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William of Champeaux

First published Mon Oct 3, 2005

Born in Champeaux, William (ca. 1070-1122) taught at the cathedral school of Notre Dame in Paris and the monastery of St. Victor. His staunch defense of realism in logic and metaphysics earned him a reputation as a preeminent philosopher of the late eleventh and early twelfth centuries. William was a student of Anselm of Laon, and, like others from his school, he was committed to the view that articles of faith are beyond the capacity of human reason to understand and human language to explain. He was recognized in his day as one of the continent's most influential theologians. These philosophical and theological commitments fueled the conflict with his most famous student, Peter Abelard, a conflict that was continued between Abelard and William's most famous protégé, Bernard of Clairvaux.

1. Life and Works

History is written by the winners. Most of what we know of William of Champeaux's life and work has been refracted down to us through the prism of a man who hated him. Peter Abelard lost almost every battle with William, his teacher and political enemy, yet he tells us that William was a discredited, defeated, jealous, and resentful man. Abelard claims to have humiliated William in debate, driving him from the Paris schools. He alleges that, in defeat, William cast himself in the role of monastic reformer only to advance his political career by an unearned reputation for piety. Still, even Abelard recognized that William was no fraud, calling him "first in reputation and in fact," and relocating to study under his tutelage (HC; trans. Radice 1974).

On the scholarly front, Abelard presents only half the story. He brags of forcing William to abandon a firmly-held realist theory of universals, but, rather than come over to Abelard's vocalist or nominalist cause, William developed a second, more sophisticated, realist view. So what might have appeared as an expression of intellectual honesty and academic rigor on William's part, Abelard presents as somehow shameful. What Abelard leaves out is how much he learned from William. Now that more of William's work has become available, it is clear that William prodded Abelard to give up naïve vocalism and develop the complex semantic theory we now associate with Abelard's nominalism.

The extent of William's and Abelard's involvement on opposite sides of the major political struggles of the day is also beginning to come to light. William was a man of considerable influence in the monastic reform movement. Abelard was a man of considerably less influence allied with the opposite faction. It is probably true that Abelard attracted the better students and so precipitated William's move from Paris to St. Victor. But far from retiring in shame, William became a statesman, ambassador, and confidant to the Pope, all the while retaining enough political clout to prevent Abelard from either holding his former chair as canon of Notre Dame or establishing a school in Paris. One recent biographer of Abelard points out that in 1119, while Abelard was recovering from his castration and was soon to be facing charges of heresy, William was a bishop acting as papal negotiator to the court of Emperor Henry V. Unfortunately for William's reputation, it was Abelard whose writings captured the imagination of readers in later centuries (Clanchy 1997: 296ff).

Very little is known about William's early life and education. The date usually assigned for his birth is 1070, but this may be off by as much as a decade. In 1094 leaders of the monastic reform movement appointed William as Master of Notre Dame. If this date is correct, he would have been only 24 at the time, and this was a crucial moment for the reformers. In 1094 King Philip I had been excommunicated for his "illegal marriage," and any person appointed to be Master at Notre Dame would have to have been an established scholar with considerable political influence, something not usually found in 24 year-olds. Thus, a date of 1060 or earlier may not be unlikely for William's birth (Iwakuma forthcoming c).

Little is known of William's education before he took this important post. He is known to have studied with Anselm of Laon and a certain Manegold, but it is unclear whether this was the theologian, Manegold of Lautenbach, or the grammarian, Manegold of Chartres. It is even suspected that William studied with the vocalist Roscelin of Compiègne.

Early in the first decade of the twelfth century, probably in 1104, William became archdeacon of Paris. In 1108 the reformist party received a setback when King Luis VI, King Philip's son by his "illegal marriage" ascended the throne. William resigned as archdeacon to move to the abbey of St. Victor and the Paris suburbs, where he continued to teach and remained an influential reformer. Both Hugh of St. Victor and Bernard of Clairvaux were among William's protégés from this period at St. Victor.

In 1113, he was appointed bishop of Châlons-sur-Marne. He continued to act as papal legate and negotiator and remained influential in the reform movement, particularly through his patronage of Bernard of Clairvaux. His continued scholarly reputation is demonstrated in the somewhat ludicrous tale of Rupert of Duetz, who, in 1117, set himself on a quest to challenge William of Champeaux and Anselm of Laon to intellectual combat (Clanchy 1997: 143). On January 18, 1122, William took the habit of a Cistercian and died at Clairvaux eight days later.

