Aquinas’ Moral, Political, and Legal Philosophy

First published Fri Dec 2, 2005; substantive revision Tue Mar 16, 2021

For Thomas Aquinas, as for Aristotle, doing moral philosophy is thinking as generally as possible about what I should choose to do (and not to do), considering my whole life as a field of opportunity (or misuse of opportunity). Thinking as general as this concerns not merely my own opportunities, but the kinds of good things that any human being can do and achieve, or be deprived of. Thinking about what to do is conveniently labeled “practical”, and is concerned with what and how to choose and do what one intelligently and reasonably can (i) to achieve intelligible goods in one’s own life and the lives of other human beings and their environment, and (ii) to be of good character and live a life that as a whole will have been a reasonable response to such opportunities.

Political philosophy is, in one respect, simply that part or extension of moral philosophy which considers the kinds of choice that should be made by all who share in the responsibility and authority of choosing for a community of the comprehensive kind called political. In another respect, it is a systematic explanatory account of the forms of political arrangement that experience and empirical observation show are available, with their characteristic features, outcomes, and advantages (and disadvantages and bad aspects and consequences). Though in form descriptive and contemplative, and thus non-practical, this aspect of political philosophy remains subordinate, in its systematization or conceptual structure, to the categories one finds necessary or appropriate when doing moral and political philosophy as it should be done, that is, as practical thinking by one whose every choice (even the choice to do nothing now, or the choice to do moral or political philosophy) should be a good use of opportunity.

Moral and political philosophy for Aquinas, then, is (1) the set or sets of concepts and propositions which, as principles and precepts of action, pick out the kinds of conduct (that is, chosen action) that are truly intelligent and reasonable for human individuals and political communities, together with (2) the arguments necessary to justify those concepts and propositions in the face of doubts, or at least to defend them against objections. It is a fundamentally practical philosophy of principles which direct us towards human fulfillment (flourishing) so far as that happier state of affairs is both constituted and achievable by way of the actions (chosen conduct) that both manifest and build up the excellences of character traditionally called virtues. If one must use a post-Kantian jargon, it is both “teleological” and “deontic”, and not more the one than the other.

1. Interpretations and method

Aquinas’ moral and political philosophy has to be reconstructed from his theological treatises and commentaries and his commentaries on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics and the first two and half books of Aristotle’s Politics. Its proper interpretation has been a matter of some difficulty from the time of his death in 1274. In recent decades the way to understand some aspects of its foundational concepts and logic has been strenuously disputed, not least among those philosophers who see it as offering a broadly sound answer to radical scepticism about value and obligation, an answer truer and more human than Kant’s or Bentham’s or their (in the broadest sense) successors’. A partial sample of these controversies is given in 1.1 and 1.2 below, which state the more common interpretation on two strategic issues and then elaborate objections to those interpretations. The remainder of this article then proceeds on the basis that there is merit in these objections, and that the study of Aquinas’ ethics as a systematic and strictly philosophical work of practical reason (at its most general and reflective) is still in its infancy. Further textual support, from over 60 of Aquinas’ works, can be found in Finnis 1998. Criticisms of the interpretation of Aquinas’ theory that is proposed in that work can be found in Paterson 2006, Wheatley 2015, Long 2004, and earlier in Lisska 1998 and McInerny 1997. These works argue in various ways that that interpretation denies or neglects the metaphysical foundations of the principles of practical reason that it offers to identify. Support, in general, for the approach in this article will be found in Rhonheimer 2012 and 2000. The first issue underlying this debate is whether the order of inquiry and coming to know (the epistemological order) is the same as the order of metaphysical dependence. The second issue is whether we can settle the first issue by using the epistemological axiom that we come to an (ultimately metaphysical) understanding of dynamic natures by understanding capacities through their actuations – which, in turn, we come to understand by understanding their objects. Does or does not that axiom entail that understanding of objects such as the intelligible goods (the objects of acts of will) precedes an adequate knowledge of nature, notwithstanding that (as is agreed on all sides) in the metaphysical order of intrinsic dependence such objects could not be willed or attained but for the given nature of (in this case) the human person?

1.1 Is the notion of “distinctive human function” foundational for Aquinas?

One line of understanding is exemplified by the section on “moral doctrine” in McInerny and O’Callaghan 2005. It gives a priority to Aristotle’s arguments attempting to identify a “distinctive” or “peculiarly human” function, arguments which proceed on the postulate that, if each kind of craft has its own characteristic function and mode of operation, so must human life as a whole have an “overall” and “distinctively characteristic” function and operatio; and the determination of this should decisively shape the whole of (the rest of) ethics and political theory. To this standard interpretation other interpreters, such as Grisez, Finnis, and Rhonheimer, object on grounds such as these:

(i) Aquinas’ austerely self-disciplined purposes as an Aristotelian commentator make quite insecure any assumption that he treats as fundamental to his own thinking any and every proposition which is treated by Aristotle as fundamental and expounded in Aquinas’ relevant commentary without adverse comment.

(ii) The “distinctive function” argument is not prominent or adduced as fundamental (or at all) in Aquinas’ more free-standing treatments of morality.

(iii) The argument is treated by Aquinas’ commentary as yielding the conclusion that felicitas (human happiness or flourishing) consists in a complete life lived in accordance with reason and hence, by entailment, with virtue. But in the Summa Theologiae this is argued to be only an imperfect and incomplete felicitas, and the problematic character of such a concept is apparent from the Summa’s definition of felicitas (and synonymously beatitudo) as perfect good and complete satisfaction of all desires.

(iv) The “distinctive function” argument is inherently unsatisfying in ways that could hardly have failed to be apparent to so able a philosopher as Aquinas. (a) In Aquinas’ rendering, it depends on the postulate that “nature does nothing in vain”, which in turn depends, according to Aquinas, on the premise that nature is the product of divine creative rationality, a premise which Aquinas himself argues is, though provable, by no means self-evident. (b) It seems arbitrary to assume that, if there is an appropriate function or operatio of human beings, it must be peculiar to them. For peculiarity or distinctiveness has no inherent relationship to practical fittingness, and in fact Aquinas elsewhere denies that rationality is peculiar to human beings since he holds that there are other intelligent creatures (the angels, understood to be created minds unmixed with matter, occupying what would otherwise be a surprising gap in the hierarchy of beings which ascends from the most material and inactive kinds through the vegetative kinds, the animal kinds, and the rational animal humankind, to the one utterly active and intelligent, non-dependent and uncreated divine being).

(v) The root of the weakness of the “peculiar/distinctive function” argument is that it is looking in the wrong direction, towards a metaphysical proposition concerning the nature of things, instead of towards what is intelligibly good as an opportunity, perhaps even the supreme opportunity, for me and anyone like me (any human being). And it is a truly fundamental methodological axiom of Aquinas’s philosophy, from beginning to end of his works, that in coming to understand the nature of a dynamic reality such as human being, one must first understand its capacities, to understand which one must first understand its act(ivities), to understand which one must first come to understand those activities’ objects. But the objects of human activities are intelligible opportunities such as coming to know, being alive and healthy, being in friendship with others, and so forth – objects whose attractiveness, fittingness, opportuneness, or appropriateness is in no way dependent upon, or even much enhanced by, the thought that they are distinctively characteristic of human beings as opposed to other animals.

(vi) The fact that an operatio is distinctive of human beings does not entail that that operatio is truly valuable, still less that it is obligatory, or that it is more valuable than alternative and incompatible ways or objectives of acting. For a premise containing no evaluative or normative term cannot entail a conclusion including such a term. If, on the other hand, the postulate that a certain operatio is the proper (or even a proper) function of human beings is asserted to be itself evaluative and/or normative rather than, or as well as, factual/descriptive, then some account is needed of the postulate’s source or justification (or self-evidence?). Aquinas has a fairly careful account of the self-evidence of a number of foundational evaluative and normative principles, but only one or two of them are said by him to point to kinds of operatio distinctive of human beings; two of the foundational principles are explicitly said by him to direct to goods that are not peculiar to human beings.

(vii) The analogy comparing one’s life as a whole to arts and crafts, each with its own distinctive function, operatio, seems weak, questionable and indeed question-begging. For life as a whole is open-ended both in having no knowable duration (see 2.2. below) and in requiring judgment about the choice-worthiness of ends as well as means and techniques (see 4.4.1. below). Moreover, Aquinas like Aristotle regularly insists on the irreducibility of the distinction or distinctions between, on the one hand, ars or factio (arts, crafts, techniques) and actio (the precise subject-matter of morality and morally significant choices).

1.2 Is the identification of “man’s last end” foundational for Aquinas?

Along with very many other Thomistic commentators, McInerny and O’Callaghan 2005 and Celano 2003 treat Aquinas’ moral philosophy as founded, like his moral theology, upon his determination of what felicitas (= perfecta beatitudo and Aristotle’s eudaimonia) truly is, a determination made in the opening quaestiones of the Second Part of his Summa Theologiae, where he elaborately argues that complete beatitudo or felicitas consists in an uninterruptible vision of God (and, in God, of the other truths we naturally desire to know), something possible for us only in a life – in many respects another life – after death. But it is possible to regard Aquinas’ argument in those quaestiones as dictated by the needs of a specifically theological pedagogy, as open to telling objections, and as detachable from (or at least as methodologically posterior to) the working and sound foundations of his moral philosophy and his treatment of specific moral issues – detachable, that is to say, in a way that Aquinas would not need to regard as inappropriate in the different context of today’s discourse. This article will treat Aquinas’ ethics and political theory as detachable from his theology of life’s ultimate point, and will take seriously his emphatic and reiterated thesis that, apart from the divinely given and super-natural opportunity of perfecta beatitudo (a gift about which philosophy as such knows nothing), the only ultimate end and beatitudo (fulfillment) for human beings is living in a completely reasonable, morally excellent (virtuosus) way. That thesis entails that philosophy’s main account of morality need and should contain no claim about what perfect happiness consists in.

Despite surface appearances, Aquinas is conscious of Aristotle’s failure to settle whether it is contemplation or political praxis that is the essence of human fulfillment. He therefore attempts, more intently than Aristotle did in any surviving work, to identify what the first principles of ethics and politics are, and to do so without any premises or presuppositions about a unitary “last end of human existence”.

Moreover, when Aquinas does refer to beatitudo as fundamental to identifying the principles of practical reason and the natural (because reasonable) moral law, he in the same breath emphasizes that this is not to be thought of as the happiness of the deliberating and acting individual alone, but rather as the common flourishing of the community, ultimately the whole community of humankind:

The ultimate end of human life is felicitas or beatitudo… So the main concern of law [including the natural (moral) law] must be with directing towards beatitudo. Again, since every part stands to the whole as incomplete stands to complete, and individual human beings are each parts of a complete community, law’s appropriate concern is necessarily with directing towards common felicitas … that is, to common good. (ST I-II q. 90 a. 2.)

