Aristotle’s Natural Philosophy

First published Fri May 26, 2006; substantive revision Mon Apr 24, 2023

Aristotle had a lifelong interest in the study of nature. He investigated a variety of different topics, ranging from general issues like motion, causation, place and time, to systematic explorations and explanations of natural phenomena across different kinds of natural entities. These different inquiries are integrated into the framework of a single overarching enterprise describing the domain of natural entities. Aristotle provides the general theoretical framework for this enterprise in his Physics, a treatise which divides into two main parts, the first an inquiry into nature (books 1–4) and the second a treatment of motion (books 5–8).[1] In this work, Aristotle sets out the conceptual apparatus for his analysis, provides definitions of his fundamental concepts, and argues for specific theses about motion, causation, place and time, and establishes in bk. 8 the existence of the unmoved mover of the universe, a supra-physical entity, without which the physical domain could not remain in existence. He takes up problems of special interest to physics (such as the problem of generation and perishing) in a series of further physical treatises, some of which are devoted to particular physical domains: the De generatione et corruptione (On Generation and Perishing), the De caelo (On the Heavens),[2] and the Meteorology, which lead up to the treatises on biology and psychology.[3]

The science of physics, Aristotle stresses, contains almost all there is to know about the world. Were there no separate forms—entities such as the unmoved mover at the pinnacle of the cosmos—which are without matter and are not part of the physical world, physics would be what Aristotle calls first philosophy (Metaphysics 6.1, 1026a27–31). As there are such separate entities, physics is dependent on these, and is only a second philosophy (Metaphysics 7.11, 1037a14f). Nevertheless, the interaction between these two “philosophies” is not completely exhausted by the causal influence exerted on the world by the supra-physical entities—the prime movers as it turns out. Aristotle’s metaphysics and physics use a common conceptual framework, and they often address similar issues. The prime and distinctive task of first philosophy is an inquiry into first entities; these, however, are not perceptible entities, and as a result they have to be investigated through a metaphysical investigation of physical entities. Hence the overlap between the two disciplines, which often verges on inseparability.

1. Natures and the four causes

Nature, according to Aristotle, is an inner principle of change and being at rest (Physics 2.1, 192b20–23). This means that when an entity moves or is at rest according to its nature reference to its nature may serve as an explanation of the event. We have to describe how—to what extent, through what other processes, and due to what agency—the preconditions for the process of change or of being at rest are present, but once we have provided an account of these preconditions, we have given a complete account of the process. The nature of the entity is in and of itself sufficient to induce and to explain the process once the relevant circumstances do not preempt it.

Natures as inner principles of change and rest are contrasted with active powers or potentialities (dunameis), which are external principles of change and being at rest (Metaphysics 9.8, 1049b5–10), operative on the corresponding internal passive capacities or potentialities (dunameis again, Metaphysics 9.1, 1046a11–13). When a change, or a state of rest, is not natural, both the active and the passive potentiality need to be specified. Natures, then, in a way do double duty: once a nature is operative, neither a further active, nor a further passive capacity needs to be invoked. Even so, as will be clear from Aristotle’s discussion, this general thesis will require a host of qualifications.

Because natures—beside the active and passive potentialities—are ultimate grounds in causal explanations, Aristotle sets out how they are integrated with the doctrine of causation.

An explanation for a state of affairs must specify some feature or some object (in general, some abstract or concrete entity) which is responsible for it. The entity responsible is, Aristotle submits, a cause (aitia or aition, words used interchangeably by Aristotle).[4] Different explanations of a single state of affairs are possible, and indeed usually necessary, because there are different ways of being responsible for distinct facets of the same state of affairs. The varieties of responsibilities are grouped by Aristotle under four headings, the so-called four causes.