William's corpus of writings is not widely available and a great deal more textual work needs to be done before any assessment can be made about his broader philosophical significance. Nevertheless, his basic philosophical commitments and some of his characteristic views are known. The texts we do have indicate that he started his career as a realist in matters of logic and metaphysics and that his commitment to realism grew stronger with the appearance of the vocalists and early nominalists. Thanks to Abelard's criticisms, William is best known for his realist theories of universals. In response to the vocalist challenge, he seems to have held something like the Cratylus theory of language: the nature of words is intimately tied to the nature of the things they name. In logic, some vocalists claimed that the force of inference arises from words or ideas, but William argued that this is to be found instead in some thing or relation between things, which he identified as the locus or medium of argument. He interpreted Aristotle's Categories as ten general things, not ten general words as the vocalists maintained. These and other claims suggest a broadly realist philosophical outlook. It is possible that fragments and excerpts of William's work passed down to us by his near contemporaries are those in which he was debating with the vocalists, and so we do not know whether they represent William's deepest commitments or only brief forays into an important debate.

William's views are known mostly through references in contemporary works, especially those of Abelard. Though several of William's works have been identified, very few have been edited, and none has been translated into English. The IntroductionsIntroductiones dialecticae secundum Wilgelmum  (ISW)  and Introductiones dialecticae secundum magistrum G. Paganellum (IGP) — are very early works, possibly dating from William's arrival in Paris in 1094. Edited with these two Introductions are two brief discussions of media or loci, and the beginning of an early commentary on Porphyry, all likely by William (Iwakuma 1993; ISW is also in de Rijk 1967). These texts defend some of William's characteristic doctrines, but in 1094 the vocalist movement had not yet begun to exert any real influence in Paris, and so it is likely that he had not yet been forced to articulate his views in response to serious criticism.

Some of William's later works have also been identified. Although no editions have been published, several articles contain extensive excerpts. William is known to have written commentaries on Porphyry's Isagoge, Aristotle's Categories and De Interpretatione, Boethius' De Differentiis Topicis, and Cicero's De Inventione and Rhetorica ad Herennium. Some of his theological writings, along with those of other leading French theologians, were compiled in the later twelfth century under the title Liber Pancrisis. These have been edited as the ‘Sententiae’ of William of Champeaux (Lottin 1956). The Liber Pancrisis is thought to be a compilation of the best Parisian theology of the period, and so it is likely to represent William's most advanced views.

2. Universals

The history of philosophy remembers William for his two theories of universals, material essence realism and indifference realism. These theories emerge from the writings of Peter Abelard, where they are paired with Abelard's decisive arguments against them. Indeed, Abelard's critique was so powerful that when John of Salisbury wrote his famous catalogue of twelfth-century theories of universals, William is not even mentioned (Metalogicon II 17-20; Abelard LI Por.: 10-16, trans. Spade 1994: 29-37; see also John of Salisbury, Peter Abelard, and King 2004)

Material essence realism proposes that there are ten most general things or essences: one most general thing corresponding to each of Aristotle's ten categories. These essences are universal things:

It should be seen that there are ten common things which are the foundations of all other things and are called the most general things – as for example this common thing, substance, which is dispersed through all substances, and this thing, quantity, which is dispersed in all quantities and so on. And just as there are ten common things which are the foundations of all other things, so also there are ten words which, thanks to the things they signify, are said to be the foundations of all other words (C8; Marenbon 1997: 38).

These ten genera exist and are to some degree unformed. They are formed into subalternate genera and species by the addition of differentia. Species are formed into individuals by the addition of accidental forms: "a species is nothing other than a formed genus, an individual nothing other than a formed species" (P3; Marenbon 2004: 33; Iwakuma 2004: 309; Fredborg 1977: 35). This is how the view gets its name. The genus exists as the matter. The difference forms the genus "into a sub-altern genus which in turn becomes the matter for an inferior sub-altern genus or species. The addition of accidental forms divides the species into discrete individuals" [et fiant res discretae in actu rerum] (C8; Iwakuma 1999: 103). The individuals in a species or genus thus share a single material essence.

Everything in the created world is an accidentally differentiated individual, but this is an incidental feature of the created world, and by no means a commitment to concretism. Universal essences exist; they are simply never found except as accidentally differentiated, qua individuals.

