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Hermann Weyl

First published Wed Sep 2, 2009

Hermann Weyl was one of the greatest and most versatile mathematicians of the 20th century. His work had a vast range, encompassing analysis, algebra, number theory, topology, differential geometry, spacetime theory, quantum mechanics, and the foundations of mathematics. His scientific writing is informed by a rare literary and artistic sensibility—in his words, “Expression and shape mean almost more to me than knowledge itself”. He was unusual among scientists and mathematicians of his time in being attracted to idealist philosophy: his idealist leanings can be seen particularly in his work on the foundations of mathematics. In his youth Kant's doctrines made a great impression on him; later he was stirred both by Fichte's metaphysical idealism and by Husserlian phenomenology. Although Weyl came to question the certainties claimed by idealism, he cleaved always to the primacy of intuition he had first learned from Kant, and to its expression by Fichte as the “inner light” of individual consciousness.

1. Weyl's Life and Achievements

Hermann Weyl was born on November 9, 1885 in the small town of Elmshorn near Hamburg. In 1904 he entered Göttingen University, where his teachers included Hilbert, Klein and Minkowski. He remained there as student and Privatdozent until his call in 1913 to a Chair at the Federal Institute of Technology in Zürich. In that year he published the first of his numerous books, Die Idee der Riemannschen Fläche (The Idea of a Riemann Surface). Weyl's years in Zürich were extraordinarily productive and resulted in some of his finest work, especially in the foundations of mathematics and physics. The year 1918 saw the publication of two important works: Das Kontinuum (The Continuum) and Raum-Zeit-Materie (Space-Time-Matter). In 1927 there appeared his Philosophie der Mathematik und Naturwissenschaften (Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science); and in 1928 his ground-breaking Gruppentheorie und Quantenmechanik (Group Theory and Quantum Mechanics). During his years in Zürich Weyl received, and turned down, numerous offers of professorships by other universities—including an invitation in 1923 to become Felix Klein’s successor at Göttingen. It was only in 1930 that he finally accepted the call to become Hilbert's successor there. His second stay in Göttingen was to be brief. Repelled by Nazism, “deeply revolted by the shame which this regime had brought to the German name” (Weyl [1955], 300), he left Germany in 1933 to accept an offer of permanent membership of the newly founded Institute for Advanced Study in Princeton. Before his departure for Princeton he published The Open World (1932); his tenure there saw the publication of Mind and Nature (1934), The Classical Groups (1939), Algebraic Theory of Numbers (1940), Meromorphic Functions and Analytic Curves (1943), Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science (1949; an enlarged English version of the 1927 work), and Symmetry (1952). In 1951 he formally retired from the Institute, remaining as an emeritus member until his death, spending half his time there and half in Zürich. He died in Zürich suddenly, of a heart attack, on December 9, 1955.

2. Weyl's Metaphysics

Weyl was first and foremost a mathematician, and certainly not a “professional” philosopher. But as a German intellectual of his time it was natural for him to regard philosophy as a pursuit to be taken seriously. In Weyl's case, unusually even for a German mathematician, it was idealist philosophy that from the beginning played a significant role in his thought. Kant, Husserl, Fichte, and, later, Leibniz, were at various stages major influences on Weyl's philosophical thinking. As a schoolboy Weyl had been impressed by Kant's “Critique of Pure Reason.” He was especially taken with Kant's doctrine that space and time are not inherent in the objects of the world, existing as such and independently of our awareness, but are, rather, forms of our intuition As he reports in Insight and Reflection, (Weyl 1955), his youthful enthusiasm for Kant crumbled soon after he entered Göttingen University in 1904. There he read Hilbert's Foundations of Geometry, a tour-de-force of the axiomatic method, in comparison to which Kant's “bondage to Euclidean geometry” now appeared to him naïve. After this philosophical reverse he lapsed into an indifferent positivism for a while. But in 1912 he found a new and exciting source of philosophical enlightenment in Husserl's phenomenology.[1] It was also at about this time that Fichte's metaphysical idealism came to “capture his imagination.” Although Weyl later questioned idealist philosophy, and became dissatisfied with phenomenology, he remained faithful throughout his life to the primacy of intuition that he had first learned from Kant, and to the irreducibility of individual consciousness that had been confirmed in his view by Fichte and Husserl.

Weyl never provided a systematic account of his philosophical views, and sorting out his overall philosophical position is no easy matter. Despite the importance of intuition and individual consciousness in Weyl's philosophical outlook, it would nevertheless be inexact to describe his outlook as being that of a “pure” idealist, since certain “realist” touches seem also to be present. Indeed his writings indicate that his metaphysics involves three elements, the first two of which may be considered “idealist”, and the third “realist”: these are, respectively, the Ego or “I”, the (Conscious) Other or “Thou”, and the external or “objective” world.

It is the first of these constituents, the Ego, to which Weyl ascribes primacy. Indeed, in Weyl's words,

The world exists only as met with by an ego, as one appearing to a consciousness; the consciousness in this function does not belong to the world, but stands out against the being as the sphere of vision, of meaning, of image, or however else one may call it. (Weyl 1934, 1)

The Ego alone has direct access to the given, that is, to the raw materials of the existent which are presented to consciousness with an immediacy at once inescapable and irreducible. The Ego is singular in that, from its own standpoint, it is unique. But in an act of self-reflection, through grasping (in Weyl's words) “what I am for myself”, the Ego comes to recognize that it has a function, namely as “conscious-existing carrier of the world of phenomena.” It is then but a short step for the Ego to transcend its singularity through the act of defining an “ego” to be an entity performing that same function for itself. That is, an ego is precisely what I am for myself (in other words, what the Ego is for itself)—again a “conscious-existing carrier of the world of phenomena”— and yet other than myself. “Thou” is the term the Ego uses to address, and so to identify, an ego in this sense. “Thou” is thus the Ego generalized, the Ego refracted through itself. The Ego grasps that it exists within a world of Thous, that is, within a world of other Egos similar to itself. While the Ego has, of necessity, no direct access to any Thou, it can, through analogy and empathy, grasp what it is to be Thou, a conscious being like oneself. By that very fact the Ego recognizes in the Thou the same luminosity it sees in itself.