The first two of these are matter and form, what an entity is made up from according to Aristotle’s hylomorphic analysis. Understandably, both of them can be responsible for the features and the behaviour of the entity they make up. Hylomorphic analysis, together with the separation of the material and formal causes as distinct types, implies that if something is explicable in terms of matter or form, explanations in terms of form will be different in kind from those given in terms of matter. As a rule there is a collaboration between these causes: matter provides the potentialities which are actualised by the form. Accordingly, these causally relevant entities give rise to a hierarchic structure of explanation.[5] In order for a form to be realised, one needs to have suitable matter. This suitable matter brings with it the features required by a given hylomorphic composite. These features, then, are on the one hand the contribution of the matter, and as such the matter is the (material) cause of these features of the composite entity, whereas on the other hand they are indispensable presuppositions for the realisation of the form, and to that extent their presence is prompted by the form.[6] Such dependency relations between matter and form are labelled by Aristotle as cases of hypothetical necessity. Aristotle sometimes illustrates his point by appealing to the matter required for the construction of a house. If there is a house to be built, one needs building bricks, slabs, mortar, etc. Each part provides material with properties within a definite range of the sort required for a house to come into being. A house cannot, for example, be made out of liquid water. That sort of matter would provide potentialities not suited for the form of house.

Explanations often specify entities beyond the role played by the matter and the form of the entity itself. These cases are grouped by Aristotle as efficient or moving causes on the one hand and as final causes on the other. Efficient causes operate in a straightforward manner by initiating processes and bringing about their effects, whereas final causes account for processes and entities by being what these processes and entities are for, what they objectively intend to attain.[7] The fact that the role of efficient causes is not identical to that of the matter and the form of the entity whose features they are to explain does not require that every instance of efficient causation must issue from outside the entity moved. On the contrary, an efficient cause can also be internal. In cases in which the efficient cause is internal, it will be, in its specific function, one of the parts, or even the formal aspect, of the entity caused to move.

Natures, understandably, can feature in any of these four causal functions. However, when the matter of an entity functions as its nature—i.e., when its natural motion and rest are explained in terms of the matter it is made of—this matter must possess some causally relevant features, bestowed upon it by its own formal aspect.

This role of matter can be contrasted to the causal role of the three further types of causes—of form, of efficient cause, and of final cause, respectively. This is so, because, as Aristotle adds, form and final cause often coincide. Moreover, when a nature is specified as a first efficient cause, cause and effect are the same in form (or in species), though this is not to say that one and the same entity causes itself and is caused through its own causal efficacy (Physics 2.7, 198a24–27, cf. Metaphysics 8.4, 1044a32–b1).

As internal principles of moving and rest, natures stand in an exclusive relationship to the efficient or moving causes of the motions and rests they bring about: in some cases when Aristotle is not specifying the first moving cause, he can assert the identity of nature and moving cause. Accordingly, the soul of living beings will be identified as the substance (i.e., form) and the moving cause of the organism whose soul it is.[8] But the identification, even in this restricted sense, will need some further important qualifications, to which we will return in Section 5 below, on movers and unmoved movers.

2. Motion

Because motion or change (kinêsis) is mentioned in the definition of nature, any discussion of nature will need to rely upon the explanation of motion. One might—erroneously—think that this is an easy task, because Aristotle’s categories (as listed in the Categories and also elsewhere) do contain two related types of entities, action and passion. Aristotle’s discussion of motion in the Physics, however, starts out in a somewhat different manner. When he submits that there is no motion besides the categories (Physics 3.1, at 200b32–201a3), he does not assign motions to the categories of action and passion. After mentioning that the entities in the categories come in oppositions, Aristotle claims a few lines later (at 201a8–9) that there are as many kinds of motion and change as there are kinds of being. This means that motions are grouped here with the entities of the category where they effect change.[9]

Nevertheless, when making this claim, Aristotle speaks about four kinds of motion and change only—those in substance, in quality, in quantity and in place—whereas the number of the kinds of being should have remained ten.