The “complete community” mentioned here is the political community, with its laws, but the proposition implicitly refers also to the community of all rational creatures, to whose common good morality (the moral law) directs us.

1.2.1 Philosophy and theology in Aquinas’ theory of morality and politics

Detaching Aquinas’ philosophy from his theology is compatible with distinctions he firmly delineates at the beginning of his two mature theological syntheses, the Summa contra Gentiles and the Summa Theologiae. (i) There are truths, he says, which are accessible to natural reason, that is, to ordinary experience (including the specialized observations of natural scientists), insight, and reflection; and these include practical truths about good and evil, right and wrong. (ii) Many of those truths of natural reason are confirmed, and even clarified, by divine revelation, that is, the propositions communicated directly or inferentially in the life and works of Christ, as transmitted by his immediate followers and prepared for in the Jewish scriptures accepted by those followers as revelatory. (iii) Some of the truths divinely revealed could not have been discovered by natural, philosophical reason, even though, once accepted, their content and significance can be illuminated by the philosophically ordered reflection which he calls theology.

The philosophical positions in ethics and politics (including law) that are explored in this article belong to categories (i) and (ii). The moral and political norms stated, for example, in the biblical Decalogue are, in Aquinas’ view, all knowable independently of that revelation, which confirms and perhaps clarifies them. But the propositions that he holds about what the true last end or ultimate destiny of human beings actually is belong to category (iii) and cannot be affirmed on any philosophical basis, even though philosophy, he thinks, can demonstrate that they are neither incoherent nor contrary to any proposition which philosophy shows must be affirmed.

2. Practical reason’s first principles

Intelligence and reason are not two powers; “reason” and “reasoning” in a narrow sense can be regarded as the extension of one’s “intelligence” (one’s capacity for intelligent insight into the data of experience) into the propositional work of reasoning towards judgment, and “reason” (ratio) in a broader sense refers to this whole capacity, only analytically divisible into aspects or phases. So too, practical reason is not a distinct power. Rather, one’s capacity to think about the way things are can be (and naturally, that is effortlessly and normally, is) “extended” (Aquinas’ metaphor) to thinking intelligently and making reasonable and true judgments about what to do. Thinking and judging of the latter kind is practical, that is, intends to terminate in choice and action (in Greek praxis, in Latin actio). “Practical reason” sometimes refers (i) directly to such thinking, sometimes (ii) to the propositional content or structure which such thinking has when it is done well – and thus to the propositions that pick out what kinds of action one ought to be judging pursuit-worthy, undesirable, right, wrong, etc. – and sometimes (iii) to the capacity to engage in such thinking by understanding such propositions and being guided by them.

2.1 Precondition: capacity for self-determination by free choices

Practical reason’s central activity is deliberation about what to do. One would have no need to deliberate unless one were confronted by alternative attractive possibilities for action (kinds of opportunity) between which one must choose (in the sense that one cannot do both at the same time, if at all) and can choose. The standards that one comes to understand to be the appropriate guides for one’s deliberation, choice and action give such guidance, not by predicting what one will do, but by directing what one should do. (The “should” here may but need not be moral.) There could be no normativity, no practical (choice-guiding) directiveness, unless free choices were really possible.

Aquinas’s position is not that all our activities are freely chosen: there are indeed “acts of the human person”, perhaps quite frequent, which are not “human acts” in the central sense (freely chosen) but rather spontaneous and undeliberated. Nor is it that chosen acts must be immediately preceded by choice: many of one’s acts are the carrying out of choices which were made in the past and need not be now renewed or repeated since no alternative option appears attractive. It is that one can be and often is in such a position that, confronted by two or more attractive possibilities (including perhaps the option of “doing nothing”), there is nothing either within or outside one’s personal constitution that determines (settles) one’s choice, other than the choosing: Mal. q. 6. This conception of free choice (liberum arbitrium or libera electio) is much stronger than Aristotle’s, on whose conception free choices are free only from external determining factors. Aquinas’ conception of free choice is also incompatible with modern notions of soft determinism, or the supposed compatibility of human responsibility (and of the sense [self-understanding] that one is freely choosing) with determination of every event by laws (e.g. physical) of nature. Aquinas understands the freedom of our free choices to be a reality as primary and metaphysically and conceptually irreducible as the reality of physical laws, and he puts all his reflections on morality and practical reason under the heading of “mastery over one’s own acts” (ST I-II, prologue).

He is also insistent that if there were no such freedom and self-determination, there could be no responsibility (fault, merit, etc.), and no sense or content to any ought (normativity) such as ethics is concerned with.

2.1.1 Choice, intention and act-descriptions

Aquinas pulls together into a powerful (though confusingly expounded) synthesis a long tradition of analysis of the elements of understanding (reason) and intelligent response (will) that constitute deliberation, choice, and execution of choice: ST I-II qq. 6–17. The analysis shows the centrality of intention in the assessment of options and actions. In a narrow sense of the word, intention is always of ends and choice is of means; but since every means (save the means most proximate to sheer trying or exertion) is also an end relative to a more proximate means, what is chosen when one adopts one of two or more proposals (for one’s action) that one has shaped in one’s deliberation is rightly, though more broadly, said to be what one intends, what one does intentionally or with intent(ion), and so forth. An act(ion) is paradigmatically what it is intended to be; that is, its morally primary description – prior to any moral evaluation or predicate – is the description it had in the deliberation by which one shaped the proposal to act thus. Aquinas’ way of saying this is: acts are specified by – have their specific character from – their objects, where “objects” has the focal meaning of proximate end as envisaged by the deliberating and acting person. Of course, the behavior involved in that act can be given other descriptions in the light of conventions of description, or expectations and responsibilities, and so forth, and one or other these descriptions may be given priority by law, custom, or some other special interest or perspective. But it is primarily on acts qua intended, or on the acts (e.g. of taking care) that one ought to have intended, that ethical standards (moral principles and precepts) bear. To repeat: in the preceding sentence “intended” is used in the broad sense; Aquinas sometimes employs it this way (e.g. ST II-II q. 64 a. 7), though in his official synthesis the word is used in the narrower sense to signify the (further) intention with which the act’s object was chosen – object being the most proximate of one’s (broad sense) intentions.

This understanding of human action has often been misappropriated by interpreters who have assumed that when Aquinas says that acts are wrongful by reason of their “undue matter” (indebita materia), he refers to an item of behavior specifiable by its physical characteristics and causal structure. So, for example, direct killing of the innocent is taken to refer to behavior whose causally immediate effect is killing, or which has its lethal effect before it has its intended good effect. But this is incompatible with Aquinas’ fundamental and consistent positions about human action. The “matter” of a morally significant act is, for him, its immediate object under the description it has in one’s deliberation: Mal. q. 7 a. 1; q. 2 a. 4 ad 5; a. 6; a. 7 ad 8. It is, in other words, not an item of behavior considered in its observable physicality as such, but rather one’s behavior as one’s objective (or the most proximate of one’s objectives), that is, as one envisages it, adopts it by choice, and causes it by one’s effort to do so. The most objective account of human action is provided by the account that is most subjective. This sound account will, however, set aside any distorted act-descriptions that one may offer others, or even oneself, as rationalizations and exculpations of one’s choice and act, but that do not correspond to what really made the option attractive, as end or as means, and so was treated, in one’s actual course of deliberation, as one’s reason for acting as one did. The immediately and foreseen lethal effect of an act of self-defense may genuinely be a side-effect of one’s choosing to stop the attack by the only available efficacious means (ST II-II q. 64 a. 7), or it may be one’s precise object (and the “matter” of one’s choice and act) because one’s (further) intent was to take lethal revenge on an old enemy, or to deter potential assailants by the prospect of their death, or to win a reward. Behaviorally identical items of behavior may thus be very different human acts, discernible only by knowing the acting person’s reasons for acting.

2.2 Context: the open horizon of human life as a whole

Ethical standards, for which practical reason’s first principles provide the foundations or sources, concern actions as choosable and self-determining. They are thus to be distinguished clearly, as Aristotle already emphasized, from standards which are practical, rational, and normative in a different way, namely the technical or technological standards internal to every art, craft, or other system for mastering matter. Aquinas locates the significant and irreducible difference between ethics and all these forms of “art” in three features: (i) Moral thought, even when most unselfishly concerned with helping others through the good effects of physical effort and causality, is fundamentally concerned with the problem of bringing order into one’s own will, action, and character, rather than the problem of how to bring order into the world beyond one’s will. (ii) Correspondingly, the effects of morally significant free choices (good or evil) are in the first instance intransitive (i.e., effects on the will and character of the acting person). Only secondarily are they transitive effects on the world, even when that person’s intentions are focused, as they normally should be, on the benefits of those external effects. (iii) Whereas every art and technique has a more or less limited objective (end) which can be accomplished by skillful deployment of the art, moral thought has in view an unlimited and common (shared) horizon or point, that of “human life as a whole [finis communis totius humanae vitae]” (ST I-II q. 21 a. 2 ad 2), for each of one’s morally significant choices (for good or evil) is a choice to devote a part of one’s single life to a purpose which could have been any of the whole open-ended range of purposes open to human pursuit for the sake of benefiting all or any human being(s).

2.3 At the origin of Ought

Practical reason, in Aquinas’ view, has both one absolutely first principle and many truly first principles: ST I-II q. 94 a. 2. The absolutely first principle is formal and in a sense contentless. Like the logical principle of non-contradiction which controls all rational thought, it expresses, one might say, the pressure of reason and is so far from being empty of significance and force that its form may be regarded as the frame, and its normativity the source, for all the normativity of the substantive first principles and of the moral principles which are inferable from them. Aquinas articulates it as “Good is to be done and pursued, and bad avoided” (ibid.).

This has often been truncated to (i) “Good is to be done, and evil avoided” or even, more drastically, (iia) “Do good and avoid evil” or yet more drastically (iib) “Avoid evil and seek the good”. But Grisez 1963 gave reason to think these abbreviations both exegetically and philosophically unsound. The first practical principle is not a command or imperative as (ii) would have it, nor is it a moral principle as all these formulae suggest by omitting “to be pursued” (see 2.7 below). Both in grammar and in propositional content, the principle’s gerundive “is-to-be” is neither imperative nor predictive, but rationally directive – an ought – in the way that gets its fully developed and central sense and normativity in the more specified ought of moral standards.