The relationship of the Ego with the external world, the realm of “objective” reality, is of an entirely different nature. There is no analogy that the Ego can draw—as it can with the Thou—between itself and the external world, since that world (presumably) lacks consciousness. The external world is radically other, and opaque to the Ego[2]. Like Kant's noumenal realm, the external world is outside the immediacy of consciousness; it is, in a word, transcendent. Since this transcendent world is not directly accessible to the Ego, as far as the latter is concerned the existence of that world must arise through postulation, “a matter of metaphysics, not a judgment but an act of acknowledgment or belief.”[3] Indeed, according to Weyl, it is not strictly necessary for the Ego to postulate the existence of such a world, even given the existence of a world of Thous:

For as long as I do not proceed beyond what is given, or, more exactly, what is given at the moment, there is no need for the substructure of an objective world. Even if I include memory and in principle acknowledge it as valid testimony, if I furthermore accept as data the contents of the consciousness of others on equal terms with my own, thus opening myself to the mystery of intersubjective communication, I would still not have to proceed as we actually do, but might ask instead for the ‘transformations’ which mediate between the images of the several consciousnesses. Such a presentation would fit in with Leibniz's monadology. (Weyl 1949, 117.)

But once the existence of the transcendent world is postulated, its opacity to the Ego can be partly overcome by constructing a representation of it through the use of symbols, the procedure called by Weyl symbolic construction, (or constructive cognition)[4] and which he regarded as the cornerstone of scientific explanation. He outlines the process as follows (Weyl 1934, 53):

  1. Upon that which is given, certain reactions are performed by which the given is in general brought together with other elements capable of being varied arbitrarily. If the results to be read from these reactions are found to be independent of the variable auxiliary elements they are then introduced as attributes inherent in the things themselves (even if we do not actually perform those reactions on which their meaning rests, but only believe in the possibility of their being performed).
  2. By the introduction of symbols, the judgements are split up and a part of the manipulations is made independent of the given and its duration by being shifted onto the representing symbols which are time resisting and simultaneously serve the purpose of preservation and communication. Thereby the unrestricted handling of notions arises in counterpoint to their application, ideas in a relatively independent manner confront reality.
  3. Symbols are not produced simply “according to demand” wherever they correspond to actual occurrences, but they are embedded into an ordered manifold of possibilities created by free construction and open towards infinity. Only in this way may we contrive to predict the future, for the future is not given actually.

Weyl's procedure thus amounts to the following. In step 1, a given configuration is subjected to variation. One then identifies those features of the configuration that remain unchanged under the variation—the invariant features; these are in turn, through a process of reification, deemed to be properties of an unchanging substrate—the “things themselves”. It is precisely the invariance of such features that renders them (as well as the “things themselves”) capable of being represented by the “time resisting” symbols Weyl introduces in step 2. As (written) symbols these are communicable without temporal distortion and can be subjected to unrestricted manipulation without degradation. It is the flexibility conferred thereby which enables the use of symbols to be conformable with reality. Nevertheless (step 3) symbols are not haphazardly created in response to immediate stimuli; they are introduced, rather, in a structured, yet freely chosen manner which reflects the idea of an underlying order—the “one real world”—about which not everything is, or can be, known—it is, like the future, “open towards infinity”. Weyl observes that the reification implicit in the procedure of symbolic construction leads inevitably to its iteration, for “the transition from step to step is made necessary by the fact that the objects at one step reveal themselves as manifestations of a higher reality, the reality of the next step” (Weyl (1934), 32–33). But in the end “systematic scientific explanation will finally reverse the order: first it will erect its symbolical world by itself, without any reference, then, skipping all intermediate steps, try to describe which symbolical configurations lead to which data of consciousness” (ibid.). In this way the symbolic world becomes (mistakenly) identified with the transcendent world.

It is symbolic construction which, in Weyl's vision, allows us access to the “objective” world presumed to underpin our immediate perceptions; indeed, Weyl holds that the objective world, being beyond the grasp (the “lighted circle”) of intuition, can only be presented to us in symbolic form[5]. We can see a double dependence on the Ego in Weyl's idea of symbolic construction to get hold of an objective world beyond the mental. For not only is that world “constructed” by the Ego, but the materials of construction, the symbols themselves, as signs intended to convey meaning, have no independent existence beyond their graspability by a consciousness. By their very nature these symbols cannot point directly to an external world (even given an unshakable belief in the existence of that world) lying beyond consciousness. Weyl's metaphysical triad thus reduces to what might be called a polarized dualism, with the mental (I, Thou) as the primary, independent pole and objective reality as a secondary, dependent pole[6].

In his later years Weyl attempted to enlarge his metaphysical triad (I, Thou, objective world) to a tetrad, by a process of completion, as it were, to embrace the “godhead that lives in impenetrable silence”, the objective counterpart of the Ego, which had been suggested to him by his readings of Eckhart. But this effort remained uncompleted.

During his long philosophical voyage Weyl stopped at a number of ports of call: in his youth, Kantianism and positivism; then Husserlian phenomenological idealism; later Brouwerian intuitionism and finally a kind of theological existentialism. But apart from his brief flirtation with positivism (itself, as he says, the result of a disenchantment with Kant's “bondage to Euclidean geometry”), Weyl's philosophical orientation remained in its essence idealist (even granting the significant realist elements mentioned above). Nevertheless, while he continued to acknowledge the importance of phenomenology, his remarks in Insight and Reflection indicate that he came to regard Husserl's doctrine as lacking in two essential respects: first, it failed to give due recognition to the (construction of) transcendent external world, with which Weyl, in his capacity as a natural scientist, was concerned; secondly, and perhaps in Weyl's view even more seriously, it failed to engage with the enigma of selfhood: the fact that I am the person I am. Grappling with the first problem led Weyl to identify symbolic construction as providing sole access to objective reality, a position which brought him close to Cassirer in certain respects; while the second problem seems to have led him to existentialism and even, through his reading of Eckhart, to a kind of religious mysticism.