Indeed, the Physics will later submit its own list of categories. That list is slightly reduced—it has seven or eight elements, depending on whether we include or exclude time.[10] The reduced list also concludes with the claim that there are three kinds of motion, plus the additional kind of substantial change.[11] That is to say, even where Aristotle enumerates a fairly complete list of categories, he will not have motions in every one of these categories, and he is not content to relegate motions to the categories of action and passion.[12] But this is a context where Aristotle stresses another issue: he is not interested in assigning a separate ontological niche for motions—regardless of whether that might or might not have been a feasible task within the categorization of entities. Here Aristotle is more intent on characterizing the ontological links which motions have to entities falling into different categories, and to find a general matrix of undergoing and effecting change. This happens in several steps. First Aristotle claims that changes of relations are not changes in their own right; rather they are accidental, as they occur also in entities in which no change occurs at all, if the entity which they stand in relation to undergoes some change.[13] After these considerations the crucial two categories of action and passion are eliminated. They cannot possibly house motions in the same way as the other four categories do. This is so because such a motion would require that there should be motion or change of an action or a passion. But there are no motions of motions, so even though actions and passions qualify as motions, or at least are intimately linked to motions, we can set aside action and passion as types in which motions can occur.[14] This leaves us with the shorter list of relevant categories, (1) substance, (2) quality, (3) quantity, and (4) place.[15]

Within the four domains where genuine change can occur, change always requires the existence of a potentiality which can be actualised. But change is neither identical to this potentiality, nor to the lack of a property, nor, without further qualifications, to the actuality which is acquired when the potentiality is actualised (Physics 3.2, 201b33–35). It is a special kind of actuality, the actuality of the potential in so far as it is potential (Physics 3.2, 201b4–5). Aristotle’s formulation strongly suggests that the potentiality actualised in the process of change is not a separate and independent potentiality for motion, alongside the entity’s potentiality for harbouring the end-state of the process: the process, say, house-building, and the end result, the house, are different actualisations of the same potentiality of a set of materials that is buildable into a house. Not only would Aristotle’s definition be uninformative otherwise, amounting to the tautologous claim that change is the actualisation of the capacity for change, the further qualification in the definition, that change is the actuality of the potential in so far as it is potential, would be completely idle.[16] This further restriction is easiest taken as selecting between the different types of the realisations of the same potentialities.[17] As Aristotle stresses these are the incomplete actualities belonging to these potentialities, adding also that what is actualised in a process of realisation is an incomplete potentiality only (Physics 3.2, 201b32–33). Accordingly, potentialities of change may be admitted into the ontology. But even if they are admitted as additional potentialities, they]do not need to feature as potentialities in their own right, but as the incomplete variants of the fundamental potentiality for an end result.[18]

It is furthermore important to note that potentiality in this discussion throughout excludes actuality. In a formulation closely matching the formulation of the principle of non-contradiction, Aristotle asserts that “some things are the same [=have the same properties, are the same substances] both in potentiality and in actuality, but not at the same time or not in the same respect, as e.g. [a thing is] warm in actuality and cold in potentiality” (Physics 3.1, 201a19–22).[19] Hence the ability of Aristotle’s definition to pick out the paradoxical entity, which is the actuality of a potentiality that can no longer be present once it has been replaced by the corresponding property in actuality.

3. The principle of causational synonymy

The definition of motion suggests that such processes can be characterised in terms of a property or state of an entity, acquired as a result at the end of the process, which can be labelled the form within this process, and an initial lack of this form. Furthermore, Aristotle claims, there is a third component, which is not changed in the process, the substrate or subject of the motion (Physics 1.7).[20]

In terms of this threefold division it is the duty of the entity effecting change to confer the requisite form on the object changed, as Physics 3.2, 202a9–12 puts it. But there are further important requirements for such a change to occur. First of all, these motions or changes occur at the interaction of two potentialities. One, the passive potentiality, is in the object undergoing change, while the other, the active potentiality, is in the entity initiating change. The two potentialities need to match each other: when there is a potentiality for being heated in the object undergoing change, the process needs to be initiated by another object possessing an active potentiality for effecting the heating. This is true to the extent that Aristotle can claim that the definition of passive potentiality is dependent on that of the active potentiality (Metaphysics 9.1, 1046a9–13). These two potentialities need to work in tandem, and consequently Aristotle can claim that there is only a single process going on, which is located in the entity moved. Thus, for example, when a process of instruction is going on, it is identical to a process of knowledge acquisition, which happens in the mind of the learner. Hence although action and passion retain their categorical difference, because their accounts are different, what they subsist in, the motion, will be the same (Physics 3.3, 202b19–22).[21]