Against a Kantian or neo-Kantian primacy or ultimacy of “structures of mind”, Aquinas would say that just as the pressure of reason articulated in the principle of non-contradiction has its source in the structure of reality – in the real opposition between being and not being – so the source of the equivalently first practical principle is the real desirability of intelligible goods, and the true undesirability of what is not good.

2.4 First principles of practical reason

If Plato and Aristotle fail to articulate substantive first principles of practical reason, and if Kant overlooks them in favor of the quasi-Humeian notions of motivation that dominate ethics during the Enlightenment (and ever since), the articulation of such principles by Aquinas deserves attention.

2.4.1 First principles are insights into the data of experience and understood possibility

Each of the several substantive first principles of practical reason picks out and directs one towards a distinct intelligible good which, in line with the primariness of the principle identifying it, can be called “basic” (not a term used by Aquinas). Aquinas regards each of the first practical principles as self-evident (per se notum: known through itself) and undeduced (primum and indemonstrabile). He does not, however, mean that they are data-less “intuitions”; even the indemonstrable first principles in any field of human knowledge are knowable only by insight (intellectus) into data of experience (here, of causality and inclination).

Moreover, when describing the first practical principles as self-evident, Aquinas emphasises that self-evidence is relative: what is not obvious to some will be self-evident to those who have more ample experience and a better understanding of other aspects of the matter. And we should expect our understanding of first principles to grow as we come to understand more about the objects to which they refer and direct (e.g. knowledge, human life, marriage, etc.).

2.4.2 Their Oughts are not inferred from any Is

Aquinas’s repeated affirmation that practical reason’s first principles are undeduced refutes the common accusation or assumption that his ethics invalidly attempts to deduce or infer ought from is, for his affirmation entails that the sources of all relevant oughts cannot be deduced from any is. There remain, however, a number of contemporary Thomists who deny that such a deduction or inference need be fallacious, and regard Aquinas as postulating some such deduction or inference. They are challenged., however, by others (such as Rhonheimer, Boyle, and Finnis) who, while sharing the view that his ethics is in these respects fundamentally sound, deny that Aquinas attempted or postulated any such deduction or inference, and ask for some demonstration (i) that he did and (ii) that he or anyone else could make such a deduction or inference.

These critics reinforce their denial by pointing out that in his prologue to his commentary on Aristotle’s Ethics, Aquinas teaches that knowledge of things that are what they are independently of our thought (i.e. of nature) is fundamentally distinct both from logic and from practical knowledge, one of whose two species is philosophia moralis (whose first principles or fundamental oughts are under discussion here)

2.4.3 A sample first principle: Knowledge is pursuit-worthy

Aquinas neglects to spell out how these first principles come to be understood. But he holds that they are understood and accepted by everyone who has enough experience to understand their terms. The process of coming to understand a first practical principle may be exemplified as follows, in relation to the basic good of knowledge. As a child one experiences the inclination to ask questions, and to greet apparently satisfactory answers with satisfaction and failure to answer as a disappointment. At some point one comes to understand – has the insight – that such answers are instances of a quite general standing possibility, namely knowledge, coming to know and overcoming ignorance. By a distinct though often well nigh simultaneous further insight one comes to understand that this – knowledge – is not merely a possibility but also a good [bonum], that is to say an opportunity, a benefit, something desirable as a kind of improvement (a perfectio) of one’s or anyone’s condition, and as to be pursued.

2.5 The other basic goods

The basic human goods which first practical principles identify and direct us to are identified by Aquinas as (i) life, (ii) “marriage between man and woman and bringing up of children [coniunctio maris et feminae et educatio liberorum]” (not at all reducible to “procreation”), (iii) knowledge, (iv) living in fellowship (societas and amicitia) with others, (v) practical reasonableness (bonum rationis) itself, and (vi) knowing and relating appropriately to the transcendent cause of all being, value, normativity and efficacious action (ST I-II q. 94 aa. 2 & 3). His lists are always explicitly open-ended. They sketch the outlines and elements of the flourishing of the human persons in whom they can be actualized. Even complete fulfillment – the beatitudo perfecta that Aquinas places firmly outside our natural capacities and this mortal life – could not be regarded as a further good, but rather as a synthesis and heightened actualization of these basic goods in the manner appropriate to a form of life free from both immaturity (and other incidents of procreation) and decay.

Similarly, as is entailed by the epistemological principle that nature is known by capacities, capacities by acts, and acts by their objects (see 1.1(v) above), these basic goods, being the basic objects of will and free action, are the outline of human nature. The is of an adequate account of human nature is dependent upon prior grasp of the oughts of practical reason’s first, good-identifying principles, even though that prior grasp was made possible by that partial understanding of human nature which comes with an understanding of certain lines of causality and possibility. But defending the epistemological priority of the intelligible objects of will in explanations of practical reason does not entail (contrast McInerny 1992) any denial of the metaphysical priority of the naturally given facts about the human makeup.

2.6 Known by (or from) inclination?

Many modern accounts of Aquinas’ theory of natural law give explanatory primacy to the naturalness of the inclinations (to live, to know, etc.) that correspond to these basic goods. But others regard this as a fundamental misunderstanding of Aquinas’ conception of will, and of the epistemological relationship between nature and reason. Will is for him intelligent response to intelligible good: one’s will is “in” one’s reason [voluntas in ratione]. He makes it very explicit both that human actions are rightly said to be natural (in the morally relevant sense of “natural”) when and because they are intelligent and reasonable (ST I-II q. 71 a. 2), and that there are inclinations which are natural, in the sense that they are commonly found or characterize some or even most individuals, yet are unnatural because lacking any intelligibly good object. So explanatory priority must be accorded to the basic human goods themselves, and to the self-evident desirability which makes each of them the object of an inclination in the will of anyone sufficiently intelligent and mature to understand their goodness (that is, the way they make human beings more fulfilled, more “perfect” [complete]). An inclination of that kind is relevant in practical reason because its object is desirable, and desirable because it would contribute to anyone’s flourishing. To say this is not to say that our natural inclinations to what contributes to our flourishing are mere accident or happenstance.

2.7 Only incipiently moral

Many nineteenth- and early twentieth century accounts of Aquinas took it that the first principles of practical reason, which he regularly calls first principles of natural law or natural right, are moral principles picking out kinds of human act as to be done (e.g. alms-giving to the poor) or not done (e.g. murder, adultery), in the manner of the Commandments. But though there are a few passages in which Aquinas himself speaks in that way, they can be read down so as to make them consistent with the more strategic passages in which he speaks of such moral principles or norms as “derived” conclusions from first principles. (See also 3.3 below.) Even immoral people so blinded by culture or disposition that they do not make these inferences nevertheless can and normally do understand the first principles of practical reason and are guided by them, though imperfectly, in their deliberations.

Against Kant’s assumption that, since the ends toward which one wishes to act are subjective because projected, and established in one’s deliberating and willingness (as Hume proposed), by one’s subrational desires, practical reason’s function is to limit and channel one’s pursuit of those ends, Aquinas considers that practical reason’s first and fundamental operation is not limiting, confining or negative but rather facilitating and positive: finding and constructing intelligible ends to be pursued (prosequenda), ends that give intelligent point to our behavior.

The thesis that the first practical principles are only incipiently moral should not be confused with the widespread modern opinion that practical reason’s default position is self-interest or “prudential” reason, so that there is a puzzle about how one transits from this to morality. In Aquinas’ classical view, one’s reason (as distinct from some of one’s customary ways of thinking) naturally understands the primary or basic goods as good for anyone, and further understands that it is good to participate in the many forms of friendship which require that one set aside all merely emotionally motivated self-preference.

3. Moral principles

The discerning, inferring and elaborating of moral principles is a task for practical reasonableness. The judgments one makes in doing this are together called one’s conscience, in a sense prior to the sense in which conscience is the judgments one passes or could pass on one’s own acts considered retrospectively. Someone whose conscience is sound has in place the basic elements of sound judgment and practical reasonableness, that is of the intellectual and moral virtue which Aquinas calls prudentia. Full prudentia requires that one put one’s sound judgment into effect all the way down, i.e. into the particulars of choice and action in the face of temptations to unreasonable but perhaps not unintelligent alternatives.

3.1 Conscience

Conscience in Aquinas’ view is not a special power or presence within us, but is our practical intelligence at work, primarily in the form of a stock of judgments about the reasonableness (rightness) or unreasonableness (wrongness) of kinds of action (kinds of option). Since each such judgment is of the form “[It is true that] action of the kind phi is always [or generally] wrong [or: is generally to be done, etc.]” or “phi is [always] [or: generally] required [or forbidden] by reason”, it must be the case – as Aquinas stresses very forcefully – that one’s conscience is binding upon oneself even when it is utterly mistaken and directs or licenses awful misdeeds. For since it is logically impossible that one could be aware that one’s present judgment of conscience is mistaken, setting oneself against one’s own firm judgment of conscience is setting oneself against the goods of truth and reasonableness, and that cannot fail to be wrong: ST I-II q. 19 a. 5; Ver. q. 17 a. 4. The fact that, if one has formed one’s judgment corruptly, one will also be acting wrongly if one follows it (ST I-II q. 19 a. 6) does not affect the obligatoriness (for oneself) of one’s conscience. This teaching about conscience was rather novel in his day and to this day is often misrepresented or misapplied as a kind of relativism or subjectivism. But it is actually an implication of Aquinas’ clarity about the implications of regarding moral judgments as true (or false) and of thus rejecting subjectivism and relativism.

3.2 The supreme moral principle

Aquinas is regrettably inexplicit about how the first practical principles yield moral principles, precepts or rules that have the combined generality and specificity of the precepts found in the portion of the biblical Decalogue (Exod. 20.1–17; Deut. 5.6–21) traditionally called moral (the last seven precepts, e.g. parents should be reverenced, murder is wrong, adultery is wrong, etc.). But a reconstruction of his scattered statements makes it clear enough that in his view a first implication of the array of first principles, each directing us to goods actualisable as much in others as in oneself, is this: that one should love one’s neighbor as oneself.

Since he considers this principle, like the set of first principles mentioned in I-II q. 94 a. 2, to be self-evident (per se notum), he must regard the principle of love-of-neighbor-as-self not so much as an inference from, or even specification of, but rather a redescriptive summary of that set. This in turn suggests the further reflection that the first principles, and the goods (bona) to which they direct us, are transparent, so to speak, for the flesh-and-blood persons in whom they are and can be instantiated. Moreover, it may be thought that the primary moral principle of love of neighbor as oneself is another reason to doubt (despite appearances) the strategic role of eudemonism in his ethics. Aristotelianising interpretations of Aquinas’ ethics normally make central the notion of fulfillment, understood (it seems) as the fulfillment of the deliberating and acting person – to which the requirement of neighbor love does not have a perspicuous relationship. Grisez and others, on the other hand, take it that the role of fulfillment (eudaimonia, beatitudo) in ethical thought’s unfolding from the first principles of practical reason is best captured by a “master moral principle” close though perhaps not identical to Aquinas’s supreme moral principle: that all one’s acts of will be open to integral human fulfillment, that is to the fulfillment of all human persons and communities now and in future.