3. Weyl's work in the foundations and philosophy of mathematics

Towards the end of his Address on the Unity of Knowledge, delivered at the 1954 Columbia University bicentennial celebrations, Weyl enumerates what he considers to be the essential constituents of knowledge. At the top of his list[7] comes

…intuition, mind's ordinary act of seeing what is given to it. (Weyl 1954, 629)

In particular Weyl held to the view that intuition, or insight—rather than proof—furnishes the ultimate foundation of mathematical knowledge. Thus in his Das Kontinuum of 1918 he says:

In the Preface to Dedekind (1888) we read that “In science, whatever is provable must not be believed without proof.” This remark is certainly characteristic of the way most mathematicians think. Nevertheless, it is a preposterous principle. As if such an indirect concatenation of grounds, call it a proof though we may, can awaken any “belief” apart from assuring ourselves through immediate insight that each individual step is correct. In all cases, this process of confirmation—and not the proof—remains the ultimate source from which knowledge derives its authority; it is the “experience of truth”. (Weyl 1987, 119)

Weyl's idealism naturally inclined him to the view that the ultimate basis of his own subject, mathematics, must be found in the intuitively given as opposed to the transcendent. Nevertheless, he recognized that it would be unreasonable to require all mathematical knowledge to possess intuitive immediacy. In Das Kontinuum, for example, he says:

The states of affairs with which mathematics deals are, apart from the very simplest ones, so complicated that it is practically impossible to bring them into full givenness in consciousness and in this way to grasp them completely. (Ibid., 17)

Nevertheless, Weyl felt that this fact, inescapable as it might be, could not justify extending the bounds of mathematics to embrace notions, such as the actual infinite, which cannot be given fully in intuition even in principle. He held, rather, that such extensions of mathematics into the transcendent are warranted only by the fact that mathematics plays an indispensable role in the physical sciences, in which intuitive evidence is necessarily transcended. As he says in The Open World[8]:

… if mathematics is taken by itself, one should restrict oneself with Brouwer to the intuitively cognizable truths … nothing compels us to go farther. But in the natural sciences we are in contact with a sphere which is impervious to intuitive evidence; here cognition necessarily becomes symbolical construction. Hence we need no longer demand that when mathematics is taken into the process of theoretical construction in physics it should be possible to set apart the mathematical element as a special domain in which all judgments are intuitively certain; from this higher standpoint which makes the whole of science appear as one unit, I consider Hilbert to be right. (Weyl 1932, 82).

In Consistency in Mathematics (1929), Weyl characterized the mathematical method as

the a priori construction of the possible in opposition to the a posteriori description of what is actually given.[9]

The problem of identifying the limits on constructing “the possible” in this sense occupied Weyl a great deal. He was particularly concerned with the concept of the mathematical infinite, which he believed to elude “construction” in the naive set-theoretical sense [10]. Again to quote a passage from Das Kontinuum:

No one can describe an infinite set other than by indicating properties characteristic of the elements of the set…. The notion that a set is a “gathering” brought together by infinitely many individual arbitrary acts of selection, assembled and then surveyed as a whole by consciousness, is nonsensical; “inexhaustibility” is essential to the infinite. (Weyl 1987, 23)

But still, as Weyl attests towards the end of The Open World, “the demand for totality and the metaphysical belief in reality inevitably compel the mind to represent the infinite as closed being by symbolical construction”. The conception of the completed infinite, even if nonsensical, is inescapable.

3.1 Das Kontinuum

Another mathematical “possible” to which Weyl gave a great deal of thought is the continuum. During the period 1918–1921 he wrestled with the problem of providing the mathematical continuum—the real number line—with a logically sound formulation. Weyl had become increasingly critical of the principles underlying the set-theoretic construction of the mathematical continuum. He had come to believe that the whole set-theoretical approach involved vicious circles[11] to such an extent that, as he says, “every cell (so to speak) of this mighty organism is permeated by contradiction.” In Das Kontinuum he tries to overcome this by providing analysis with a predicative formulation—not, as Russell and Whitehead had attempted, by introducing a hierarchy of logically ramified types, which Weyl seems to have regarded as excessively complicated—but rather by confining the comprehension principle to formulas whose bound variables range over just the initial given entities (numbers). Accordingly he restricts analysis to what can be done in terms of natural numbers with the aid of three basic logical operations, together with the operation of substitution and the process of “iteration”, i.e., primitive recursion. Weyl recognized that the effect of this restriction would be to render unprovable many of the central results of classical analysis—e.g., Dirichlet's principle that any bounded set of real numbers has a least upper bound[12]—but he was prepared to accept this as part of the price that must be paid for the security of mathematics.

As Weyl saw it, there is an unbridgeable gap between intuitively given continua (e.g. those of space, time and motion) on the one hand, and the “discrete” exact concepts of mathematics (e.g. that of natural number[13]) on the other. The presence of this chasm meant that the construction of the mathematical continuum could not simply be “read off” from intuition. It followed, in Weyl's view, that the mathematical continuum must be treated as if it were an element of the transcendent realm, and so, in the end, justified in the same way as a physical theory. It was not enough that the mathematical theory be consistent; it must also be reasonable.

