conceptual relations between these elements, based on the “larger-smaller” relationship. This is why I speak of theatomisticconception of the continuum. (Weyl 1921, 91)

By this time Weyl had repudiated atomistic theories of the
continuum, including that of Das
Kontinuum.^{[19]}
While intuitive
considerations, together with Brouwer's influence, must certainly
have fuelled Weyl's rejection of such theories, it also had a
logical basis. For Weyl had come to regard as meaningless the formal
procedure—employed in Das Kontinuum—of negating universal
and existential statements concerning real numbers conceived as
developing sequences or as sets of rationals. This had the effect of
undermining the whole basis on which his theory had been erected, and
at the same time rendered impossible the very formulation of a
“law of excluded middle” for such statements. Thus Weyl
found himself espousing a
position^{[20]}
considerably more radical than that of
Brouwer, for whom negations of quantified statements had a perfectly
clear constructive meaning, under which the law of excluded middle is
simply not generally affirmable.

Of existential statements Weyl says:

An existential statement—e.g., “there is an even number”—is not a judgement in the proper sense at all, which asserts a state of affairs; existential states of affairs are the empty invention of logicians. (Weyl [1921], 97)

Weyl termed such pseudostatements “judgment abstracts”, likening them, with typical literary flair, to “a piece of paper which announces the presence of a treasure, without divulging its location.” Universal statements, although possessing greater substance than existential ones, are still mere intimations of judgments, “judgment instructions”, for which Weyl provides the following metaphorical description:

If knowledge be compared to a fruit and the realization of that knowledge to the consumption of the fruit, then a universal statement is to be compared to a hard shell filled with fruit. It is, obviously, of some value, however, not as a shell by itself, but only for its content of fruit. It is of no use to me as long as I do not open it and actually take out a fruit and eat it. (Ibid., 98)

Above and beyond the claims of logic, Weyl welcomed
Brouwer's construction of the continuum by means of sequences
generated by free acts of choice, thus identifying it as a
“medium of free Becoming” which “does not dissolve
into a set of real numbers as finished entities”. Weyl felt that
Brouwer, through his doctrine of
Intuitionism^{[21]},
had come closer than anyone
else to bridging that “unbridgeable chasm” between the
intuitive and mathematical continua. In particular, he found compelling
the fact that the Brouwerian continuum is not the union of two disjoint
nonempty parts—that it is, in a word, indecomposable. “A
genuine continuum,” Weyl says, “cannot be divided into
separate
fragments.”^{[22]}
In later publications he expresses this more
colourfully by quoting Anaxagoras to the effect that a continuum
“defies the chopping off of its parts with a
hatchet.”

Weyl also agreed with Brouwer that all functions everywhere defined on
a continuum are continuous, but here certain subtle differences of
viewpoint emerge. Weyl contends that what mathematicians had taken to
be discontinuous functions actually consist of several continuous
functions defined on separated continua.In Weyl's view, for example,
the “discontinuous” function defined by
*f*(*x*) = 0 for *x* < 0 and
*f*(*x*) = 1 for *x* ≥ 0 in fact consists of
the *two* functions with constant values 0 and 1 respectively
defined on the separated continua {*x*: *x* < 0} and
{*x*: *x* ≥ 0}. (The union of these two continua
fails to be the whole of the real continuum because of the failure of
the law of excluded middle: it is not the case that, for be any real
number *x*, either *x* < 0 or *x* ≥ 0.)
Brouwer, on the other hand, had not dismissed the possibility
that discontinuous functions could be defined on proper parts of a
continuum, and still seems to have been searching for an appropriate
way of formulating this
idea.^{[23]}
In particular, at that time Brouwer would
probably have been inclined to regard the above function *f* as
a genuinely discontinuous function defined on a proper part of the real
continuum. For Weyl, it seems to have been a self-evident fact that all
functions defined on a continuum are continuous, but this is because
Weyl confines attention to functions which turn out to be continuous by
definition. Brouwer's concept of function is less restrictive
than Weyl's and it is by no means immediately evident that such
functions must always be continuous.

Weyl defined real functions as mappings correlating each interval in the choice sequence determining the argument with an interval in the choice sequence determining the value “interval by interval” as it were, the idea being that approximations to the input of the function should lead effectively to corresponding approximations to the input. Such functions are continuous by definition. Brouwer, in contrast, considers real functions as correlating choice sequences with choice sequences, and the continuity of these is by no means obvious. The fact that Weyl refused to grant (free) choice sequences—whose identity is in no way predetermined—sufficient individuality to admit them as arguments of functions betokens a commitment to the conception of the continuum as a “medium of free Becoming” even deeper, perhaps, than that of Brouwer.