The supreme moral principle of love of neighbor as self has, Aquinas thinks, an immediately proximate specification in the Golden Rule: Others are to be treated by me as I would wish them to treat me. The tight relation between the love principle and the Golden Rule suggests that love and justice, though analytically distinguishable, certainly cannot be contrasted as other and other. “Neighbor” excludes no human being anywhere, insofar as anyone could be benefited by one’s choices and actions. To love someone is essentially to will that person’s good. The reasonable priorities among all these persons as objects of one’s love, goodwill and care are discussed by Aquinas both as an “order of love(s)” [ordo amoris] and as a matter of right and justice.

3.2.1 The fuller version: the place of the transcendent

Since Aquinas thinks that the existence and providence of God, as the transcendent source of all persons and benefits, is certain, his usual statement of the master moral principle affirms that one should love God and one’s-neighbor-as-oneself. But since he accepts that the existence of God is not self-evident, he can allow that the more strictly self-evident form of the master moral principle refers only to love of human persons (self and neighbors). He would add that, once the existence and nature of God is accepted, as it philosophically should be, the rational requirement of loving God, and thus the fuller version of the master moral principle, is self-evident. He also holds that one does not offend against this requirement of loving God except by making choices contrary to human good, that is, to love of self or neighbor: ScG III c. 122 n. 2.

3.3 Moral precepts are further specifications of this master principle and its immediate specifications

All moral principles and norms, Aquinas thinks, can be inferred – as either implicit in, or “referable to” as conclusions from – the moral first principle of love of neighbor as self: ST I-II q. 99 a. 1 ad 2 with q. 91 a. 4c and q. 100 a. 2 ad 2; q. 100 aa. 3 and 11c. But he never displays an example or schema of these deduction-like inferences. Consequently, as noted in 2.7 above, his would-be successors have sometimes proposed that moral principles and norms have the self-evidence of first principles, and sometimes, equally desperately, have offered premises which, though suggested by some of Aquinas’s argumentation or remarks, are incoherent with his general theory – e.g. that natural functions are not to be frustrated.

The main lines of Aquinas’ theory of moral principles strongly suggest that moral norms (precepts, standards) are specifications of “Good is to be done and pursued, and evil avoided”, specifications which so direct choice and action that each of the primary goods (elements of human fulfillment) will be respected and promoted to the extent required by the good of practical reasonableness (bonum rationis). And what practical reasonableness requires seems to be that each of the basic human goods be treated as what it truly is: a basic reason for action amongst other basic reasons whose integral directiveness is not to be cut down or deflected by subrational passions. The principle of love of neighbor as self and the Golden Rule immediately pick out one element in that integral directiveness. The other framework moral rules give moral direction by stating ways in which more or less specific types of choice are immediately or mediately contrary to some basic good. This appears to be Aquinas’s implicit method, as illustrated below (3.4).

An adequate exposition and defence of the moral norms upheld by Aquinas requires a critique, only hints for which can be found in his work, of theories which claim that choice can and should rationally be guided by a utilitarian, consequentialist or proportionalist master principle calling for maximizing of overall net good (or, some say, incompatibly, for minimizing net evils). In developments of Aquinas’s moral theory such as are proposed by Grisez and Finnis, that critique is treated as an indispensable preliminary to any reflective non-question-begging identification of the route from first principles to specific moral norms.

3.4 Some examples

The three examples or sets of examples considered in this section are only examples of the kinds of moral norms (praecepta) which Aquinas considers are excluded by any sound conscience from one’s deliberations about what to choose. Other examples are more complex, such as theft and various other wrongful deprivations of property, and the form of charging for loans which is named usury and judged by Aquinas (not implausibly, though with little direct applicability to developed financial markets: see Finnis 1998, 204–210) to be always contrary to just equality. Aquinas also treats in some detail scores, indeed hundreds of other moral issues, touching the life of judges, advocates, merchants, the rich, the poor, or everyone.

3.4.1 Homicide

Some types of act are intrinsically and immediately contrary to the basic human good of life, that is to a human being’s very being. Every act which is intended, whether as end or as means, to kill an innocent human being, and every act done by a private person which is intended to kill any human being, is to be excluded from deliberation as wrongful because contrary to love of neighbor as self (or self as neighbor). Public persons, Aquinas thinks, can rightfully intend to kill in carrying out needful acts of war, suppression of serious wrongdoing, and punishment (see also 6.3 below).

As a private person one may rightfully use force in defense of oneself or others even if the force is such that one foresees it is likely or even certain to kill; but one’s intention in using such lethal force must not be to kill, but only to disable and block the attack (and less lethal force would not have met the need for defensive blocking of the assault). Aquinas’ discussion of this (ST II-II q. 64 a.7) is the locus classicus for what later became known, unhappily, as the “principle” of double effect, whose real core is the thought that moral principles bear differently on kinds of action specified by intention (e.g. to kill) from the way they bear on behavior chosen with foresight that it will (probably or even certainly) kill as a side-effect (praeter intentionem – outside the acting person’s intention).

Aquinas wavers between suggesting that the use of lethal public force, e.g. in capital punishment, intends (“is referred to”) justice rather than killing, and plainly accepting that in such cases death is indeed intended. The latter is his dominant position; his arguments to justify a kind of choice which, whatever its beneficial consequences, is so immediately against the good of life have come increasingly to seem insufficient: the Catechism of the Catholic Church (1993), paras. 2263–67 expounds its whole teaching on war, lethal police action, and capital punishment on the basis of the thought that these can be justified only so far as they amount to causing death as a side-effect, and not as killing with intent to kill. The thought is formulated by appeal to Aquinas’ reference to acts with “double effect” in his discussion of private defence in ST II-II q. 64 a. 7.

3.4.2 Adultery and other kinds of act contrary to the good of marriage

Marriage is, Aquinas says, a primary human good and, philosophically considered, it has a dual point (end, finis): (i) the procreation and bringing up of children is a manner suited to their good, and (ii) fides, which goes far beyond the literal translation “faithfulness” and includes not only exclusivity and permanence but also the positive readiness and commitment to being united with one’s spouse in mind, body and a mutually assisting domestic life. Aquinas neither subordinates one of these two “ends” to the other, nor regards it as appropriate to choose to divide them. Fides is a good and sufficient reason for engaging in the usus matrimonii, the kind of sexual act that is intended to enable both husband and wife to experience and in a particular way actualize and express the good of their marriage, so that the act’s giving and receiving of delight is token of their commitment.

Consequently the kind of wrongful sexual choice most often considered by Aquinas is engaging in intercourse with one’s spouse without fides, because one either (i) is thinking of one’s spouse in the way one would think of a prostitute, or (significantly worse) (ii) would be willing to have sex with somebody else if some other attractive person were to be available. Such depersonalized sex acts are instances of willing against the good of marriage (contra bonum matrimonii). This reiterated analysis should be regarded as the key to Aquinas’ sex ethics. Another paradigmatic kind of instance, in itself much more serious, is a married person’s choice to have intercourse with some third party (perhaps with the other spouse’s consent). These and all other wrongful kinds of sex act have their wrongfulness, according to Aquinas, not because they are unnatural in some biological or sociological sense of “unnatural”, but because they are against reason’s directive to respect, if not also pursue, the good of marriage, a respect that calls for reserving to marriage (and within marriage to truly marital intercourse) all uses of one’s capacity to engage in the intentional pursuit of sexual satisfaction. For unless one regards such reservation as required, one’s stance about human sex acts is contra bonum matrimonii and unreasonable because one cannot coherently maintain that the intercourse of the married enables them to actualize and experience their fides and their marriage, a thought essential to the flourishing (bonum) of marriage and thus of children and thus of the wider community as a whole. One measure of the gravity of morally bad sex acts is applicable to some kinds but not others: injustice (as in rape or seduction of the vulnerable). Another measure, applicable to all such acts, is the extent of the deviance (“distance”) between acts of that kind and truly marital acts.

As in ours, many in Aquinas’ milieu found it difficult to understand how mutually agreeable sex could be a serious moral issue, or indeed a moral issue at all. Aquinas noted this, but was clear that every kind of conduct that acts out and thus confirms and reinforces a disposition of will contra bonum matrimonii is seriously wrong because so many aspects of individual and social flourishing profoundly depend upon the health of the institution of marriage, as it exists in the real lives of adults and children. It is worth repeating, since the point is so often misunderstood and misreported, that Aquinas’ moral arguments for distinguishing good from bad sex never run from “natural” to “therefore good/reasonable/right”, but always from “good/reasonable/right” to therefore “natural” (and similarly, of course, for unreasonable and unnatural): see II-II q. 153 a. 2c, a. 3c, q. 154 a. 1c, a. 2 ad 2, a. 11.

3.4.3 Lying

Aquinas’ thesis is that lying, properly defined, is always to be excluded as to some extent wrong. The thesis is often misunderstood as being premised on the thought that lying is contrary to the natural function of tongue or speech, a thought that has often been transposed into an effort to explain his theses about the wrong kinds of sex act. But, as has been seen, his sex ethics has another and more plausible basis, and so, it seems (albeit less clearly), has his ethics of lying. Though all his treatments include something like “words are naturally signs of what one understand” (ST II-II q. 110 a. 3) or “speech was invented for expressing the conceptions in one’s heart” (Sent. III d. 38 a. 3c), this statement is pointing to a more explanatory and prior premise, discernible though never adequately articulated so as to show its relation to basic human goods. This prior premise turns on his definition of lying as one’s assertion of what one believes to be false. Whenever one asserts, one affirms as true two propositions: explicitly the proposition one articulates as true despite one’s belief that it is not, and implicitly the proposition that one believes what one is assertively articulating. So Aquinas seems to locate the essential wrongfulness of lying in this intentional dissonance between the self presented or reported and one’s real self: a duplicitas. It is often reasonable and even morally necessary to hide one’s beliefs, and this, not “deception”, is what Aquinas means by the “prudent dissimulatio” he thinks justifiable in appropriate contexts. But one should not do so by the spurious self-projection entailed by asserting what one believes false. Pretended flight as a device for luring an unjust enemy into an ambush can be right in a just war, but lying to the enemy is wrong, although its gravity is much diminished by the duty not to reveal the truth to the enemy, a duty compatible with the coexisting duty not to lie. Subsequent scholars in his tradition have wondered whether the conditions of discourse with an unjust opponent do not, at least in many circumstances, defeat the presumption that a grammatically indicative statement asserts what it is put forward to seem to assert.