Das Kontinuum embodies Weyl's attempt at formulating a theory of the continuum which satisfies the first, and, as far as possible, the second, of these requirements. In the following passages from this work he acknowledges the difficulty of the task:

… the conceptual world of mathematics is so foreign to what the intuitive continuum presents to us that the demand for coincidence between the two must be dismissed as absurd. (Weyl 1987, 108)

… the continuity given to us immediately by intuition (in the flow of time and of motion) has yet to be grasped mathematically as a totality of discrete “stages” in accordance with that part of its content which can be conceptualized in an exact way. (Ibid., 24)[14]

Exact time- or space-points are not the ultimate, underlying atomic elements of the duration or extension given to us in experience. On the contrary, only reason, which thoroughly penetrates what is experientially given, is able to grasp these exact ideas. And only in the arithmetico- analytic concept of the real number belonging to the purely formal sphere do these ideas crystallize into full definiteness. (Ibid., 94)

When our experience has turned into a real process in a real world and our phenomenal time has spread itself out over this world and assumed a cosmic dimension, we are not satisfied with replacing the continuum by the exact concept of the real number, in spite of the essential and undeniable inexactness arising from what is given. (Ibid., 93)

As these quotations show, Weyl had come to accept that it was in principle impossible to furnish the continuum as presented to intuition with an exact mathematical formulation : so, with reluctance, he lowered his sights. In Das Kontinuum his goal was, first and foremost, to establish the consistency of the mathematical theory of the continuum by putting the arithmetical notion of real number on a firm logical basis. Once this had been achieved, he would then proceed to show that this theory is reasonable by employing it as the foundation for a plausible account of continuous process in the objective physical world.[15]

In §6 of Das Kontinuum Weyl presents his conclusions as to the relationship between the intuitive and mathematical continua. He poses the question: Does the mathematical framework he has erected provide an adequate representation of physical or temporal continuity as it is actually experienced? In posing this question we can see the continuing influence of Husserl and phenomenological doctrine. Weyl begins his investigation by noting that, according to his theory, if one asks whether a given function is continuous, the answer is not fixed once and for all, but is, rather, dependent on the extent of the domain of real numbers which have been defined up to the point at which the question is posed. Thus the continuity of a function must always remain provisional; the possibility always exists that a function deemed continuous now may, with the emergence of “new” real numbers, turn out to be discontinuous in the future. [16]

To reveal the discrepancy between this formal account of continuity based on real numbers and the properties of an intuitively given continuum, Weyl next considers the experience of seeing a pencil lying on a table before him throughout a certain time interval. The position of the pencil during this interval may be taken as a function of the time, and Weyl takes it as a fact of observation that during the time interval in question this function is continuous and that its values fall within a definite range. And so, he says,

This observation entitles me to assert that during a certain period this pencil was on the table; and even if my right to do so is not absolute, it is nevertheless reasonable and well-grounded. It is obviously absurd to suppose that this right can be undermined by “an expansion of our principles of definition”—as if new moments of time, overlooked by my intuition could be added to this interval, moments in which the pencil was, perhaps, in the vicinity of Sirius or who knows where. If the temporal continuum can be represented by a variable which “ranges over” the real numbers, then it appears to be determined thereby how narrowly or widely we must understand the concept “real number” and the decision about this must not be entrusted to logical deliberations over principles of definition and the like. (Weyl 1987, 88)

To drive the point home, Weyl focuses attention on the fundamental continuum of immediately given phenomenal time, that is, as he characterizes it,

… to that constant form of my experiences of consciousness by virtue of which they appear to me to flow by successively. (By “experiences” I mean what I experience, exactly as I experience it. I do not mean real psychical or even physical processes which occur in a definite psychic-somatic individual, belong to a real world, and, perhaps, correspond to the direct experiences.) (Ibid., 88)

In order to correlate mathematical concepts with phenomenal time in this sense Weyl grants the possibility of introducing a rigidly punctate “now” and of identifying and exhibiting the resulting temporal points. On the collection of these temporal points is defined the relation of earlier than as well as a congruence relation of equality of temporal intervals, the basic constituents of a simple mathematical theory of time. Now Weyl observes that the discrepancy between phenomenal time and the concept of real number would vanish if the following pair of conditions could be shown to be satisfied:

  1. The immediate expression of the intuitive finding that during a certain period I saw the pencil lying there were construed in such a way that the phrase “during a certain period” was replaced by “in every temporal point which falls within a certain time span OE. [Weyl goes on to say parenthetically here that he admits “that this no longer reproduces what is intuitively present, but one will have to let it pass, if it is really legitimate to dissolve a period into temporal points.”)
  2. If P is a temporal point, then the domain of rational numbers to which l belongs if and only if there is a time point L earlier than P such that
    OL = l.OE

    can be constructed arithmetically in pure number theory on the basis of our principles of definition, and is therefore a real number in our sense. (Ibid., 89)

Condition 2 means that, if we take the time span OE as a unit, then each temporal point P is correlated with a definite real number. In an addendum Weyl also stipulates the converse.

But can temporal intuition itself provide evidence for the truth or falsity of these two conditions? Weyl thinks not. In fact, he states quite categorically that

… everything we are demanding here is obvious nonsense: to these questions, the intuition of time provides no answer—just as a man makes no reply to questions which clearly are addressed to him by mistake and, therefore, are unintelligible when addressed to him. (Ibid., 90)

The grounds for this assertion are by no means immediately evident, but one gathers from the passages following it that Weyl regards the experienced continuous flow of phenomenal time as constituting an insuperable barrier to the whole enterprise of representing the continuum as experienced in terms of individual points, and even to the characterization of “individual temporal point” itself. As he says,