There thus being only minor differences between Weyl's and Brouwer's accounts of the continuum, Weyl accordingly abandoned his earlier attempt at the reconstruction of analysis, and joined Brouwer. He explains:

I tried to find solid ground in the impending state of dissolution of the State of analysis (which is in preparation, although still only recognized by few)without forsaking the order on which it is founded, by carrying out its fundamental principle purely and honestly. And I believe I was successful—as far as this is possible. Forthis order is itself untenable, as I have now convinced myself, and Brouwer—that is the revolution!… It would have been wonderful had the old dispute led to the conclusion that the atomistic conception as well as the continuous one can be carried through. Instead the latter triumphs for good over the former. It is Brouwer to whom we owe the new solution of the continuum problem. History has destroyed again from within the provisional solution of Galilei and the founders of the differential and the integral calculus. (Weyl 1921, 98–99)

Weyl's initial enthusiasm for intuitionism seems
later to have waned. This may have been due to a growing belief on his
part that the mathematical sacrifices demanded by adherence to
intuitionistic doctrine (e.g., the abandonment of the least upper bound
principle, and other important results of classical analysis) would
prove to be intolerable to practicing mathematicians. Witness this
passage from *Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural
Science*:

Mathematics with Brouwer gains its highest intuitive clarity. He succeeds in developing the beginnings of analysis in a natural manner, all the time preserving the contact with intuition much more closely than had been done before. It cannot be denied, however, that in advancing to higher and more general theories the inapplicability of the simple laws of classical logic eventually results in an almost unbearable awkwardness. And the mathematician watches with pain the greater part of his towering edifice which he believed to be built of concrete blocks dissolve into mist before his eyes. (Weyl [1949], 54)

Nevertheless, it is likely that Weyl remained convinced to the end of his days that intuitionism, despite its technical “awkwardness”, came closest, of all mathematical approaches, to capturing the essence of the continuum.

### 3.3 Weyl and Hilbert

Weyl's espousal of the intuitionistic standpoint in the foundations of mathematics in 1920–21 inevitably led to friction with his old mentor Hilbert. Hilbert's conviction had long been that there were in principle no limitations on the possibility of a full scientific understanding of the natural world, and, analogously, in the case of mathematics, that once a problem was posed with the required precision, it was, at least in principle, soluble. In 1904 he was moved to respond to Emil du Bois-Reymond's famous declaration concerning the limits of science, ignoramus et ignorabimus (“we are ignorant and we shall remain ignorant”):

We hear within us the perpetual call. There is the problem. Seek the solution. You can find it by pure reason, for in mathematics there is no ignorabimus.^{[24]}

Hilbert was unalterably opposed to any restriction of mathematics
“by decree”, an obstacle he had come up against in the
early stages of his career in the form of Leopold Kronecker's
(the influential 19^{th} century German mathematician)
anathematization of all mathematics venturing beyond the finite. In
Brouwer's intuitionistic program—with its draconian
restrictions on what was admissible in mathematical argument, in
particular, its rejection of the law of excluded middle,
“pure” existence proofs, and virtually the whole of
Cantorian set theory—Hilbert saw the return of Kroneckerian
constaints on mathematics (and also, perhaps, a trace of du
Bois-Reymond's “ignorabimus”) against which he had
struggled for so long. Small wonder, then, that Hilbert was upset when
Weyl joined the Brouwerian
camp.^{[25]}

Hilbert's response was to develop an entirely new approach to the
foundations of mathematics with the ultimate goal of establishing
beyond doubt the consistency of the whole of classical mathematics,
including arithmetic, analysis, and Cantorian set theory. With the
attainment of that goal, classical mathematics would be placed securely
beyond the destructive reach of the intuitionists. The core of
Hilbert's program was the translation of the whole apparatus of
classical mathematical demonstration into a simple, finitistic
framework (which he called “metamathematics”) involving
nothing more, in principle, than the straightforward manipulation of
symbols, taken in a purely formal sense, and devoid of
further
meaning.^{[26]}
Within metamathematics itself, Hilbert imposed a standard of
demonstrative evidence stricter even than that demanded by the
intuitionists, a form of finitism rivalling (ironically) that of
Kronecker. The demonstration of the consistency of classical
mathematics was then to be achieved by showing, within the constraints
of strict finitistic evidence insisted on by Hilbert, that the formal
metamathematical counterpart of a classical proof in that system can
never lead to an assertion evidently false, such as 0 = 1.