In actuality genera and species have their being in individual things. I can, however, consider by reason the same thing which is individuated with its accidents removed from its make-up, and consider the pure simple thing, and the thing considered in this way is the same as that which is in the individual. And so I understand it as a universal. For it does not go against nature for it to be a pure thing if it were to happen that all its accidents were removed. But because it will never happen in actuality that any thing exists without accidents, so neither in actuality will that pure universal thing be found. (P3; Marenbon 2004: 33)

This mental exercise of stripping away forms does not merely produce a universal concept. It reveals the underlying metaphysical reality. There is a real universal thing corresponding to our universal concepts. It is this principle of a single universal substance individuated by accidents that Abelard reduces to absurdity.

When faced with Abelard's arguments against material essence realism, William gave up his belief in universal essences but refused to accept that universals are simply words or concepts. Indifference realism rejects the core principle of material essence realism by rejecting the notion that there are shared essences and holding that individuals are completely discrete from one another.

The words ‘one’ and ‘same’ are ambiguous, William says: "when I say Plato and Socrates are the same I might attribute identity of wholly the same essence or I might simply mean that they do not differ in some relevant respect." William's newfound ambiguity is the seed of his second theory of universals. The stronger sense of ‘one’ and ‘same’ applies to Peter/Simon and Saul/Paul (we would say Cicero/Tully), who "are one and the same according to identity" (Sen 236.123). As for Plato and Socrates:

We call them the same in that they are men [in hoc quod sunt homines], [‘same’] pertaining with regard to humanity. Just as one is rational, so is the other; just as one is mortal, so is the other. But if we wanted to make a true confession, it is not the same humanity in each one, but a similar [humanity], since they are two men. (Sen 236.115-120)

So, although Plato and Socrates have no common material—matter, form, or universal essence—they are still said to be the same because they do not differ. This leads to the claim that Abelard finds so disturbing. Each individual is both universal and particular:

Those things which per se are considered many and wholly diverse in essence are one considered in general or specific nature. That is, they do not differ in being man (esse hominem).

One Man is many men, taken particularly. Those which are one considered in a special nature are many considered particularly. That is to say, without accidents they are considered one per indifference, with accidents many.

It should never be said that many men make one Man. Rather it should be said that many men agree in being, in what it is to be a man (in esse hoc quod est esse homo). Nevertheless, they are wholly diverse in essence (P14; Iwakuma 1999: 119).

Indifference realism is not a complete departure from material essence realism because William still accepts accidental individuation. When the accidents are stripped away, Plato and Socrates are still one and the same although in the weaker sense of ‘one’ and ‘same’. They do not share a material essence, though they each have the same state or status of being a man. William's indifference realism holds that when individuating accidents are stripped away from two individuals, what you are left with may be numerically distinct but it is not individually discernible (you can't tell which one is Socrates). What is left then are pure things—there are no individuating characteristics. In this sense, each thing is itself a universal.

3. Logic and Philosophy of Language

With so few of William's works identified and even fewer properly edited and published, any serious discussion of his views on logic is years away. What follows is a brief presentation of William's thoughts on various issues. In many cases, these are gleaned from references in other texts, mostly by Abelard. These references indicate that William was a wide-ranging and serious thinker, but much as with the Pre-Socratics, we have just seen just the tip of the iceberg as far as his actual writings are concerned.

3.1 Signification

Logic is the art of discerning truth from falsehood and of making and judging arguments (ISW I 1.1; IGP I 1.1). The study of logic must therefore begin with the study of words. The Introductions, ISW and IGP, first define sounds, significant sounds, words, phrases (orationes), and sentences, then proceed to detailed discussion of complex hypothetical and categorical sentences and syllogisms. William's approach here became a model for twelfth-century logic textbooks.

William accepts the standard medieval definition of signification: a sound is significant if it generates an understanding in the mind of a hearer. Judging by William's discussion, there was some debate at the end of the eleventh century as to whether signification required that a spoken word actually, as opposed to merely potentially, generate an understanding in the mind of a hearer. Actual signification is too strong a criterion, but every sound potentially generates an understanding, even if only in the mind of the person uttering it. William argues that once a word is imposed—and a convention established—the word is significant because it is apt to signify whenever it is uttered (Iwakuma 1999 p109; forthcoming b). William's views on the conditions for imposing words are not yet fully known. The vocalists seem to have held that absent a linguistic convention, there is no connection between any sound and what it is imposed to signify, a view shared by Abelard (see Guilfoy 2002). On the other hand William held that "there is such an affinity between words and things that words draw their properties from things and so the nature of words is shown more clearly through the nature of things" (P14; Marenbon 1996: 6).