The view of a flow consisting of points and, therefore, also dissolving into points turns out to be mistaken: precisely what eludes us is the nature of the continuity, the flowing from point to point; in other words, the secret of how the continually enduring present can continually slip away into the receding past. Each one of us, at every moment, directly experiences the true character of this temporal continuity. But, because of the genuine primitiveness of phenomenal time, we cannot put our experiences into words. So we shall content ourselves with the following description. What I am conscious of is for me both a being-now and, in its essence, something which, with its temporal position, slips away. In this way there arises the persisting factual extent, something ever new which endures and changes in consciousness. (Ibid., 91–92)

Weyl sums up what he thinks can be affirmed about “objectively presented time”—by which he presumably means “phenomenal time described in an objective manner”—in the following two assertions, which he claims apply equally, mutatis mutandis, to every intuitively given continuum, in particular, to the continuum of spatial extension. (Ibid., 92):

  1. An individual point in it is non-independent, i.e., is pure nothingness when taken by itself, and exists only as a “point of transition” (which, of course, can in no way be understood mathematically);
  2. It is due to the essence of time (and not to contingent imperfections in our medium) that a fixed temporal point cannot be exhibited in any way, that always only an approximate, never an exact determination is possible.

The fact that single points in a true continuum “cannot be exhibited” arises, Weyl asserts, from the fact that they are not genuine individuals and so cannot be characterized by their properties. In the physical world they are never defined absolutely, but only in terms of a coordinate system, which, in an arresting metaphor, Weyl describes as “the unavoidable residue of the eradication of the ego.” This metaphor, which Weyl was to employ more than once[17], again reflects the continuing influence of phenomenological doctrine in his thinking : here, the thesis that the existent is given in the first instance as the contents of a consciousness.

3.2 Weyl and Brouwerian Intuitionism

By 1919 Weyl had come to embrace Brouwer's views on the intuitive continuum. Given the idealism that always animated Weyl's thought, this is not surprising, since Brouwer assigned the thinking subject a central position in the creation of the mathematical world[18].

In his early thinking Brouwer had held that that the continuum is presented to intuition as a whole, and that it is impossible to construct all its points as individuals. But later he radically transformed the concept of “point”, endowing points with sufficient fluidity to enable them to serve as generators of a “true” continuum. This fluidity was achieved by admitting as “points”, not only fully defined discrete numbers such as 1/9, e, and the like—which have, so to speak, already achieved “being”—but also “numbers” which are in a perpetual state of “becoming” in that the entries in their decimal (or dyadic) expansions are the result of free acts of choice by a subject operating throughout an indefinitely extended time. The resulting choice sequences cannot be conceived as finished, completed objects: at any moment only an initial segment is known. Thus Brouwer obtained the mathematical continuum in a manner compatible with his belief in the primordial intuition of time—that is, as an unfinished, in fact unfinishable entity in a perpetual state of growth, a “medium of free development”. In Brouwer's vision, the mathematical continuum is indeed “constructed”, not, however, by initially shattering, as did Cantor and Dedekind, an intuitive continuum into isolated points, but rather by assembling it from a complex of continually changing overlapping parts.

Brouwer's impact looms large in Weyl's 1921 paper, On the New Foundational Crisis of Mathematics. Here Weyl identifies two distinct views of the continuum: “atomistic” or “discrete”; and “continuous”. In the first of these the continuum is composed of individual real numbers which are well-defined and can be sharply distinguished. Weyl describes his earlier attempt at reconstructing analysis in Das Kontinuum as atomistic in this sense:

Existential questions concerning real numbers only become meaningful if we analyze the concept of real number in this extensionally determining and delimiting manner. Through this conceptual restriction, an ensemble of individual points is, so to speak, picked out from the fluid paste of the continuum. The continuum is broken up into isolated elements, and the flowing-into-each other of its parts is replaced by certain conceptual relations between these elements, based on the “larger-smaller” relationship. This is why I speak of the atomistic conception of the continuum. (Weyl 1921, 91)

By this time Weyl had repudiated atomistic theories of the continuum, including that of Das Kontinuum.[19] While intuitive considerations, together with Brouwer's influence, must certainly have fuelled Weyl's rejection of such theories, it also had a logical basis. For Weyl had come to regard as meaningless the formal procedure—employed in Das Kontinuum—of negating universal and existential statements concerning real numbers conceived as developing sequences or as sets of rationals. This had the effect of undermining the whole basis on which his theory had been erected, and at the same time rendered impossible the very formulation of a “law of excluded middle” for such statements. Thus Weyl found himself espousing a position[20] considerably more radical than that of Brouwer, for whom negations of quantified statements had a perfectly clear constructive meaning, under which the law of excluded middle is simply not generally affirmable.

Of existential statements Weyl says:

An existential statement—e.g., “there is an even number”—is not a judgement in the proper sense at all, which asserts a state of affairs; existential states of affairs are the empty invention of logicians. (Weyl [1921], 97)

Weyl termed such pseudostatements “judgment abstracts”, likening them, with typical literary flair, to “a piece of paper which announces the presence of a treasure, without divulging its location.” Universal statements, although possessing greater substance than existential ones, are still mere intimations of judgments, “judgment instructions”, for which Weyl provides the following metaphorical description:

If knowledge be compared to a fruit and the realization of that knowledge to the consumption of the fruit, then a universal statement is to be compared to a hard shell filled with fruit. It is, obviously, of some value, however, not as a shell by itself, but only for its content of fruit. It is of no use to me as long as I do not open it and actually take out a fruit and eat it. (Ibid., 98)

Above and beyond the claims of logic, Weyl welcomed Brouwer's construction of the continuum by means of sequences generated by free acts of choice, thus identifying it as a “medium of free Becoming” which “does not dissolve into a set of real numbers as finished entities”. Weyl felt that Brouwer, through his doctrine of Intuitionism[21], had come closer than anyone else to bridging that “unbridgeable chasm” between the intuitive and mathematical continua. In particular, he found compelling the fact that the Brouwerian continuum is not the union of two disjoint nonempty parts—that it is, in a word, indecomposable. “A genuine continuum,” Weyl says, “cannot be divided into separate fragments.”[22] In later publications he expresses this more colourfully by quoting Anaxagoras to the effect that a continuum “defies the chopping off of its parts with a hatchet.”

