Notes to Argument and Argumentation

1. Usually, arguments are viewed as having one or more premises and one conclusion, though in some technical contexts the idea of multiple conclusions has been entertained. Note also that arguments typically are but need not be linguistic; they can also be pictorial/visual (see Section 2.2 ("Visual Arguments") of the entry on informal logic; see Tindale 2021 for a defense of multi-modal argumentation).

2. This is not meant to be an exhaustive classification: there may well be arguments that do not fall under any of these categories. But these are the classes of arguments that have received extensive attention in the literature.

3. Though see Goodwin (2007) for a critique of functionalist approaches to argumentation.

4. Notice though that some authors are more optimistic concerning the prospects of argumentation to improve our beliefs (Mercier & Sperber 2017).

5. Some examples of pessimistic assessments of the value of argumentation are Schopenhauer’s satirical account of “dialectic” in Eristic Dialectic: The Art of Winning an Argument, and Carl Schmitt’s bleak appreciation of parliamentary debates:

The essence of liberalism is negotiation, a cautious half-measure, in the hope that the definitive dispute, the decisive bloody battle, can be transformed into a parliamentary debate and permit the decision to be suspended forever in an everlasting discussion. (Schmitt 1922 [2005: 63])

6. A certain amount of artificiality and regimentation of everyday language was already present in earlier logical systems such as Aristotle’s syllogistic (Dutilh Novaes 2015), but logicians up to the nineteenth century tended to take arguments closely related to ordinary language as their primary object of study. In the twentieth century, some logicians became interested again in the dialogical underpinnings of logic, in particular in the dialogical logic tradition (Lorenzen & Lorenz 1978) and in the game-theoretical semantics tradition (Hintikka & Sandu 1997).

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Catarina Dutilh Novaes <>

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