3.4.4 Exceptionless negative norms: more urgent though not all or always more important

Negative norms such as the three sets of norms just discussed are more urgent and direct as implications of love of self and neighbor, but are not necessarily more important in other dimensions of importance. That is to say, they are applicable and to be followed semper et ad semper, always and in all circumstances, whereas the applicability of affirmative norms (requiring one to act in a specified kind of way) is semper sed non ad semper: always applicable subject to there being (as is not always the case) suitable circumstances. Kinds of conduct that are contrary to a negative moral norm of this type are “intrinsically wrongful” (intrinsece mala).

Only negative norms can be exceptionless (and not all negative moral norms are). If affirmative norms could be exceptionless, there would be inescapable conflicts of obligation, but since morality is simply (the set of standards of) full reasonableness, there can be no conflict of duties each truly and inescapably obligatory in one and the same situation: one cannot truly be perplexus simpliciter – that is, in a dilemma such that, through no fault of one’s own, any choice one makes will be immoral. (It is, however, possible that my prior wrongful choices or my culpable negligence in forming my conscience put me into a situation such that I have applicable and irreconcilable duties and will be in breach of one or more of them whatever I choose or do or omit: I am then perplexus secundum quid, that is, in a dilemma but of a qualified, derivative kind, only in a weak sense unavoidable.)

4. Virtues

A virtue is an aspect of, or constitutive element in, being a person of good character. To have the virtues is to have a stable and ready willingness to make choices that are morally good because in line with the bonum rationis, the basic good of practical reasonableness.

4.1 Specified by principles identifying the reasonable “mean”

The virtues, like everything else in one’s will, are a response to reasons. But practical reasons (i.e. reasons for action) are propositional: they can be stated as principles and other standards, more or less specific. So principles, ultimately the first principles of practical reason (that is, of natural law), are more fundamental to ethics than virtues are. Aquinas accepts Aristotle’s notion that every virtue is a mean between too much and too little, and he constantly stresses that it is reason – with the principles and rules (regulae) it understands – that settles the mean and thus determines what is too much or too little. Indeed, the principles of practical reason (natural law) establish the ends of the virtues: ST II-II q. 47 a. 6. And the master virtue of bringing practical reasonableness into all one’s deliberations, choices, and carrying out of choices – the virtue of prudentia, a virtue both intellectual (of one’s intelligence) and moral (of one’s whole will and character) – is part of the definition, content, and influence of every other moral virtue: ST I-II q. 65 a. 1, q. 66 a. 3 ad 3, etc.

Aquinas arranged the Summa Theologiae’s exposition of morality within a classification, not of the goods to which rational acts are directed, nor of types of act, nor of practical reason’s standards, but of the virtues. Explicable as a reflective theological project of depicting the flourishing or deviations of human beings in an account of the whole movement of creature from their origin to their fulfillment, his decision to adopt this superstructure has tended to obscure the real foundations of his ethics. As one would expect from the considerations sketched in the preceding paragraph, his actual arguments about what is right and wrong, virtuous or vicious, get their premises not from analysis of the virtues at stake but rather from the principles and more specific standards, norms, precepts or rules of practical reason(ableness). It is the conclusions of these arguments that are then re-expressed in terms of what is contrary to or in line with one or more of the virtues.

4.2 Virtue can also be a source, rather than conclusion, of moral judgment

One’s affirmative responsibilities are all conditioned by circumstances, and mostly are (conditional) implications of the Golden Rule of doing to or for others what you would wish them to do to or for you. For both these reasons, one cannot make sound judgments about what one should be doing – that is, about what is the “mean” of reasonableness – unless one’s wishes are those of a person who understands the opportunities and the circumstances well, and whose concerns and intentions are those of someone whose reasonableness is not corrupted or deflected either by sub-rational desires and aversions or by deformations of will such as pride or presumption. Such a person has the virtues, intellectual and moral, and virtue is thus, and in these respects, required for sound moral judgment. Sometimes the mean of reason, properly assessed by someone of true virtue, calls for heroic virtue (say, immense courage) far beyond conventional measures or expectations of reasonableness, moderation, and the like.

4.2.1 The interdependence of the virtues

Aquinas firmly holds the Platonic-Aristotelian theses (i) of the connexio virtutum: that to have any of the virtues in its full and proper form one must have all of them, and (ii) of the governing and shaping role of (the good of) practical reasonableness (bonum rationis), that is, of the intellectual and moral virtue of prudentia. For some indication why, see 4.4 below..

4.3 Virtue’s priority not reducible to self-fulfillment

Just as some take Aquinas to hold that concern for one’s own happiness is the source of one’s moral motivation and judgment, so some take him to hold that the point of being virtuous is being virtuous. But a sounder reading may understand him to hold that attaining beatitudo and virtus are more like built-in beneficial side-effects of openness to the beatitudo of everyone – that is, of love of neighbor as oneself, according to a reasonable order of priorities. What virtue (the state of character) is praised for, he says, is its actualizing the good of reason(ableness), and reason is good because it enables one to discern things for what they truly are – and so, in the practical domain, to discern real benefits (bona, opportunities) and direct one’s choices and actions to bringing them about in the real people for whom one thereby makes effective one’s love and respect.

4.4 The cardinal virtues

Aquinas accepts the Platonic-Aristotelian thesis that there are four virtues which are cardinal, that is on which the moral life and all other virtues hinge or depend: prudentia, justice, courage, and temperantia. Each is a strategic element in one’s integrating of the good of practical reasonableness into one’s deliberations, choices and execution of choices (prudentia), in one’s dealings with others justice), and in integrating and governing one’s desires by genuine reasons (temperantia) and enabling one to face down intimidating obstacles (courage, fortitudo).

4.4.1 Prudentia and love

Practical reasonableness involves not only (i) an intelligent and rationally integrated understanding of practical reason’s principles and of the implications that, under the auspices of the master principle of love of neighbor as self, they have in the form of moral standards, but also (ii) the personal self-governance needed to put those conscientious judgments into effect by choices and corresponding action. So prudentia has many phases or, as Aquinas says, parts, and enters into every other virtue. It is far removed from “prudence” in the sense of “rational self-interest”, for by prudentia one is actively aware that self-interest is self-stunting or indeed self-destructive unless one transcends it by one’s dispositions and acts of justice and friendship or love. (And see 2.7 above.)

Although Aquinas subscribes to Aristotle’s thesis that practical reasonableness (phronesis, prudentia) concerns means rather than ends, he eliminates any quasi-Humeian reading of that thesis by emphasizing that what “moves” prudentia is not one’s passions but one’s underivative understanding of the first practical principles and of the intelligible goods to which they point (synderesis movet prudentiam: ST II-II q. 47 a. 6 ad 3). Moreover, since he holds that virtually all means are also ends, the Aristotelian thesis in no way inhibits him from holding that prudentia is what guides one in identifying moral standards and the “mean” of every virtue: prudentia “directs the moral virtues not only in choosing means but also in establishing ends”: I-II q. 66 a. 3 ad 3.

4.4.2 Justice

Justice is the steady and lasting willingness to give to others what they are entitled to (their right: jus [or ius] suum). Aquinas works with this Roman Law definition (ST II-II q. 58 a. 1c), and with Aristotle’s division of justice into (i) distributive (good judgment about how to divide up and parcel out beneficial or burdensome wholes or sets in a way that is fair because guided by appropriate criteria) and (ii) what Aquinas calls commutative justice (good judgment going far wider than Aristotle’s “corrective” justice, and concerned with all other kinds of dealings between persons). His prioritizing of the concept of right (jus), conceived as something that belongs to another, brings him to the brink of articulating a concept of human rights, a concept certainly implicit in his thesis that there are precepts of justice each imposing, on me and my communities, a duty to everyone without discrimination (indifferenter omnibus debitum: ST II-II q. 122 a. 6). For his definition of justice immediately entails that correlative to such duties of justice there must be rights that belong to everyone indifferenter. Many duties of justice are positive (affirmative duties to give, do, etc.), and Aquinas treats the duties of relieving poverty both under justice and under love (of neighbor, for God’s sake). The duties in either case are essentially the same, and Aquinas’ understanding of them strongly affects his understanding of justified private property rights, which are valid because needed for prosperity and development, but are subject to a duty to distribute, directly or indirectly, one’s superflua – that is, everything beyond what one needs to keep oneself and one’s family in the state of life appropriate to one’s (and their) vocation(s). For the natural resources of the world are “by nature” common; that is, reason’s principles do not identify anyone as having a prior claim to them other than under some customary or other socially posited scheme for division and appropriation of such resources, and such schemes could not be morally authoritative unless they acknowledged some such duty to distribute one’s superflua.

4.4.3 Fortitudo and temperantia

Though one’s passions, that is one’s emotional desires and aversions, support one’s reason in deliberation, choice and action, they are also always capable of deflecting one from reasonable and right choice. So the ready disposition to keep these passions in their proper role is an essential element of a virtuous character and life. By temperantia one integrates one’s desires, particularly but not only for sexual pleasure, with reason, lest reason be enslaved by passion and become its ingenious servant, as it readily can. Temperantia is the mean, for example, between lust and frigidity or apathy (Aquinas everywhere rejecting any “Stoic” ideal of passionlessness, and holding that there is good as well as bad concupiscentia).

By fortitudo one keeps one’s aversions, particularly but not only fear, in check lest one shirk one’s moral responsibilities in situations of danger or other adversity. It is the mean between recklessness or over-boldness and cowardice or defeatism.

4.5 “Virtue ethics”

In recent decades various philosophers and theologians have proposed that ethics done well is virtue ethics, not an ethics of rules and principles. An ethics of the latter kind is denounced as legalistic. As should be clear from the foregoing, Aquinas rejects the proposed contrast and gives systematic prominence both to standards, such as principles and rules, and to virtues. He holds, in effect, that they are interdefined. Nor does he have any time for the view that there are no exceptionless moral norms and that moral norms or other standards are no more than a kind of anticipation, shadow or approximation of the judgments which in each situation need to be made by a person of virtue, and which could never exclude in advance any kind of act as always wrongful by reason of its object and regardless of its further intentions or the circumstances of the situation. On the contrary, he holds that no human act is morally good (right, in the sense of not wrong) unless it is in line with love of self and neighbor (and thus with respect for the basic aspects of the wellbeing of each and all human beings) not only (i) in the motives or intentions with which it is chosen, and (ii) in the appropriateness of the circumstances, but also (iii) in its object (more precisely the object, or closest-in intention of the choosing person) (see 2.1.1 above). This is the primary sense of the axiom he frequently articulates by quoting an old tag: bonum ex integra causa, malum ex quocumque defectu (good from an unflawed set of contributing factors, bad from any defect in the set). That is, there is a fundamental asymmetry between moral good and moral evil – a notion very foreign to any version of utilitarian or post-utilitarian consequentialist or “proportionalist” ethics.