Weyl also agreed with Brouwer that all functions everywhere defined on a continuum are continuous, but here certain subtle differences of viewpoint emerge. Weyl contends that what mathematicians had taken to be discontinuous functions actually consist of several continuous functions defined on separated continua.In Weyl's view, for example, the “discontinuous” function defined by f(x) = 0 for x < 0 and f(x) = 1 for x ≥ 0 in fact consists of the two functions with constant values 0 and 1 respectively defined on the separated continua {x: x < 0} and {x: x ≥ 0}. (The union of these two continua fails to be the whole of the real continuum because of the failure of the law of excluded middle: it is not the case that, for be any real number x, either x < 0 or x ≥ 0.) Brouwer, on the other hand, had not dismissed the possibility that discontinuous functions could be defined on proper parts of a continuum, and still seems to have been searching for an appropriate way of formulating this idea.[23] In particular, at that time Brouwer would probably have been inclined to regard the above function f as a genuinely discontinuous function defined on a proper part of the real continuum. For Weyl, it seems to have been a self-evident fact that all functions defined on a continuum are continuous, but this is because Weyl confines attention to functions which turn out to be continuous by definition. Brouwer's concept of function is less restrictive than Weyl's and it is by no means immediately evident that such functions must always be continuous.

Weyl defined real functions as mappings correlating each interval in the choice sequence determining the argument with an interval in the choice sequence determining the value “interval by interval” as it were, the idea being that approximations to the input of the function should lead effectively to corresponding approximations to the input. Such functions are continuous by definition. Brouwer, in contrast, considers real functions as correlating choice sequences with choice sequences, and the continuity of these is by no means obvious. The fact that Weyl refused to grant (free) choice sequences—whose identity is in no way predetermined—sufficient individuality to admit them as arguments of functions betokens a commitment to the conception of the continuum as a “medium of free Becoming” even deeper, perhaps, than that of Brouwer.

There thus being only minor differences between Weyl's and Brouwer's accounts of the continuum, Weyl accordingly abandoned his earlier attempt at the reconstruction of analysis, and joined Brouwer. He explains:

I tried to find solid ground in the impending state of dissolution of the State of analysis (which is in preparation, although still only recognized by few)without forsaking the order on which it is founded, by carrying out its fundamental principle purely and honestly. And I believe I was successful—as far as this is possible. For this order is itself untenable, as I have now convinced myself, and Brouwer—that is the revolution!… It would have been wonderful had the old dispute led to the conclusion that the atomistic conception as well as the continuous one can be carried through. Instead the latter triumphs for good over the former. It is Brouwer to whom we owe the new solution of the continuum problem. History has destroyed again from within the provisional solution of Galilei and the founders of the differential and the integral calculus. (Weyl 1921, 98–99)

Weyl's initial enthusiasm for intuitionism seems later to have waned. This may have been due to a growing belief on his part that the mathematical sacrifices demanded by adherence to intuitionistic doctrine (e.g., the abandonment of the least upper bound principle, and other important results of classical analysis) would prove to be intolerable to practicing mathematicians. Witness this passage from Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science:

Mathematics with Brouwer gains its highest intuitive clarity. He succeeds in developing the beginnings of analysis in a natural manner, all the time preserving the contact with intuition much more closely than had been done before. It cannot be denied, however, that in advancing to higher and more general theories the inapplicability of the simple laws of classical logic eventually results in an almost unbearable awkwardness. And the mathematician watches with pain the greater part of his towering edifice which he believed to be built of concrete blocks dissolve into mist before his eyes. (Weyl [1949], 54)

Nevertheless, it is likely that Weyl remained convinced to the end of his days that intuitionism, despite its technical “awkwardness”, came closest, of all mathematical approaches, to capturing the essence of the continuum.

3.3 Weyl and Hilbert

Weyl's espousal of the intuitionistic standpoint in the foundations of mathematics in 1920–21 inevitably led to friction with his old mentor Hilbert. Hilbert's conviction had long been that there were in principle no limitations on the possibility of a full scientific understanding of the natural world, and, analogously, in the case of mathematics, that once a problem was posed with the required precision, it was, at least in principle, soluble. In 1904 he was moved to respond to Emil du Bois-Reymond's famous declaration concerning the limits of science, ignoramus et ignorabimus (“we are ignorant and we shall remain ignorant”):

We hear within us the perpetual call. There is the problem. Seek the solution. You can find it by pure reason, for in mathematics there is no ignorabimus.[24]

Hilbert was unalterably opposed to any restriction of mathematics “by decree”, an obstacle he had come up against in the early stages of his career in the form of Leopold Kronecker's (the influential 19th century German mathematician) anathematization of all mathematics venturing beyond the finite. In Brouwer's intuitionistic program—with its draconian restrictions on what was admissible in mathematical argument, in particular, its rejection of the law of excluded middle, “pure” existence proofs, and virtually the whole of Cantorian set theory—Hilbert saw the return of Kroneckerian constaints on mathematics (and also, perhaps, a trace of du Bois-Reymond's “ignorabimus”) against which he had struggled for so long. Small wonder, then, that Hilbert was upset when Weyl joined the Brouwerian camp.[25]

Hilbert's response was to develop an entirely new approach to the foundations of mathematics with the ultimate goal of establishing beyond doubt the consistency of the whole of classical mathematics, including arithmetic, analysis, and Cantorian set theory. With the attainment of that goal, classical mathematics would be placed securely beyond the destructive reach of the intuitionists. The core of Hilbert's program was the translation of the whole apparatus of classical mathematical demonstration into a simple, finitistic framework (which he called “metamathematics”) involving nothing more, in principle, than the straightforward manipulation of symbols, taken in a purely formal sense, and devoid of further meaning.[26] Within metamathematics itself, Hilbert imposed a standard of demonstrative evidence stricter even than that demanded by the intuitionists, a form of finitism rivalling (ironically) that of Kronecker. The demonstration of the consistency of classical mathematics was then to be achieved by showing, within the constraints of strict finitistic evidence insisted on by Hilbert, that the formal metamathematical counterpart of a classical proof in that system can never lead to an assertion evidently false, such as 0 = 1.