Aristotle already by the introduction of a matching pair of active and passive potentialities for each causal interaction comes very close to admitting a separate potentiality for each and every change, something uncomfortably close to the vis dormitiva, ridiculed by Molière, according to which a sleeping pill allegedly induces sleep just in virtue of its power to induce sleep. Aristotle, however, subscribes to an even stronger principle, that causes in effecting change transmit the form they possess to the entity they effect change in. According to this claim the active capacity of the item effecting change is at its root an actuality, which is synonymous (in the Aristotelian sense) with the effect that is brought about by it. In Aristotle’s favourite example, only a human in actuality produces a human from what is a human in potentiality. If this is so, a sleeping pill need not only possess an active potentiality for inducing sleep: it needs also to be slumbering itself.[22] The principle—which we could term the principle of causational synonymy—comes from Plato (see e.g. Phaedo 100B–101D), but Aristotle has his own reasons for endorsing it. His science attests to the presence and operation of causally active forms at each level of analysis of the physical world.[23] Hence, as we shall see, Aristotle’s forms are the causally significant components of the substance effecting a change. Accordingly, when it comes to specifying the moving cause of an artefact, Aristotle will refer to the art of the craftsman as the fundamental component operative in the change. In cases where a living being is generated, it is the parental form which is transmitted to the newly emerging living being.[24]

But it is not only processes of generation that conform to this requirement. Instances of qualitative change are often mentioned alongside substantial generation, and as a crucially important instance of qualitative alteration—or of qualitative quasi-alteration, depending on how we interpret Aristotle’s theory of perception[25]—Aristotle presupposes that the principle of causational synonymy characterises also the causal link connecting the object of sensation and the sense organ.

It is, nevertheless, important to note that Aristotle restricts the principle of causational synonymy in different and subtle ways. Most significantly, an important domain of cases where a property of an object is actualised is exempted from the requirements of this principle. The actualisation of a property can be the continuation of a previous causal process to the extent that Aristotle claims it is a second actuality, following upon a previously acquired first actuality. In these cases the emergence of the second actuality does not necessarily require an additional external efficient cause. The operation of this first actuality, through which it reinforces and completes itself, can be the mere extension of the operation of the original efficient cause (this will be Aristotle’s claim about the natural locomotion of the elements, see Section 5 below), or the entity which has acquired this first actuality can be already causally responsible for its own activities, including the ones which bring it to a level of higher actuality[26] (Aristotle’s examples for this case are the soul of the embryo or of the newborn cub, which commands and effects the nourishing and the activities of the animal; or the actual application of a piece of knowledge one has acquired beforehand). It is important to note that these claims are far from trivial: they rest on further claims that the very definitions of these first actualities (what it is to be an element, an animal, or knowledge, respectively) inseparably include references to these activities.

Second, the principle of causational synonymy is couched in terms which do not include locomotions: it is substantial, qualitative or quantitative form which is claimed to be transmitted through the efficacy of the cause in Physics 3.2, 202a9–12. One of the reasons for this is that locomotion, as Aristotle claims, affects the least the substance, the ousia of the object undergoing motion (Physics 8.7, 261a20f). Unlike the other types of change, locomotion does not change the being of the moved object at all. To some extent that should mean that the predication of place should remain extrinsic to the being of the entity that is at a particular location.[27] Hence the fundamental presupposition of causation, that it is intrinsic characterisations of entities which are conferred on the object moved cannot be in full force in cases of locomotion.[28] Accordingly, Aristotle will have a more intricate account for natural and forced locomotions.

Third, the principle of causational synonymy is restricted to substances at the end of Metaphysics 7.9,[29] and in the first half of the same chapter the non-standard presence of some causally relevant forms may also be envisaged. Aristotle’s example there is the heat in motion, which produces heat in the body when the doctor rubs the patient in the appropriate manner. This heat in the motion can be the presence of an active potentiality in the motion which is able to elicit heat in the body, without heat being predicable of motion itself. But even if such non-inherential subsistence of properties is only hinted at, and not expressly envisaged in this passage (on a more detailed description the heat in motion is the active capacity of motion to produce heat in the skin of the patient—and in the skin of the doctor—which as far as the treatment is concerned enters into the inner recesses of the patient’s body, becoming heat in the body), some similar sort of presence is required in two large classes of cases: natural generations and artificial productions.