William clearly invites controversy by claiming that the only significant sounds, that is, the only words, are those that are imposed to name presently existing things:

That word is significant which is imposed on an existing thing, like ‘Man’; that word is not significant which is imposed on a non-existing thing, like ‘chimaera’, ‘blictrix’, and ‘hircocervus’ (IGP I 2.2).

A significant word is one whose significatum is found among existing things (ISW I 1.4).

To claim that ‘chimaera’ is the equivalent to ‘blictrix’ implies that ‘chimaera’ is equally meaningless. The view that significant words must name existing things presents obvious and difficult cases because we can utter true or false sentences about things that never existed or that no longer exist. In such cases, William claims that words have a figurative signification. ‘Chimaeras are imaginary’ figuratively expresses the sentence ‘Some mind has the imagination of a chimaera’ (Abelard D 136.32; Kneale and Kneale 1962: 207). ‘Homer is a poet’ is properly understood figuratively as ‘Homer's work, which he wrote in his role as poet, exists’ (H9; Iwakuma 1999: 113; Abelard D 136.14ff, 168.11ff).

Abelard attributes to William the view that words signify all things that they were imposed to name (Abelard D 112.24). Other texts indicate that William might have believed this. An anonymous text attributes to William the view that ‘all’ signifies all things simultaneously (H13; Iwakuma 1999: 111). However, it is also possible that Abelard misunderstood or misrepresented William (Iwakuma 1999: 107).

It is reported that William held a similar view of infinite terms. William is said to have argued that an infinite term, e.g., ‘non-man’, signifies all those things that are not men (H13; Iwakuma 1999: 109). However, William's own discussion of infinite terms is available. In the Introductions William argues that the signification of infinite terms can be taken affirmatively, negatively, or correctly (ISW I 4.2). Taken affirmatively ‘non-man’ positively signifies every thing that is not a man: each rock, flower, and squirrel. The affirmative account allows one to substitute ‘stone’ for ‘non-man’ in syllogisms with absurd results. Taking infinite terms negatively solves this problem by claiming that infinite terms do not signify any existing thing, but William cannot accept this because it would mean that infinite terms are not significant. Rather, he argues that the imposition of infinite terms is related to the imposition of their correlative terms.

‘Animal’ and ‘man’ signify the very same thing, animal and man, by imposition [ponendo], ‘non-animal’ and ‘non-man’ by remotion [removendo]. But because infinite terms signify by remotion, there is nothing which can be concluded by imposition. So it is not possible to conclude ‘stone’ from ‘non-animal’ (ISW I 4.2).

Because the remotive imposition of the infinite term ‘non-animal’ is related to the positive imposition of the term ‘animal’, the infinite term does not signify stone in the way the word ‘stone’ would. So although William holds that the same thing is signified, the mode of signification would preclude substitution of positive and infinite terms.

Abelard criticizes William for "doing such abuse to language" that he allowed ‘rational’ and ‘rational animal’ to signify the same thing (Abelard D 541.24). Again, another anonymous source confirms that William thought that a definition and the term defined, that is ‘rational mortal animal’ and ‘man’, signify the same thing (Green-Pedersen 1974, frag. 6). Both are consistent with William's theories of universals and may reflect William's commitment to words signifying presently existing things. William may well have thought that ‘rational’ and ‘rational animal’ have the same signification because each thing signified by ‘rational’ is signified by ‘rational animal’, and conversely. Such a view would involve a fairly simplistic theory of meaning, but this alone does not mean it was not William's view.

Some aspects of William's theory of signification are considerably more complex. He developed a theory of two modes of signification of quality terms:

One mode by imposition another by representation. ‘White’ and ‘Black’ signify the denoted substance by imposition, because they are imposed on this substance. They signify the qualities whiteness and blackness by representation. The substance they signify according to imposition is signified secondarily. They principally designate those qualities which they signify by representation.(C8; Iwakuma 1999 p.107)

Abelard confirms that William made this sort of distinction. As Abelard describes it, William held that ‘white’ signifies the white individual and also whiteness. ‘White’ signifies the subject (fundamentum) by denoting (nominando) it. It signifies whiteness by determining it in the subject (determinando circa fundamentum) (Abelard LI Top: 272.14). But at the present time, not enough material is available to begin to flesh out William's account of signification by denotation and signification by determination.