5. Political community

Love of neighbor as oneself requires one to live in political community with others. For the wellbeing and right(s) of all or almost all of us are dependent upon there being in place institutions of government and law of the relatively comprehensive kind we call “political” and “state”.

5.1 Common good

“Common good” is very often a safer translation of bonum commune than “the common good”. For there is the common good of a team, but equally the common good of a university class, of a university, of a family, of a neighborhood, of a city, of a state, of a church and of human kind throughout the world. The difference in each case between the group’s common good and an aggregate of the wellbeing of each of its members can be understood by considering how, in a real friendship, A wills B’s wellbeing for B’s sake, while B wills A’s wellbeing for A’s sake, and each therefore has reason to will his or her own wellbeing for the other’s sake, with the result that neither envisages his or her own wellbeing as the source (the object) of the friendship’s value, and each has in view a truly common good, not reducible to the good of either taken separately or merely summed. Inasmuch as there is possible and appropriate a kind of friendship between the members of each of the kinds of group listed (non-exhaustively) above, each such group has its own common good.

5.1.1 Groups

Communities such as those just mentioned are groups, each of them a whole [totum] made up of persons (and perhaps of other groups), their unity being not merely one of composition or conjunction or continuity, but rather of order, in two dimensions: (i) of the parts (members) as coordinating with each other, and (ii) of the group and its members to its organizing purpose or end (finis). Of these, (ii) is the more explanatory, as Aquinas argues at the very beginning of his commentary on Aristotle’s Ethics.

5.2 Political common good and political community relativized

Some of the above-listed kinds of group have, in Aquinas’ view, a significance that is in a sense strategic. In particular, the family-cum-household, the political group, and the church established to transmit divine revelation and salvation each have such significance. The benefits made possible by political community, with its state government and law, are such that its common good is both extensive and intensive in its reach and implications (e.g. the legitimacy of securing it by coercion). So on those occasions when “the common good” is the best translation of bonum commune, the referent will normally be the good of the political community in question (or of political communities generically), often called by Aquinas public good.

Nevertheless, Aquinas’s use of the Aristotelian axiom, “human beings are naturally political animals” almost always takes it as asserting our social, not solitary, nature – our need for interpersonal relationships both for friendship and for such necessities as food, clothing, speech, and so forth. So the axiom should not be made to mean that Aquinas thinks there is a distinct basic inclination towards, or a distinct basic good, of political community, to put alongside the distinct basic good of marriage and family. He accepts that we are naturally parts of a political community, but also that we are more naturally conjugal than political (in the narrow sense), and that political community does not properly have the ultimacy it has for Aristotle. For Aquinas, political communities have been irrevocably relativized by the appropriateness for (in principle) everyone of belonging to the Church which is, in its own way, as complete [perfecta] a kind of community as any state.

Moreover, Aristotle’s claim that the polis is “greater and more godlike” than any other human community is put by Aquinas into a horizon which contains not merely the one civitas (Latin for polis) of which I am a member but rather the whole plurality of peoples and civitates (states, political communities): Eth. VIII.4.11–12. So for him the common good that is the ultimate concern of political philosophy, and thus of the reasonable person, is nothing less than the fulfillment of all human persons and communities (and see 3.2 above).

Still, this wider perspective does not lead Aquinas to develop a theory of international community; this had to be developed by his sixteenth-century followers. Indeed, he takes remarkably little interest in a number of important issues related to the plurality of states and the dynamics of state-formation, and the appropriate relationship between a people [populus, gens, etc.] and a state (should each people presumptively have a state?). His political philosophy explores with subtlety and care the state [civitas, regnum, etc.], almost as if there were simply a single permanent political community.

6. The state a “complete community” with “mixed” and “limited” government

The state is a “complete community”, whose members, in the central case, are also members of another “complete community”, the Church. So this completeness is, in each case, relative and delimited. Correspondingly, the state’s governing structures (which Aquinas does not call “the state”) are – again in the central, morally proper case – limited in four distinct ways.

6.1 Four kinds of limitation on state government and law

(i) State governments and laws are subject to moral standards, especially but not only the principles and norms of justice. This does not mean that moral principles all apply to public authority in the way they do to private persons; they do not, yet there is no exemption of public authorities from the exceptionless moral norms against intentionally killing the innocent, lying, rape and other extra-marital sex, and so forth. Moreover, this limitation has no bearing on the distinct question which moral standards should, or can properly, be legally enforced by the state’s government and law (see (iii) below).

(ii) State governments are subject to laws governing election or other appointment to and tenure and rotation of office, and the jurisdiction of particular offices. Even supreme rulers not subject to the coercive authority of anyone else cannot dispense themselves from the obligation of their own laws unless that is for the common good and free from favoritism. If they defy these moral restrictions they show themselves to be tyrants, and may be resisted and deposed by the concerted (“public”) action of their people. The best form of government (or as we would now say, constitution) is one in which, “well mixed”, are found “monarchy”, “aristocracy” and “democracy”, that is, the rule of one person (whose “monarchy” is probably better elective rather than hereditary), governing in concert with a few high officials chosen for their excellence of character and aptitude, by an electorate comprising the many who are entitled both to vote and to stand for election: ST I-II q. 105 a. 1. Establishing and maintaining such an arrangement is a matter for laws which delimit the competences of all concerned.

(iii) State governments and laws have the authority and duty to promote and defend the common good, including the good of virtue. This responsibility brings with it the authority to use coercion for the suppression of crime and enemy attack. This coercive jurisdiction extends to defending persons and property both by force and by the credible threat of punishment for criminal or other unjust appropriation or damage. But it does not extend to enforcing any part of morality other than the requirements of justice insofar as they can be violated by acts external to the choosing and acting person’s will. Acts of virtues (or vices) other than such external acts of inter-personal (in)justice cannot rightly be prohibited unless they involve (in)justice. For, unlike divine law’s, “human law’s purpose is the temporal tranquility of the state, a purpose which the law attains by coercively prohibiting external acts to the extent that these evils can disturb the peaceful state of the state.” ST I-II q. 98 a. 1c; likewise q. 100 a. 2c: “human law does not put forward precepts about anything other than acts of justice [and injustice]”. State law’s justifiedly coercive domain is not private good as such, nor the whole of the community’s common good. Rather, it is those aspects of the political community’s common good that can be called public good, and that are affected by external acts directly or indirectly affecting other members of the community.

(iv) The morally significant authority of the state’s government and law is limited by the rights of the Church, though when that government and law are within their proper domain, one ought to comply with their directives rather than any purported act of administration or government (apart from general moral teaching) by Pope or bishops.

The last three kinds of limitation can be considered here in a little more detail.

6.2 Limited government’s forms: “political” and “regal”

Government is properly speaking “political” when the supreme person or body “has power which is limited [potestas coarctata or limitata] by certain laws of the state”: Pol. I.1.5. Such rulers govern in accordance with the laws concerning the establishment of their office, their appointment and their responsibilities. When power is, by contrast, “plenary”, the government is said to be “regal” in kind. But even regal government, in its proper forms, is the government of free and equal people who have in some sense (never made quite clear by Aquinas) the “right to resist [ius repugnandi]” the ruler(s). Even regal rulers are subject to the directive force of the laws, though there is no-one who has the legal authority to coerce them.

Aquinas sees no need for any “social contract” to explain or justify the origins of government or of any particular regime. But he does think that, even in regal as distinct from political rule, the enacted laws constitute “a kind of covenant [pactum] between king and people” (In Rom. 13.1 v. 6), and violation of this by the ruler can entail that subjects are released from their covenantal obligation.

In principle, Aquinas thinks, the supreme legislative powers are held either by the whole people [tota multitudo], a free people [libera multitudo], or by some public persona who has responsibility [cura] for them and represents them [gerit personam multitudinis: bears their persona]: I-II q. 97 a. 3 ad 3; II-II q. 57 a. 2. Neither the meaning of this “representation” nor the practicalities of designating a representative are explored in any depth by Aquinas. Nor does he discuss how it gets settled whether a particular people is (i) simply free and self-governing, or (ii) free but subject to the legislative authority of some princeps, or (iii) unfree (perhaps because conquered).

6.3 State authority is neither paternalistic nor divine

Though he never openly confronts them, Aquinas sets aside the sayings at the end of Aristotle’s Ethics which seem to mean that the polis has the responsibility and role of coercively leading all its citizens, of every age, towards all-round virtue. Aquinas plainly rejects the idea that the state is a surrogate for paternal authority, or has God’s authority over morally significant conduct. Though he frequently states that the political rulers have a proper concern to lead people to virtue, these statements turn out to refer to the appropriate aspirations of rulers, not to their coercive jurisdiction or authority. In the context of the surrounding argument, the statements do not commit him to any wider governmental or legal authority than to require and foster the public good and the virtue of justice, that is, the willingness to perform one’s duties to others: 6.1(iii) above. The other virtues can be legally required of citizens only so far as they impact on justice: ST I-II q. 96 a. 3. Moreover, he holds the classic position that doing justice does not require that one’s motivations and character be just. And when it comes to coercive measures, he holds that they can bear only upon conduct that is external and immediately or mediately affects other people unjustly or disturbs the peace of the political community: ST I-II q. 98 a. 1. Really private vices are outside the coercive jurisdiction of the state’s government and law. Though political authority is ultimately derived from divine authority, it is not to be exercised in the same all-encompassing way as God does when directing one (like every other human individual) to the complete and heavenly fulfillment gratuitously and supernaturally offered to us all by God. Absolute political authority of the kind later claimed by rulers such as James I of England is contrary to Aquinas’ constant teaching.

This reading of Aquinas as, in a nineteenth and twentieth century jargon, “a liberal” (or “the first Whig”) is often disputed, for there are statements in his writings which taken acontextually seem to assert the simpler and paternalistic Aristotelian position.