Hilbert's program rested on the insight that, *au fond*,
the only part of mathematics whose reliability is entirely beyond
question is the *finitistic*, or *concrete* part: in
particular, finite manipulation of surveyable domains of distinct
objects including mathematical symbols presented as marks on paper.
Mathematical propositions referring only to concrete objects in this
sense Hilbert called *real*, *concrete*, or
*contentual* propositions, and all other mathematical
propositions he distinguished as possessing an *ideal*, or
*abstract* character. (Thus, for example, 2 + 2 = 4 would count
as a real proposition, while *there exists an odd perfect
number* would count as an ideal one.) Hilbert viewed ideal
propositions as akin to the ideal lines and points “at
infinity” of projective geometry. Just as the use of these does
not violate any truths of the “concrete” geometry of the
usual Cartesian plane, so he hoped to show that the use of ideal
propositions—even those of Cantorian set theory—would never
lead to falsehoods among the real propositions, that, in other words,
such use *would never contradict any self-evident fact about
concrete objects*. Establishing this by strictly concrete, and so
unimpeachable means was thus the central aim of Hilbert's
program. Hilbert may be seen to have followed Kant in attempting to
ground mathematics on the apprehension of spatiotemporal
configurations; but Hilbert restricted these configurations to concrete
signs (such as inscriptions on paper). Hilbert regarded consistency as
the touchstone of existence, and so for him the important thing was the
fact that no inconsistencies can arise within the realm of concrete
signs, since correct descriptions of concrete objects are always
mutually compatible. In particular, within the realm of concrete signs,
actual infinity cannot generate inconsistencies since, again along with
Kant, he held that this concept cannot correspond to any concrete
object. Hilbert's view seems accordingly to have been that the
formal soundness of mathematics issues ultimately, not from a
*logical* source, but from a *concrete*
one^{[27]},
in much the
same way as the consistency of truly reported empirical statements is
guaranteed by the concreteness of the external
world^{[28]}.

Weyl soon grasped the significance of Hilbert's program, and came
to acknowledge its “immense significance and
scope”^{[29]}.
Whether that
program could be successfully carried out was, of course, still an open
question. But independently of this issue Weyl was concerned about what
he saw as the loss of content resulting from Hilbert's
thoroughgoing formalization of mathematics. “Without
doubt,” Weyl warns, “if mathematics is to remain a serious
cultural concern, then some *sense* must be attached to
Hilbert's game of formulae.“ Weyl thought that this sense
could only be supplied by “fusing” mathematics and physics
so that “the mathematical concepts of number, function, etc. (or
Hilbert's symbols) generally partake in the theoretical
construction of reality in the same way as the concepts of energy,
gravitation, electron,
etc.”^{[30]}
Indeed, in Weyl's view, “it is
the function of mathematics to be at the service of the natural
sciences”. But still:

The propositions of theoretical physics… lack that feature which Brouwer demands of the propositions of mathematics, namely, that each should carry within itself its own intuitively comprehensible meaning…. Rather, what is tested by confronting theoretical physics with experience is the system as a whole. It seems that we have to differentiate between phenomenal knowledge or insight—such as is expressed in the statement: ”This leaf (given to me in a present act of perception) has this green color (given to me in this same perception)”—and theoretical construction. Knowledge furnishes truth, its organ is “seeing” in the widest sense. Though subject to error, it is essentially definitive and unalterable. Theoretical construction seems to be bound only to one strictly formulable rational principle, concordance, which in mathematics, where the domain of sense data remains untouched, reduces to consistency; its organ is creative imagination. (Weyl 1949, 61–62)

Weyl points out that, just as in theoretical physics, Hilbert's account of mathematics “already… goes beyond the bounds of intuitively ascertainable states of affairs through… ideal assumptions.” (Weyl 1927, 484.) If Hilbert's realm of contentual or “real” propositions—the domain of metamathematics— corresponds to that part of the world directly accessible to what Weyl terms “insight” or “phenomenal knowledge”, then “serious” mathematics—the mathematics that practicing mathematicians are actually engaged in doing—corresponds to Hilbert's realm of “ideal” propositions. Weyl regarded this realm as the counterpart of the domain generated by “symbolic construction”, the transcendent world focussed on by theoretical physics. Hence his memorable characterization:

The set-theoretical approach is the stage of naive realism which is unaware of the transition from the given to the transcendent. Brouwer represents idealism, by demanding the reduction of all truth to the intuitively given. In [Hilbert's] formalism, finally, consciousness makes the attempt to “jump over its own shadow”, to leave behind the stuff of the given, to represent the transcendent—but, how could it be otherwise?, only through the symbol. (Weyl 1949, 65–66)

In Weyl's eyes, Hilbert's approach embodied the
“symbolic representation of the transcendent, which demands to be
satisfied”, and so he regarded its emergence as a natural
development. But by 1927 Weyl saw Hilbert's doctrine as beginning
to prevail over intuitionism, and in this an adumbration of
*“a decisive defeat of the philosophical attitude of pure
phenomenology*, which thus proves to be insufficient for the
understanding of creative science even in the area of cognition that is
most primal and most readily open to
evidence—mathematics.”^{[31]}
Since by this time Weyl had become convinced
that “creative science” must *necessarily* transcend
what is phenomenologically given, he had presumably already accepted
that pure phenomenology is incapable of accounting for theoretical
physics, let alone the whole of existence. But it must have been
painful for him to concede the analogous claim in the case of
*mathematics*. In 1932, he asserts: “If mathematics is
taken by itself, one should restrict oneself with Brouwer to the
intuitively cognizable truths … nothing compels us to go
farther.” If mathematics could be “taken by itself”,
then there would be no need for it to justify its practices by
resorting to “symbolic construction”, to employ symbols
which in themselves “signify nothing”—nothing, at
least, accessible to intuition. But, unlike Brouwer, Weyl seems finally
to have come to terms with the idea that mathematics could not simply
be “taken by itself”, that it has a larger role to play in
the world beyond its service as a paradigm, however pure, of subjective
certainty.

The later impact of Gödel's incompleteness theorems on
Hilbert's program led Weyl to remark in 1949
*[32]*:

The ultimate foundations and the ultimate meaning of mathematics remain an open problem; we do not know in what direction it will find its solution, nor even whether a final objective answer can be expected at all. “Mathematizing” may well be a creative activity of man, like music, the products of which not only in form but also in substance defy complete objective rationalization. The undecisive outcome of Hilbert's bold enterprise cannot fail to affect the philosophical interpretation. (Weyl 1949, 219)

The fact that “Gödel has left us little hope that a
formalism wide enough to encompass classical mathematics will be
supported by a proof of consistency” seems to have led Weyl to
take a renewed interest in “axiomatic systems developed before
Hilbert without such ambitious dreams”, for example Zermelo's
set theory, Russell's and Whitehead's ramified type theory and
Hilbert's own axiom systems for geometry (as well, possibly, as Weyl's
own system in *Das Kontinuum*, which he modestly fails to
mention). In one of his last papers, *Axiomatic Versus Constructive
Procedures in Mathematics*, written sometime after 1953, he saw
the battle between Hilbertian formalism and Brouwerian intuitionism in
which he had participated in the 1920s as having given way to a
“dextrous blending” of the axiomatic approach to
mathematics championed by Bourbaki and the algebraists (themselves
mathematical descendants of Hilbert) with constructive procedures
associated with geometry and topology.

It seems appropriate to conclude this account of Weyl's work in the foundations and philosophy of mathematics by allowing the man himself to have the last word:

This history should make one thing clear: we are less certain than ever about the ultimate foundations of (logic and) mathematics; like everybody and everything in the world today, we have our “crisis”. We have had it for nearly fifty years. Outwardly it does not seem to hamper our daily work, and yet I for one confess that it has had a considerable practical influence on my mathematical life: it directed my interests to fields I considered relatively “safe”, and it has been a constant drain on my enthusiasm and determination with which I pursued my research work. The experience is probably shared by other mathematicians who are not indifferent to what their scientific endeavours mean in the contexts of man's whole caring and knowing, suffering and creative existence in the world. (Weyl 1946, 13)

## Bibliography

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[1921] | ‘On the New Foundational Crisis in
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[1949] | Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science,
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[1950] | Space-Time-Matter, Henry L. Brose (trans.), New
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[1955] | “Insight and Reflection”. (Lecture delivered at
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## Related Entries

Brentano, Franz | Brouwer, Luitzen Egbertus Jan | consciousness | continuity and infinitesimals | Fichte, Johann Gottlieb | Gödel, Kurt | Hilbert, David | Hilbert, David: program in the foundations of mathematics | Husserl, Edmund | mathematics, philosophy of: intuitionism | mathematics: constructive