3.2 Multiple Senses of Sentences

William had several different views on the interpretation of different kinds of sentences. That he held the views is not much in dispute; they are attributed to him by several contemporaries and some are found in his own works. But the possible philosophical relation between them is a matter of speculation.

William held that sentences have two senses, a grammatical sense and a dialectical sense. Taken in the grammatical sense, the verb in sentences such as ‘Socrates is white’ marks an intransitive copulation of essence: the same thing is denoted by the subject and predicate. In the dialectical sense, the verb in ‘Socrates is white’ marks a predication of inherence: what is denoted by the predicate inheres in what is denoted by the subject. To the grammarian, ‘Socrates is white’ and ‘Socrates is whiteness’ have different senses and different truth conditions. ‘Socrates is white’ says that Socrates is a subject of whiteness. ‘Socrates is whiteness’ says that Socrates is essentially whiteness. To the dialectician, however, the two sentences have the same sense, since they both say that whiteness inheres in Socrates. The dialectical sense is more general (generalior, largior, superior) because it does not distinguish between essential and accidental inherence. But the grammatical sense is more precise (determinatior). Taken in the dialectical sense, ‘Socrates is white’ and ‘Socrates is whiteness’ would both be true. So, while the dialectical sense has some use for dialecticians, sentences are true and false in the grammatical sense (Abelard LI Top: 271-273; GP 1974 Frag 9; de Rijk 1967 II.I: 183-85).

According to William, maximal propositions contain or signify all the propositions under them. Thus, the maxim, ‘Of whatever the species is predicated the genus is also predicated’ signifies or contains the sentences ‘If it is a man it is an animal’, ‘If it is a rock it is a substance’, etc. Only the most general form is truly a maximal proposition, but it is the more precise (certior) sentences contained under the maxim that provide the inferential force for particular arguments. William may have developed this view in response to the vocalists. Abelard explains that multiple senses are needed given William's view that things, not words, warrant inference; only the more precise formulations can signify the things themselves (Abelard LI Top: 231.26-238.34). An anonymous author confirms Abelard's understanding of William's view. The argument, ‘Socrates is a man therefore Socrates is an animal’ is warranted by the topical maxim noted above. It is not the maxim itself but the more precise version contained in it, ‘If it is a man it is an animal’, that provides the force for this particular inference. According to this text, William argued that it is not the words (voces) or the sense (intellectus) of the more precise sentence that provides the inferential force, but the fact that the more precise sentence signifies relations (habitudines) between things (Green-Pedersen 1974: Frag 8;10;12).

William divides the standard A, E, I, and O sentences according to what he calls the matter of the sentence materia propositionis). The matter of the sentence is determined by the relationship between what is signified as the subject and the predicate. Each standard-form sentence is found in one of three matters: natural, contingent, or remotive. In a sentence of natural matter the predicate inheres universally in the subject: ‘All men are animals’. In a sentence of contingent matter the predicate inheres in the subject, but not universally: ‘All men are white’. In sentences of remotive matter the predicate in no way inheres in the subject: ‘All men are stones’. The validity of direct inferences between contraries, subalterns, etc. depends on the matter of the sentences involved. In all matter, contraries cannot both be true. So regardless of the matter, if an A sentence is true the corresponding E sentence is false. In natural and remotive matter, if either the A or E sentence is false the other must be true: if ‘No men are animals’ is false then ‘All men are animals’ must be true. However, in contingent matter both sentences may be false. It is possible for both ‘All men are white’ and ‘No men are white’ to be false. William gives a similar treatment for contradictories, subcontraries, and subalterns (ISW I 3-3.3; II 1.1-1.3; IGP I 5.4-5.6).

3.3 Argument, Conditionals, and Loci

Contemporary logicians recognize a difference between arguments and their corresponding conditionals. But they accept that an argument:

(1) Premise 1; Premise 2; therefore, Conclusion

and its corresponding conditional:

(2) If (Premise 1 and Premise 2) then Conclusion

are equivalent by the deduction theorem. (2) in turn is interderivable with:

(3) If Premise 1 then (if Premise 2 then Conclusion)

These logical relationships were all in dispute during the twelfth century. (Iwakuma 2004b presents these distinctions and discusses William's role in the debate.) Logicians at that time attributed much more significance to the distinction between arguments and conditionals, and most did not accept what we would now recognize as the formal rules of material implication. Along these lines, several views were attributed to William as characteristic of his logical program, but his arguments in the available texts do not reflect what others say about him. So, once again, the extent of William's influence is unclear.