Hilbert's program rested on the insight that, au fond, the only part of mathematics whose reliability is entirely beyond question is the finitistic, or concrete part: in particular, finite manipulation of surveyable domains of distinct objects including mathematical symbols presented as marks on paper. Mathematical propositions referring only to concrete objects in this sense Hilbert called real, concrete, or contentual propositions, and all other mathematical propositions he distinguished as possessing an ideal, or abstract character. (Thus, for example, 2 + 2 = 4 would count as a real proposition, while there exists an odd perfect number would count as an ideal one.) Hilbert viewed ideal propositions as akin to the ideal lines and points “at infinity” of projective geometry. Just as the use of these does not violate any truths of the “concrete” geometry of the usual Cartesian plane, so he hoped to show that the use of ideal propositions—even those of Cantorian set theory—would never lead to falsehoods among the real propositions, that, in other words, such use would never contradict any self-evident fact about concrete objects. Establishing this by strictly concrete, and so unimpeachable means was thus the central aim of Hilbert's program. Hilbert may be seen to have followed Kant in attempting to ground mathematics on the apprehension of spatiotemporal configurations; but Hilbert restricted these configurations to concrete signs (such as inscriptions on paper). Hilbert regarded consistency as the touchstone of existence, and so for him the important thing was the fact that no inconsistencies can arise within the realm of concrete signs, since correct descriptions of concrete objects are always mutually compatible. In particular, within the realm of concrete signs, actual infinity cannot generate inconsistencies since, again along with Kant, he held that this concept cannot correspond to any concrete object. Hilbert's view seems accordingly to have been that the formal soundness of mathematics issues ultimately, not from a logical source, but from a concrete one[27], in much the same way as the consistency of truly reported empirical statements is guaranteed by the concreteness of the external world[28].

Weyl soon grasped the significance of Hilbert's program, and came to acknowledge its “immense significance and scope”[29]. Whether that program could be successfully carried out was, of course, still an open question. But independently of this issue Weyl was concerned about what he saw as the loss of content resulting from Hilbert's thoroughgoing formalization of mathematics. “Without doubt,” Weyl warns, “if mathematics is to remain a serious cultural concern, then some sense must be attached to Hilbert's game of formulae.“ Weyl thought that this sense could only be supplied by “fusing” mathematics and physics so that “the mathematical concepts of number, function, etc. (or Hilbert's symbols) generally partake in the theoretical construction of reality in the same way as the concepts of energy, gravitation, electron, etc.”[30] Indeed, in Weyl's view, “it is the function of mathematics to be at the service of the natural sciences”. But still:

The propositions of theoretical physics… lack that feature which Brouwer demands of the propositions of mathematics, namely, that each should carry within itself its own intuitively comprehensible meaning…. Rather, what is tested by confronting theoretical physics with experience is the system as a whole. It seems that we have to differentiate between phenomenal knowledge or insight—such as is expressed in the statement: ”This leaf (given to me in a present act of perception) has this green color (given to me in this same perception)”—and theoretical construction. Knowledge furnishes truth, its organ is “seeing” in the widest sense. Though subject to error, it is essentially definitive and unalterable. Theoretical construction seems to be bound only to one strictly formulable rational principle, concordance, which in mathematics, where the domain of sense data remains untouched, reduces to consistency; its organ is creative imagination. (Weyl 1949, 61–62)

Weyl points out that, just as in theoretical physics, Hilbert's account of mathematics “already… goes beyond the bounds of intuitively ascertainable states of affairs through… ideal assumptions.” (Weyl 1927, 484.) If Hilbert's realm of contentual or “real” propositions—the domain of metamathematics— corresponds to that part of the world directly accessible to what Weyl terms “insight” or “phenomenal knowledge”, then “serious” mathematics—the mathematics that practicing mathematicians are actually engaged in doing—corresponds to Hilbert's realm of “ideal” propositions. Weyl regarded this realm as the counterpart of the domain generated by “symbolic construction”, the transcendent world focussed on by theoretical physics. Hence his memorable characterization:

The set-theoretical approach is the stage of naive realism which is unaware of the transition from the given to the transcendent. Brouwer represents idealism, by demanding the reduction of all truth to the intuitively given. In [Hilbert's] formalism, finally, consciousness makes the attempt to “jump over its own shadow”, to leave behind the stuff of the given, to represent the transcendent—but, how could it be otherwise?, only through the symbol. (Weyl 1949, 65–66)

In Weyl's eyes, Hilbert's approach embodied the “symbolic representation of the transcendent, which demands to be satisfied”, and so he regarded its emergence as a natural development. But by 1927 Weyl saw Hilbert's doctrine as beginning to prevail over intuitionism, and in this an adumbration of “a decisive defeat of the philosophical attitude of pure phenomenology, which thus proves to be insufficient for the understanding of creative science even in the area of cognition that is most primal and most readily open to evidence—mathematics.”[31] Since by this time Weyl had become convinced that “creative science” must necessarily transcend what is phenomenologically given, he had presumably already accepted that pure phenomenology is incapable of accounting for theoretical physics, let alone the whole of existence. But it must have been painful for him to concede the analogous claim in the case of mathematics. In 1932, he asserts: “If mathematics is taken by itself, one should restrict oneself with Brouwer to the intuitively cognizable truths … nothing compels us to go farther.” If mathematics could be “taken by itself”, then there would be no need for it to justify its practices by resorting to “symbolic construction”, to employ symbols which in themselves “signify nothing”—nothing, at least, accessible to intuition. But, unlike Brouwer, Weyl seems finally to have come to terms with the idea that mathematics could not simply be “taken by itself”, that it has a larger role to play in the world beyond its service as a paradigm, however pure, of subjective certainty.