Aristotle claims that in a chain of efficient causes, where the first element of the series acts through the intermediary of the other items, it is the first member in the causal chain, rather than the intermediaries, which is the moving cause (Physics 8.5, 257a10–12). Then, both in cases of natural generation and artificial production, it is only this first efficient cause which has to satisfy the requirement of synonymous causation. Aristotle’s prime example, that human generates human, is also such a case. Here, the causal efficacy of the paternal human form is transmitted through the generative potentialities of the semen of the father. The semen, however, although it acts as an efficient cause in the process of the formation of the embryo, is not a human; it does not possess the form it transmits in the same way as the male parent does. Aristotle’s discussion makes it clear that this is not an isolated instance of an exception from the general principle. He compares the case to the activity of a craftsman, where the form of the product of the artistic production is in the soul of the craftsman, and then through the motions of the instruments this form can get imposed on the material manufactured into an artefact. The instruments and their motions are efficient causes of the process, but they do not contain the form in the same way as the soul of the craftsman (On the generation of animals 730b14–23 and 740b25–29, for further discussion see the entry on Aristotle’s biology).[30]

All these restrictions notwithstanding, Aristotle can claim that the principle of causational synonymy remains universally valid. This is so, because all the three restrictions above specify cases where Aristotle can claim that a preceding, more prominent cause has already satisfied the requirement: in the case of second actualities the first actuality was called into existence by a synonymous cause in the first place; locomotions, qualitative and quantitative changes, even if not caused by a synonymous entity, can be part of a larger pattern of causation, in which a substance is caused by a substance of the same kind; and causal chains producing substances can be claimed to start out invariably from synonymous substances.

Given his commitment to causal synonymy, Aristotle needs to invoke considerations through which a chain of efficient causes of some entity can be meaningfully compared in terms of causal efficacy. These considerations will on each occasion describe synonymous causes not only as temporally prior, but also as having priority in terms of causal efficacy over the intermediate causes, which are responsible only for the transmission of the forms of the original locus of causal efficacy.

This allows, then, that in the two major paradigms of such causation—in natural generation and in artificial production—the nature of the natural entity, and the art[31] of the craftsman exercising his art respectively, the relevant form is the causally operative entity initiating change. This has wide ranging consequences for the status of forms in several respects. First, the causal relevance of these forms shows that not any arrangement or configuration can qualify as a full-fledged form. While it is true that privations are also forms in some sense (Physics 2.1, 193b19–20), this is not the sense in which the causally operative forms, describable in evaluative terms, can be called forms. Moreover, the causal relevance of forms allows Aristotle to switch (e.g. in De generatione et corruptione 1.7) without notice between the craftsman and the craft itself as the appropriate specification of the efficient cause in these cases. We should note that in the latter cases, Aristotle specifies causes which are unmoved. They do not effect motion by being in motion themselves, in so far as they are the causally effective forms within the causal framework; hence they are not under any reactive influence during this process either.

4. Priority among motions

Even though the foregoing might have suggested that generation of substances is fundamental for all the other kinds of changes, in fact locomotion will have a privileged status. All other changes depend on locomotions, because any two entities involved in change, with their active and passive potentialities, respectively, need to come into contact in order for the interaction to occur.[32] Contact, however, as a rule needs to be established by locomotion: either the entity to be moved, or the mover, or both, need to proceed so that they meet (Physics 8.7, 260a26–b7). Moreover locomotion is the form of change which can occur in isolation of generation, perishing and the other forms of change (Physics 8.7, 260b26–29). Other changes are independent kinds of change insofar as they can occur in an entity which does not perform any other change. Nevertheless all these forms of change include or presuppose that some other entity engages in locomotion.[33]