William accepted that (1) and (2) are equivalent, but not for any metalogical reason. He thought that syllogisms were phrases (orationes) that contain the senses of several other sentences. The view attributed to William is that syllogisms and arguments are, as he puts it "subcontinuatives" [subcontinuativa] containing other sentences. ‘Socrates is a man; therefore, Socrates is an animal’ contains the sense of the sentences ‘Socrates is a man’, ‘Socrates is an animal’ and, ‘If Socrates is a man, then Socrates is an animal’ (B9 2.1 ed. Iwakuma 2004b: 102; this is the same text as Green-Pedersen 1974, frag 2). William calls the contained sentences ‘continuatives [continuativa]’. He also treats all syllogisms as conditionals of type (2) rather than type (3). There is no argument for his preference, at least not in the Introductions, and none of the available sources give his reasons. At present all that can be said is that William seems to have had a hand in the origins of a debate that raged during the twelfth century and was not revived until the twentieth.

William introduces several novelties in his discussion of loci. Most significantly, he limits his discussion of the traditional Boethian topics to the loci from the whole, part, opposites, equals, and immediates. He also introduces loci from the subject and from the predicate into his discussion of categorical arguments. Both moves were controversial.

William sometimes refers to the locus as ‘the medium’, by which he does not necessarily mean the middle term but rather the thing that acts as a link between the extremes of an argument. He also called the locus ‘the argument’, by which he means that the locus provides the argumentative or inferential force. But whichever name he chooses, William's realist commitment is evident.

The same thing is the argument and the locus according to Master W. but the locus is the force of the argument [sedes argumenti], and so this thing is the force of the argument. (Green-Pedersen 1974: frag 1)

In the Introductions, William calls loci "words" [voces], but they are words denoting the things themselves or their relations (habitudines) (IGP I 7). But William is not clear about the importance of this distinction between things and relations. Fragments of his later work report that he was quite careful to distinguish his view from any brand of vocalism. He distinguished the word (vox), the understanding or meaning of the word (intellectus), and the thing itself denoted by the word, and held that the thing itself is the locus. (Green-Pedersen 1974: frag 3,4)

In categorical syllogisms, William introduces the locus from subject, predicate, both subject and predicate, and from the whole (ISW II 2.2; IGP I 8ff; see Stump 1989: 117ff). Thus, the argument

All men are animals
No animal is a stone
Therefore, no man is a stone

is warranted by the locus from the predicate. The predicate of the first sentence is the link or medium between the extreme terms in the conclusion. In this case, animal (presumably the universal thing itself) is the locus or seat of the argument. The rule is, if something is predicated of some subject universally, then whatever is removed universally from the predicate is removed universally from the subject (William provides a lengthy set of rules describing the logical relations that hold between subjects and predicates). As described above, William holds that such maximal propositions contain the sense of those propositions that fall under them. The rule contains sentences signifying the relations between man and animal and between animal and stone (IGP I 8.4). The relations of animal to the extremes warrant the inference.

William provides a similar account of hypothetical syllogisms. He introduces several loci and rules, but these are not formal rules. What ultimately warrants any hypothetical syllogism is the same sort of derivative signification of an extra-mental thing or relation. Provided Socrates is risible, ‘Socrates is a man’ is true. The following hypothetical syllogism is warranted by the locus from the consequent:

(Socrates is a man → Socrates is an animal) → (Socrates is risible → Socrates is an animal)

The rule is: whatever follows from the consequent follows from the antecedent. In this case, the consequent is ‘Socrates is a man’, and the antecedent is ‘Socrates is risible’. This looks like a formal rule:


but William does not present it as such. ‘Socrates is risible → Socrates is a man’ is warranted by the locus from equals, and ‘Socrates is man → Socrates is an animal’ is warranted by the locus from the part (IGP I 9.2). The conclusion, ‘Socrates is risible → Socrates is an animal’, is arrived at via topical reasoning, not by formal rules of inference. This is the basis for much of the later criticism of his work. Abelard in particular derives contradictions from his views by treating William's loci as formal rules of inference (see Martin 2004).

3.4 Modality

Abelard reports that William thought that all modality was de dicto (or, in Abelard's terminology, de sensu)

Our teacher taught that modal sentences descend from simple sentences because modal sentences are about the sense of simple sentences. So that when we say ‘It is possible (or necessary) that Socrates runs’, we are saying that what the sentence ‘Socrates runs’ says is possible or necessary. (Abelard D 195.21; see also Mews 2005: 49; Knuuttila 1993: 87; Kneale and Kneale 1962: 212).