6.4 The state shares its authority with another “complete community”

One of the reasons why Aquinas’ political theory departs significantly from Aristotle’s is that Aquinas believes he has access to facts and considerations unavailable to Aristotle, namely to the public divine revelation completed in the works and sayings of Christ, founder of a spiritual community, the (Catholic = “universal”) Church. When political life is really well-ordered, therefore, each member (citizen) of a state will be also a member of this other “complete community” and subject to its laws as well as to the state’s. The function of this other community is to transmit the divine promise or offer of eternal life, and to help people help each other, through their own individual free choices, to become ready for that life. With the establishing of this community (in continuity and discontinuity with the older religious community of Israel), human associations are henceforth of two fundamentally distinct types: (i) temporal or secular, worldly, civil, or political, and (ii) spiritual. Correspondingly, responsibility for human affairs is divided between (i) secular societies, especially states and families, and (ii) the Church. The distinction between secular and spiritual tracks that between natural and revealed knowledge.

6.4.1 Non-dependence and non-subjection of secular authority

Accordingly, the Church’s leaders have no jurisdiction over secular matters, although they can declare that the choice of a member of the Church, albeit in a secular matter, is seriously immoral. A parent has no jurisdiction over a child’s free choices except in so far as they violate the moral rights of other members of the family or the parents’ responsibility for the child’s education and moral upbringing. State government and law have no right to direct the Church’s leaders, or its members in their religious affairs, except in so far as the state’s peace and justice would otherwise be violated. “In those matters which pertain to political good [bonum civile], secular rather than spiritual authority should be obeyed.” Sent. II d. 44 ex. ad 4.

Neither those who adhere to the old, incomplete revelation (Jews), nor those people and peoples who simply do not accept the truth of the full revelation, are subject to the authority of the Church. Nor is the legitimacy and authority of a government negated by the fact that its members (officials) are unbelievers.

Beyond this, Aquinas works within the constitutional assumptions of the Christendom of his era. His positions imply that if ecclesiastical authorities expel members from the Church for their misdeeds as rulers, the consequences under their particular state’s own constitutional arrangement could include the rulers’ deposition (loss of secular legal authority); but Aquinas blurs or elides this distinction of jurisdictions, and loosely says that the Church “has the authority of curbing secular rulers” (ST II-II q. 12 a. 2 ad 1).

6.4.2 Heresy, unbelief and religious freedom

Aquinas accepts the teaching of the Church of his era that no one can rightly be compelled to accept the Christian faith or membership of the Church, but that those who are members can and should be compelled by both ecclesiastical and state law to abstain from any public denial or renunciation of it. He treats such renunciation as an actionable breach of promise (passing silently over the fact that in most cases the promise was made not by the persons concerned but rather, in their early infancy, by their parents). And he regards public teaching of heresy as comparable to counterfeiting coin of the realm and therefore rightly punishable capitally by the secular authorities (the fact of false teaching having been ascertained by an ecclesiastical trial). His views about this matter are explicitly based on the evolving tradition of the Church and on what historical experience suggested were the effects of more permissive political or legal arrangements. So there are no theoretical obstacles to his ready acceptance of the judgment of later theologians and Church teachers that, as experience shows, it is more compatible with basic positions in his moral and political philosophy to hold that authentically personal judgment and freely chosen commitment are so important in relation to ultimate questions that all persons (even those whose beliefs about religion are false or ill-formed) have a moral right, and should have the corresponding legal right, to be free from state (and ecclesiastical) coercion in religious belief or action except in so far as their conduct would be contrary to the rights of others or to public peace or to public morality (that is, morality so far as it is publicly communicated or concerns actions which impact on the public) (Second Vatican Council, Declaration on Religious Liberty (1965)). Nor is it clear how he could resist the objection that, even if those baptized in infancy ratify the promises made on their behalf at baptism, the subscription of faith is not an undertaking to other people or the community, but rather is a matter which, as he says in a neglected passage elsewhere in his major writings (ScG III c. 80 n. 15), “pertains to that person alone as an individual [secundum se ipsum].”

7. Law

The best developed part of Aquinas’ political theory is his account of law. That account’s main features may be summarized in four propositions about the central case and focal meaning of law. It is a matter of intelligent direction addressed to the intelligence and reason of those whom it directs. It is for the common good of a political community. It is made (positum, put in place) by the ruler(s) responsible for the community in question. It needs to be coercive.

7.1 Law is an appeal to reason

Aquinas’ well-known discussion of law in ST I-II qq. 90–97 (a discussion which actually extends through the less studied qq. 98–105) has been justly admired by jurists and other thinkers not otherwise much interested in his work. But it is shaped by his concern there (i) to present for beginner students of theology an overview of the universe and of the vast sweep of creatures out from their divine creator and back to the same transcendent being as their ultimate destiny, and (ii) to synthesize the traditional vocabulary and classic theological sources on law. So prominence is there given to the “eternal law” by which God governs even inanimate creatures (as by the laws of physics, etc.), and to the “participation” of natural moral law in that eternal law. But when he is free from these textbookish constraints he emphasizes that law’s most essential feature is something which is not true of the laws of nature (physics, biology, etc.), namely that it is an appeal to the mind, choice, moral strength (virtus) and love of those subject to the law: ScG III cc. 114–117; this is quietly indicated also in ST I-II q. 91 a. 2 ad 3.

Law (in its central case and focal meaning) is thus always a plan for co-ordination through free cooperation. The structure of things being what it is, the principles of practical reason and morality (natural moral law and natural right) can be understood, accepted, and lived by, as fully directive in conscience, without needing to be regarded as (what they really are) an appeal from mind to mind, a plan – freely made to be freely adopted – for integral human fulfillment. As the divine creator was in no way constrained to choose to create this universe as distinct from any other good possible universe, so human legislators have wide moral freedom to choose amongst alternative possible legal arrangements, making one set of provisions legally and (presumptively) morally obligatory by the sheer fact of adopting it – that is, by what Aquinas calls the law-makers’ determinatio: I-II q. 95 a. 2; q. 99 a. 3 ad 2; q. 104 a. 1..

7.2 Law is for a political community’s common good

The definition of law offered by Aquinas in ST I-II q. 90 a. 4 is: “an ordinance of reason for the common good of a [complete] community, promulgated by the person or body responsible for looking after that community.” It is by being intended for common good that law appeals to its subjects’ reason, and gives them reason for regarding the law as authoritative and obligatory, morally as well as legally. Even when its subjects or some of them would have made or preferred a different determinatio, a different way of pursuing communal benefit, the rulers’ intent to promote common good supports and is supported by their claim to rulership. Only if they have such intent can they instantiate the central case of government.

7.2.1 The Rule of Law

The central case of government is the rule of a free people, and law is centrally instantiated when its fully public character (promulgation: q. 90 a. 4), and its clarity (q. 95 a.3), generality (q. 96 a. 1), stability (q. 97 a. 2), and practicability (q. 95 a. 3), enable government (law-makers and law-maintainers alike) and subjects to be partners in public reason (Aquinas has the concept though not the phrase). The features of law thus itemized by Aquinas amount to the concept of the Rule of Law, which he clearly gives a priority over the “rule of men” in his treatment of judges’ subordination to legislation and of the duty of judges to adhere to law even against the evidence of their own eyes (when that evidence is not legally admissible): II-II q. 67 a. 2; q. 64 a. 6 ad 3.

7.3 Law is posited by the responsible authority

The person or body that “has the care of the community” is entitled to make laws. Aquinas treats all human law as “posited” and (synonymously) “positive”, even those of its rules that are restatements of, or authoritatively promulgated deductions (conclusiones) from, general moral principles or norms. Interpretation, too, Aquinas thinks of as involving, in the last analysis, an appeal to the legislator(s) to declare what the enacted law truly means.

The making of law by custom is not incompatible with this thesis; it amounts to a positing of law by the people, considered as having a diffused authority and responsibility for their own community.

Even in a paradise unflawed by any human vice, there would, Aquinas thinks, have been need for government and for law, though not necessarily “political” government, still less coercive law. For social life needs a considerable amount of common policy and common action which cannot otherwise than by authoritative determinatio be achieved by a group whose members have many ideas – perhaps all of them good – about priorities and ways to proceed: ST I q. 96 a. 4. A determinatio, if it is just and fit to be authoritative, must have a rational connection to principles of practical reasonableness. But that rational connection is like an architect’s decisions about dimensions; they must be rationally connected to the terms of the commission (e.g. to build a maternity hospital, not a lion’s cage) but these terms, while excluding various options, leave many options entirely open (the doors must be more than 1 foot high but as between 7.1 and 7.2 feet the choice is entirely free, and likewise with every dimension, selection of materials, colors, and so forth).

7.4 Law needs to be coercive

In a world (paradise) of saints (completely virtuous persons), there would be need for law but not for coercion; so coercion is not part of Aquinas’s definition of law and law’s directive force can be contrasted with its coercive force (and see 6.1(ii) above). But in our actual world the need for (the threat of) coercion is such that Aquinas will say without qualification that law ought to have coercive force [vis coactiva] as well as directive [vis directiva]; he even says that it is a characteristic of law [de ratione legis] (ST I-II q. 96 a. 5), despite not including it in his official definition of law’s nature [its ratio] (q. 90. a. 3).

It is not quite accurate to say that the state or its government has a monopoly of force, since one can justifiably use force as a citizen to defend oneself or others from an attack or assault that is not itself justified (being criminal or insane), and this requires no authorization. Still, Aquinas insistently draws a distinction between private and public use of force. Only public authority can punish or rightly engage in war, and it is reasonable for public authorities to seek a virtual monopoly on what would now be called police operations for the prevention, suppression, and detection of crime. Private persons can never rightly intend precisely to harm or kill, though they can knowingly bring about harm or death as a proportionate side-effect of intending to block an attack (3.4.1 above). Persons with public authority can, Aquinas thinks, rightly intend to kill (or injure) in the exercise of their duty to suppress the attacks of criminals, pirates, and other public or private enemies. (He does not explore those borderland or badland – “wild west” – situations where the distinction between public and private is indistinct.)

The paradigmatic public use of coercion is judicially imposed punishment, capital or otherwise. At the core of Aquinas’s account of justified punishment is the notion that offenders are punishable because, in choosing to offend, they have excessively indulged their will and thereby (he implies) gained a kind of advantage over those who have retrained their own wills from such excess; a just relationship between themselves and their fellow citizens can fittingly be restored by proportionately imposing upon such offenders something contra voluntatem, contrary to and suppressive of their will: I-II q. 46 a. 6 ad 2. This restoration of a fair balance between offenders and the law-abiding is central to what Aquinas frequently calls the “medicinal” function of punishment, for the medicine of punishment is intended to heal not only offenders (by reforming them) or potential offenders (by deterring them), but also and more centrally the whole community by rectifying the disorder of injustice created by the offender’s self-preferential violation of justice. On capital punishment see 3.4.1 above.