The later impact of Gödel's incompleteness theorems on Hilbert's program led Weyl to remark in 1949 [32]:

The ultimate foundations and the ultimate meaning of mathematics remain an open problem; we do not know in what direction it will find its solution, nor even whether a final objective answer can be expected at all. “Mathematizing” may well be a creative activity of man, like music, the products of which not only in form but also in substance defy complete objective rationalization. The undecisive outcome of Hilbert's bold enterprise cannot fail to affect the philosophical interpretation. (Weyl 1949, 219)

The fact that “Gödel has left us little hope that a formalism wide enough to encompass classical mathematics will be supported by a proof of consistency” seems to have led Weyl to take a renewed interest in “axiomatic systems developed before Hilbert without such ambitious dreams”, for example Zermelo's set theory, Russell's and Whitehead's ramified type theory and Hilbert's own axiom systems for geometry (as well, possibly, as Weyl's own system in Das Kontinuum, which he modestly fails to mention). In one of his last papers, Axiomatic Versus Constructive Procedures in Mathematics, written sometime after 1953, he saw the battle between Hilbertian formalism and Brouwerian intuitionism in which he had participated in the 1920s as having given way to a “dextrous blending” of the axiomatic approach to mathematics championed by Bourbaki and the algebraists (themselves mathematical descendants of Hilbert) with constructive procedures associated with geometry and topology.

It seems appropriate to conclude this account of Weyl's work in the foundations and philosophy of mathematics by allowing the man himself to have the last word:

This history should make one thing clear: we are less certain than ever about the ultimate foundations of (logic and) mathematics; like everybody and everything in the world today, we have our “crisis”. We have had it for nearly fifty years. Outwardly it does not seem to hamper our daily work, and yet I for one confess that it has had a considerable practical influence on my mathematical life: it directed my interests to fields I considered relatively “safe”, and it has been a constant drain on my enthusiasm and determination with which I pursued my research work. The experience is probably shared by other mathematicians who are not indifferent to what their scientific endeavours mean in the contexts of man's whole caring and knowing, suffering and creative existence in the world. (Weyl 1946, 13)


Primary Sources

[1910] ‘Über die Definitionen der mathematischen Grundbegriffen’, Math.-nat. Blätter, 7: 93-95 and 109–113. (Reprinted in Weyl [1968], vol. I, 298–304).
[1921] ‘On the New Foundational Crisis in Mathematics’. (English translation of ‘Über der neue Grundslagenkrise der Mathematik,’ Mathematische Zeitschrift, 10 (1921): 37–79.) In Mancosu [1998], 86–122.
[1925] ‘On the Current Epistemological Situation in Mathematics.’ English translation of ‘Die Heutige Erkenntnislage in der Mathematik, Symposion, 1 (1925–27): 1–32.) In Mancosu [1998], 123–142.
[1927] ‘Comments on Hilbert's second lecture on the foundations of mathematics’. Translation from German original in Jean van Heijenoort (ed.), From Frege to Gödel: A Source Book in Mathematical Logic, 1879–1931, Harvard University Press, 1981.
[1929] ‘Consistency in Mathematics,” Rice Institute Pamphlet, 16: 245–265. Reprinted in Weyl [1968] II, 150–170.
[1932] The Open World: Three Lectures on the Metaphysical Implications of Science, New Haven: Yale University Press.
[1934] Mind and Nature, Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
[1940] ‘The Ghost of Modality,’ Philosophical Essays in Memory of Edmund Husserl, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. Reprinted in Weyl [1968] III, 684–709.
[1946] ‘Mathematics and Logic: A brief survey serving as a preface to a review of The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell,’ American Mathematical Monthly, 53: 2–13.
[1949] Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science, Princeton: Princeton University Press. (An expanded Engish version of Philosophie der Mathematik und Naturwissenschaft, München: Leibniz Verlag, 1927.)
[1950] Space-Time-Matter, Henry L. Brose (trans.), New York: Dover, 1950. (English translation of Raum, Zeit, Materie, Berlin: Springer Verlag, 1918.)
[1954] ‘Address on the Unity of Knowledge,’ Columbia University Bicentennial Celebration, 1954. Reprinted in Weyl [1968] IV, 623–630.
[1955] “Insight and Reflection”. (Lecture delivered at the University of Lausanne, Switzerland, May 1954. Translated from German original in Studia Philosophica, 15, 1955.) In T.L. Saaty and F.J. Weyl (eds.), The Spirit and Uses of the Mathematical Sciences, New York: McGraw-Hill, pp. 281–301.
[1968] Gesammelte Abhandlungen (Volumes I-IV), K. Chandrasekharan (ed.), Berlin: Springer-Verlag.
[1985] ‘Axiomatic versus Constructive Procedures in Mathematics,’ T. Tonietti (ed.), Mathematical Intelligencer, 7 (4): 10–17, 38.
[1987] The Continuum: A Critical Examination of the Foundation of Analysis, S. Pollard and T. Bole (trans.), Kirksville, MO: Thomas Jefferson University Press. (English translation of Das Kontinuum, Leipzig: Veit, 1918.)

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Related Entries

Brentano, Franz | Brouwer, Luitzen Egbertus Jan | consciousness | continuity and infinitesimals | Fichte, Johann Gottlieb | Gödel, Kurt | Hilbert, David | Hilbert, David: program in the foundations of mathematics | Husserl, Edmund | mathematics, philosophy of: intuitionism | mathematics: constructive