Aristotle argues at the opening of Physics bk. 8 that motion and change in the universe can have no beginning, because the occurrence of change presupposes a previous process of change. With this argument Aristotle can establish an eternal chain of motions and refute those who hold that there could have been a previous stationary state of the universe. Such an eternal chain, Aristotle argues, needs to rely on a cause which guarantees its persistence: if each of the constitutive processes in the causally connected web were of finite duration, for every one of them it can be the case that it is not present in the world, indeed, at some later time it will not be present any longer. But then the whole causally connected series of events, Aristotle claims, would also be contingent.[34] Hence Aristotle postulates that the processes of the universe depend on an eternal motion (or on several eternal motions), the eternal revolution of the heavenly spheres, which in turn is dependent on one or several unmoved movers (Physics 8.6, 258b26–259a9).[35]

The priority of the eternal celestial revolutions, furthermore, guarantees the causal finitude of the universe. This is so, even though there are infinite causal chains: behind every single individual of an animal species there is an infinite series of male ancestors, each causally responsible for the subsequent members in the series, because Aristotelian species are eternal and male parents are the efficient causes of their offspring.[36] Left to its own devices, the finite universe on its own would certainly reach a dissolution, a state of complete separation of the elemental masses into their concentrically arranged natural places. In view of the fact that such a complete segregation of the elemental masses is avoided through the constant excitation caused by the celestial motions, producing heat in the sublunary domain, especially around the regions of the Sun,[37] Aristotle will be entitled to assert that the cause of the human being is in the first instance his or her father, but is at the same time the Sun as it moves along its annual ecliptic path.[38] Between celestial revolutions and the individual natural processes there is always a finite causal chain, as these natural processes could not possibly have continued without the celestial motions. The infinite causal chains passing through male parents cannot subsist on their own without this constant external support, and this dependence can always be analysed in terms of finite causal chains.

5. Movers and unmoved movers

The definition of motion as the actuality of a potentiality of the entity undergoing motion in so far as it is potential requires that in each case the passive potentiality for the change is present in the changing object. The presence of the potentiality can, nevertheless, be in accordance with the nature of the object—in which case the change is natural (phusei) or according to nature (kata phusin), or can happen in the face of a contrary disposition on the part of the nature of the entity—in which case the change is forced (biâi) or contrary to nature (para phusin). A major presupposition on Aristotle’s part is that this division is exhaustive: there are no changes to which the nature of the entity would be indifferent or neutral.[39] The major consideration behind such a presupposition is that natures regulate the behaviour of the entities to which they belong in a comprehensive manner, and not merely partially. Any influence the entity is exposed to interacts with its nature in a substantive manner. The entity does not possess potentialities for change which would not be directly related to the tendencies emerging from its nature.

Note, however, that even if we endorsed the exhaustiveness of the dichotomy of natural and forced motions, and accepted the thesis that simple bodies possess a unique natural motion (De caelo 1.2, 269a8–9), we would not need thereby to accept Aristotle’s further major claim, that natural and forced motions come in pairs of opposites, with the result that if a motion is contrary to the nature of an entity, the opposite motion will be its natural motion (De caelo 1.2, 269a9–18). Where there is room for some more complex relationships among the targets of changes than a simple opposition along an axis of a single dimension—and this is eminently so between locomotions along rectilinear and circular paths, respectively—there can be several forced translations in contrast to the single natural motion of the elements endowed with rectilinear natural motion, as Aristotle also admits in some passages of the De caelo (see 1.2, 269a30–b2 and 269b10–12).

Although this allows for several different motions that are contrary to the nature of the same entity, the natural motion will still have a single opposite motion, the one which is directed to the opposite location. Consequently, natural circular motion will have no motion that is opposite to it (De caelo 1.4, 270b32–271a5).[40]

Aristotle’s classification of motions into those contrary to nature and those according to nature applies not only to the motions of the moved objects, but transfers also to the movers effecting motions. A mover can effect a motion which is contrary to its own nature. Aristotle’s example of such an unnatural mover is the lever, an object heavy by nature, with which loads can be lifted (Physics 8.4, 255a20–23). Although such movers can effect motions in the contrary direction to the motion at the head of the causal chain (levers are operated by the downward push of something heavy at the other end), the crucial consideration for Aristotle in this case is that the original, initiating cause of the causal chain should effect the motion according to its nature. Taken together, these considerations imply that we have a complete account of the physical domain once we have a thorough description of what is natural to the entities in that domain, together with a specification of all the circumstances in which they operate.[41]