Aquinas regards as legitimate ground for going to war not only the defence of this or another political community, but also the purpose of justly punishing and/or securing compensation. (As justifiable grounds for use of force, it is difficult to distinguish between (i) defence of one’s own community’s (or another’s) territory and constitution, (ii) the recovery or restoration of unjustly taken territory or other possessions, and (iii) exaction of compensation for unjust takings or other injuries.)

7.5 Unjust law and just revolution

If the law purports to require actions that no-one should ever do, it cannot rightly be complied with; one’s moral obligation is not to obey but to disobey: ST I-II q. 96 a. 4. And if it purports to authorize such acts (e.g. rape, theft, or infanticide), its authorization is morally void and of no effect (II-II q. 57 a. 2 ad 2); courts should not guide their adjudications by such laws (II-II q. 60 a. 5 ad 1). But law’s obligatoriness and authority is subject to further conditions, derived from the very nature and rationale of political authority. If the law-makers (i) are motivated not by concern for the community’s common good but by greed or vanity (private motivations that make them tyrants, whatever the content of their legislation), or (ii) act outside the authority granted to them, or (iii) while acting with a view to the common good apportion the necessary burdens unfairly, their laws are unjust and in the forum of reasonable conscience are not so much laws as acts of violence [magis sunt violentiae quam leges]: I-II q. 96 a. 4. Such laws lack moral authority, i.e. do not bind in conscience; one is neither morally obliged to conform nor morally obliged not to conform.

This conclusion is subject to a proviso or exception: laws which are unjust by reason of one or more of these three enumerated types of defect in authority sometimes create an obligation in conscience just to the extent that disobedience would cause disorder or give the kind of ‘example’ that leads others into wrongdoing. To avoid those sorts of unjust harm to public and private good one may have a moral obligation to forgo one’s right(s) [iuri suo debet cedere]. This obligation is not: to comply with the law according to its makers’ intent, and/or to the meaning it has under the particular legal system’s interpretative canons. Rather, it is a kind of collateral obligation: to avoid those acts of non-compliance that would unjustly risk having the bad side-effects of being seen not to comply.

All who govern in the interests of themselves rather than of the common good are tyrants, for that is what a tyrant is in the classical line of thought followed by Aquinas. Tyranny entails treating one’s subjects as slaves – persons used for the benefit of the master. The laws of tyrants are not laws simpliciter, but rather a kind of perversion of law [perversitas legis], and one is, in principle, entitled to treat them as one treats a bandit’s demands: I-II q. 92 a 1 ad 4 & 5; II-II q. 69 a. 4. Against the regime’s efforts to enforce its decrees one has the right of forcible resistance; as a private right this could extend as far as killing the tyrant as a foreseen side-effect of one’s legitimate self-defence. It is the tyrant rather than the subject who is morally guilty of sedition. If one can associate with others to constitute oneself with them a kind of public authority willing and able to assume responsibility for the common good of the state, one is entitled, in Aquinas’ view, to set about overthrowing, and if need be executing, the tyrant, with a view to the liberatio of the people [multitudinis] and the homeland [patriae]. Since rulers who are not tyrants are entitled to hunt down and most severely punish sedition, and both rulers and subjects may fall into error about each other’s moral status, subjects ought to be slow to judge a tyranny so unjust that overthrowing or forcibly resisting it is fair to those likely to be injured as a side-effect of revolutionary struggle; there is a (defeasible) presumption in favor of acquiescence and merely passive disobedience: II-II q. 42 a. 2 ad 3, q. 104 a. 6 ad 3; II Sent. d. 44 q. 2 a. 2; Reg. 1.6.


A. Works of Thomas Aquinas

  • [Eth] Sententia Libri Ethicorum (Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics) [1271–2].
  • [Mal] Quaestiones Disputatae de Malo (Disputed Questions on Evil) [1269–71].
  • [Reg] De Regno [or De Regimine Principum] ad regem Cyprum (On Government [or Kingship] [or On the Rule of Princes/Political Leaders] to the King of Cyprus) [c. 1265].
  • [ScG] Summa contra Gentiles (A Treatise against the Unbelievers) [?1259–65].
  • [Sent] Scriptum super Libros Sententiarum Petri Lombardiensis (A Commentary on Peter Lombard’s Sentences [Collection of Opinions of the Church Fathers]) [1253–7]. Note that this remains untranslated save in small excerpts.
  • [ST] Summa Theologiae (A Treatise on Theology), Parts I [1265–8], I–II [1271–2], II–II [c.1271], III [1272–3].
  • [Ver] Quaestiones Disputatae de Veritate (Disputed Questions about Truth) [1256–9].
  • Dyson, R. W. (ed.), 2002, Thomas Aquinas Political Writings, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press. A selection of texts in a new translation.
  • Freddoso, Alfred (trans.), 2009, Thomas Aquinas: Treatise on Law. The Complete Text. South Bend: St. Augustine’s Press. A new translation.
  • Regan, Richard, and Baumgarth, William (eds.), 2003, Thomas Aquinas: On Law, Morality, and Politics, Indianapolis: Hackett. A selection of texts in a new translation.

B. Secondary Literature

  • Bradley, Denis, 1997, Aquinas on the Twofold Human Good: Reason and Human Happiness in Aquinas’s Moral Science, Washington DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Celano, Anthony, 2003, “Medieval Theories of Practical Reason”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2003 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Dyson, R. W., 2003, Normative Theories of Society in Five Medieval Thinkers, Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellen Press, 187–225
  • Finnis, John, 1983, Fundamentals of Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press; Georgetown: Georgetown University Press.
  • –––, 1996, “The Truth in Legal Positivism”, in George, R. (ed.), The Autonomy of Law: Essays on Legal Positivism, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 195–214; also in Finnis 2011, IV, 174–188.
  • –––, 1997, “The Good of Marriage and the Morality of Sexual Relations: Some Philosophical and Historical Observations”, American Journal of Jurisprudence, 42: 97–134; also in Finnis 2011, III, 334–352.
  • –––, 1998, Aquinas: Moral, Political and Legal Theory, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2011, Collected Essays of John Finnis, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, five volumes.
  • Goyette, John, 2013, “On the Transcendence of the Political Common Good: Aquinas versus the New Natural Law Theory”, Catholic Bioethics Quarterly, Spring: 133–55.
  • Grisez, Germain, 1965, “The First Principle of Practical Reason: A Commentary on the Summa Theologiae, 1–2, Question 94, Article 2”, Natural Law Forum, 10 : 168‑201; reprinted Finnis, J. (ed.), 1991, The International Library of Essays in Law and Legal Theory: Natural Law, vol. 1, Aldershot, England: Dartmouth Publishing; New York: New York University Press, 191–224; reprinted Dunn, J., and Harris, I. (eds.), 1997, Great Political Thinkers 4: Aquinas, Cheltenham, England: Edward Elgar, 393–426.
  • –––, 1987, “Natural Law and Natural Inclinations: Some Comments and Clarifications,” New Scholasticism 61: 307–20.
  • –––, 2001, “Natural Law, God, Religion, and Human Fulfillment,” American Journal of Jurisprudence, 46: 3–36.
  • Grisez, Germain and Finnis, John, 1981, “The Basic Principles of Natural Law: A Reply to Ralph McInerny,” American Journal of Jurisprudence 26: 21–31; reprinted Finnis, J. (ed.), The International Library of Essays in Law and Legal Theory: Natural Law, vol. 1, Aldershot, England: Dartmouth Publishing; New York: New York University Press, 1991, 341–51; reprinted Curran, C., McCormick, R., 1991, Readings in Moral Theology No. 7: Natural Law and Theology, New York: Paulist Press, 157–70.
  • Kries, Douglas, 1990, “Thomas Aquinas and the Politics of Moses”, Review of Politics, 52: 1–21.
  • Lee, Patrick, 1981, “Permanence of the Ten Commandments: St Thomas and his Modern Commentators”, Theological Studies, 42: 422.
  • Lisska, Anthony J., 1998, Aquinas’s Theory of Natural Law: An Analytic Reconstruction, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Long, Steven A., 2004, “Natural Law or Autonomous Practical Reason: Problems in the New Natural Law Theory”, in John Goyette, Mark Latvic, Richard S. Myers (eds.), St. Thomas Aquinas and the Natural Law Tradition: Contemporary Perspectives, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 165–91.
  • MacDonald, Scott, and Stump, Eleonore (eds.), 1998, Aquinas’s Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann, Ithaca: Cornell University Press (essays by a number of contemporary scholars).
  • McInerny, Ralph, 1980, “The Principles of Natural Law”, American Journal of Jurisprudence, 25: 1–15.
  • –––, 1992, Aquinas on Human Action: A Theory of Practice, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • –––, 1997, Ethica Thomistica: The Moral Philosophy of Thomas Aquinas, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 1997.
  • McInerny, Ralph, and O’Callaghan, John, 2005, “Saint Thomas Aquinas”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2005 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Macintyre, Alasdair, 1990, First Principles, Final Ends, and Contemporary Philosophical Issues, Milwaukee: Marquette University Press.
  • Pakaluk, Michael, 2001. “Is the Common Good of Political Society Limited and Instrumental?”, Review of Metaphysics, 55: 57–94.
  • Paterson, Craig, 2006, “Aquinas, Finnis, and Non-naturalism ” in Craig Paterson and Matthew S. Pugh (eds.), Analytical Thomism: traditions in dialogue, Aldershot: Ashgate, 171–93.
  • Pope, Stephen (ed.), 2002, The Ethics of Aquinas, Washington D.C.: Georgetown University Press (essays by a number of contemporary scholars).
  • Rhonheimer, Martin, 2000, Natural Law and Practical Reason: A Thomist View of Moral Autonomy, New York: Fordham University Press.
  • –––, 2011, The Perspective of Morality: Philosophical Foundations of Thomistic Virtue Ethics, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • –––, 2012, “Practical Reason, Human Nature, and the Epistemology of Ethics”, Villanova Law Review, 57(5): 873–88.
  • Stump, Eleonore, 2003, Aquinas, London: Routledge.
  • Wheatley, Anthony Paul, 2015, “In Defence of Neo-Scholastic Ethics: A Critique of Finnis and Grisez’s New Natural Law Theory”, Ph.D. thesis, Manchester, University of Manchester, available online.

Other Internet Resources

  • Corpus Thomisticum, provides a sound working Latin text of the works of Thomas Aquinas (without annotations or other apparatus, but fully searchable). It is based, so far as they have been completed, on the critically edited Omnia Opera begun by the Leonine Commission in 1879/1882; 13 of the projected 50 volumes remain to be published, and the works thus not yet critically edited are given online in what are thought to be the best existing editions.
  • Thomas Aquinas in English: A Bibliography, maintained by Thérèse Bonin, Duquense

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