The extent to which this attribution is accurate is unclear. The view is at least superficially inconsistent with William's realism and anti-vocalism in all other areas. Additionally, Abelard was among the first to recognize the importance of the de dicto / de re distinction; the issue may be fairly confused in William's work, as it was in many others. On the other hand, several anonymous texts attribute to William the claim that ‘possibly’ and other modal terms modify the signification of other words in a sentence. Thus, ‘bishop’ signifies actual and existing bishops, but ‘possible bishop’ has a figurative sense signifying all those things whose nature is not repugnant with being a bishop (Iwakuma 1999: 112). This is not necessarily a rejection of de re modality, but again, more of William's work needs to be studied.

4. Ethics

William's ethics starts with two generally accepted early medieval claims: (1) evil is not any positively existing thing but only the privation of good (Sen 277.1); (2) every act or event that occurs is performed or condoned by God and therefore good (Sen 277.11-15). These lead William, among others, to situate moral good and evil in the human mind.

To this end, William names the elements of a fairly complex moral psychology: vice, desire/lust, pleasure, will, intention, and consent. Any or all of these elements might play a role in sinful behavior. Vice itself is not necessarily bad, since the vices are not acquired habits but inborn dispositions. Vices incline us to bad behavior but do not necessarily compel the will: there is no sin unless we consent to the behavior the vice inclines us toward (Sen 278.10). Carnal desire, lust, and pleasure, on the other hand, are always morally bad. William writes extensively about sexual lust and pleasure, especially as they are involved in the transmission of original sin. Before the fall, sex was no more pleasurable than "putting your finger in your mouth" (Sen. 254). In our fallen condition, however, lust and pleasure can never be removed from the act. Because our "ability" to experience this pleasure is the result of original sin, the pleasure itself is always culpable. Consent to a sexual act under the proper circumstances—e.g., between lawful spouses for the purpose of procreation—only lessens the gravity of the sin (Sen 255; 246). In William's moral psychology, will, intention, and consent are the undifferentiated elements of voluntary action. These play the most significant role, but sin is not exclusively in the will, consent, or intention.

Our best hope to avoid sin is to will what is right for the right reasons. However, when it comes to discovering what is right, and therefore what ought to be willed, we start out at a disadvantage. The human mind naturally has the power to discern good and evil (Sen 253.10; IGP II 4), but one of the effects of the Fall is that our rational capacities have been clouded and diminished. Before the Fall the senses were subject to reason; after the Fall this is reversed (Sen 253.12-15), for since then the mind has become more closely attached and even enslaved to the body. This is the fomes of sin, a carnal weakness that clouds our reason and makes us more inclined to sin (Sen 246.39). Fear, not reason, is the key for William, since "fear is the beginning of all wisdom" (Sen. 276.1). William describes three kinds of fear (Sen 276.17-34). First is the natural fear of danger and pain; even Jesus was subject to this fear. Second is fear of losing material things or the fear of punishment in hell. This fear shows that one values comfort and material things more that goodness and justice. People motivated by this second fear will act rightly out of fear of losing material goods or fear of the torments of hell, but not out of good or right intention: "he does not merit grace who serves not his love of justice but his love of things or his fear of punishment" (Sen 261.23-25). Third is the fear that arises from respect for God's justice and power. This respectful fear of God, with knowledge of our own weakness and fallibility, "is better called the love of God" (Sen 276.39-43). This humble fear of God should be our guide to what is right.

William's influence on Abelard here is obvious. Primarily, William and perhaps others from the school of Anselm of Laon were responsible for the delineating the complex moral psychology that is at the core of Abelard's ethics. The major differences are with regard to reason and responsibility. Because of our fallen state, William has little regard for the ability of human reason to correctly discern what is good. William is also content to prove that evil is no thing by situating its source somehow in the human mind. He is not interested in showing that we are responsible, only that we, and not God, are accountable. Our will, like our mind and body, is defective and we suffer the consequences of its failures. It is Abelard who takes this moral psychology and develops from it a theory of moral responsibility.

5. Philosophical Theology

William is committed to the belief that the mysteries of faith are beyond the scope of human reason, but this does not prevent him from discussing the issues philosophically and using his skill as a logician to prove his point.

The problem of free will and divine foreknowledge is familiar: if God's foreknowledge is infallible, then future events, including the actions of human beings, all happen of necessity; on the other hand, if future events,including the actions of human beings, could occur otherwise, then God's foreknowledge would fallible. William denies both propositions. With regard to the first he offers two arguments. He claims that God foresees the whole range of possible choices and infallibly foreknows which option free creatures will choose (Sen 237; 238). The event itself is not necessary; in fact, God infallibly foresees that the event is not necessary. He then adds an interesting claim about future contingent propositions: they are determinately true or false, but it is the infallibility of divine foreknowledge that makes them so. The future event itself which the proposition is about does not yet exist and is indeterminate (eventus rerum de quibus agitur indeterminate) (Sen 238.36). William seems to hold both that the future is indeterminate and that God's foreknowledge is determinately true or false.

The second proposition, ‘if future events, including the actions of human beings, could occur otherwise, then God's foreknowledge is fallible’, was interpreted in several ways by William's contemporaries. Some held that if the event could occur otherwise God would be fallible. Others held that because the event could occur otherwise God actually is fallible (see Mews 2005: 135). The former would reject the claim that the event could occur otherwise, but the latter would simply reject divine infallibility, arguing rather that God is just very lucky epistemically. Both views are theologically suspect, of course, and William argued that both inferences are invalid. But he does so by introducing an unexplained modal intuition that in context looks question-begging: the inference from ‘the event could occur otherwise’ to ‘God is or could be deceived’ is not necessary. It is possible that the former be true and the latter false because "it is never necessary that the impossible follow from the possible, and it is impossible for God to be, or to have been, deceived" (Sen 237.68).

William deftly avoids the overreaching that got philosophers like Roscelin and Abelard into such trouble. He outlines a theory of metaphorical language for describing God, and argues that the fundamental relations of the Trinity are beyond the powers of the human mind to comprehend.

Predicates such as good, just, etc.,when applied to God have a metaphorical rather than their usual literal meaning. As described above, William argued that all significant words are imposed to name existing things in the world and these words generate sound understandings of those things they were imposed to signify. When we impose the word ‘just’ or ‘good’ to name a just or good person, we do so because justice or goodness is in some way a quality of that person or her actions. God, on the other hand, is goodness itself and justice itself. The dignity and power of God cannot be grasped by human reason and so we cannot even conceive of God sufficiently to accurately impose words that name divine attributes: "words imposed for human use are used metaphorically for speaking about God" [ad loquendum de Deo transferuntur] (Sen 236.46).

Whenever he discusses the Trinity, William associates the Father with power, the Son with wisdom and the Holy Spirit with love. But this metaphor is not intended to help us toward rational understanding of the Trinity, or to provide a clear delineation of properties of the three ersons in any way that would allow an explanation of their relations and differences. William argues that there is nothing like the Trinity in the created world and so there is nothing the human mind is able to comprehend that could be used as an analogue for explaining the fundamental relation of the Trinity, three persons irreducibly present in one substance: "I do not see by what quality I would be able to explain this, since nothing similar can be found in the nature of any thing" (Sen 236.86). William rejects Augustine's metaphors of the sun and sunshine and the mind and reason. Sunshine is an accident of the air and is no part of the substance of the sun. Likewise, reason is a power of the mind and not its substance (Sen 236.101). William also explains that neither of his theories of universals can be applied to explain the sameness and difference of the divine persons. Material essence realism would imply that the persons in the Godhead are accidentally individuated, and this is unacceptable. The indifference theory would require the non-identity of three separate substances, which is also contrary to the teaching of the faith. What is William's ultimate conclusion? "Because no likeness <to any created thing> could be described, the Trinity must be defended by faith alone" (Sen 236.91).


Primary Sources

William of Champeaux

Several of William's commentaries have been identified, although in some cases the attribution is tentative. (Numbers P*, C*, H* and B*, are those assigned in the list of commentaries in Marenbon 1993 and 2000, and Green-Pedersen 1984.)

Shorter excerpts from some of William's commentaries can be found in Iwakuma 2004b, 1999, 1992, forthcoming A, forthcoming B; Marenbon 1997; Marenbon 1992.

Other Primary Texts

References to William in Contemporary Sources

[The author would welcome additions and revisions to the above list.]

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

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Related Entries

Abelard [Abailard], Peter | John of Salisbury | syllogism: medieval theories of | universals: the medieval problem of