Bk. 8 of the Physics argues for the additional thesis that for each motion, whether natural or contrary to nature, there needs to exist a mover.[42] In cases of forced motion, movers are present in a conspicuous way. This need not be so, however, in cases of natural motion. Apart from the cases where the nature of the entity is at the same time a moving and efficient cause—i.e., apart from living beings, whose nature, the soul, is both formal and efficient cause—the mover may be inconspicuous. This is eminently so in the remaining large class of natural motions, the natural motions of the elements. The nature of these elements, their inner principle of motion and rest is not the moving cause of the motions of the elements, Aristotle claims. If it were, then it would be up to the elementary masses to determine when they should perform their motions, but plainly this is not so. Moreover, the principle of causational synonymy rules out that any homogenous mass, without an internal demarcation into separate components, one moving and the other being moved, could move itself (Physics 8.4, 255a5–18). This is so because, on the assumption that one part of a homogeneous body could move another part, the active component of change would be, in every aspect, indistinguishable from the part in which change is effected, and this in turn would mean that change would occur even though there would be no transmission of a causally relevant property from the active part to the passive. This implies that even though we may answer the question as to why the elements move to their natural places—the light bodies up and the heavy ones down—by an appeal to their respective natures as causes (“that it is simply their nature to move somewhere,[43] and this is what it is to be light and to be heavy,” Physics 8.4, 255b13–17), we do not thereby specify their moving causes. Their thrust being in a single direction, the elements cannot circumvent even rather simple obstacles they may encounter on their way (a sealed container can retain air under water, the roof stays put pressing down on the walls of a building etc.). Hence, whoever removes an obstacle to an element’s motion is causally responsible for the ensuing elemental motions. But even such a causally responsible agent will not qualify as the moving cause, without yet further qualifications. For the identification of the moving cause of these locomotions Aristotle invokes his distinction of two potentialities. Some heavy material can be potentially light, as it can be transformed into a light material in a process of generation, whereas the emerging light material is still potential in a sense until it has acquired its full-fledged status, which involves its having arrived at that region of the cosmos which is its natural place. This analysis, then, describes the natural locomotion of the elements as a possibly postponed, completing stage within a single overarching process, and hence in these cases Aristotle can identify the cause of the second stage of the process with the efficient cause of the first stage, the entity which generated the element in the first place (Physics 8.4, 256a1).

Once it is established that there is a mover for each change, the finite causal chains[44] can be followed up to the primary instance of motion, which are eternal circular motions. (In particular the Sun’s course along the ecliptic is responsible for many sublunar changes, the cycle of the seasons being foremost among them.) Whether these circular motions require external movers, and ultimately, whether the universe is causally closed or needs some external causal influence for its preservation, depends on the status of these revolutions.

In this regard the very first thing to establish is that they cannot be constrained motions.[45] But natural motions are also in need of movers, as Physics 8.4 argues. This does not apply only to the natural motions of living beings, which are performed under the causal influence of their soul. The natural motions of the four sublunary elements are also caused by specific external causes responsible for these motions, and on the basis of these considerations Aristotle feels entitled to assert that every motion whatsoever—including also, then, the eternal circular motions—require a mover.

But the entities performing these eternal circular motions cannot possibly be moved by moving causes of the same kind as the movers of sublunary elemental motions. These entities are eternal and ungenerated bodies. Consequently, there is no entity that could produce them. Nothing can be responsible for the circular motion on account of generating these eternal and ungenerated bodies. Moreover, as they do not encounter any hindrance during their revolutions, there is no room for an accidental mover which would remove any obstacle in their way.

Although Aristotle’s physical treatises do not discuss in what particular way their movers are causally responsible for these eternal circular motions, the general framework set out apparently applies to them as well. In accordance with this, motion is an incomplete actuality of the potentiality of what is movable (Physics 8.5, 257b6ff). This incomplete actuality is always dependent on the causal efficacy of the corresponding actuality of a mover. The example presented here is the process of heating a potentially hot item, caused to be hot by an actually hot thing. The division of roles guarantees that the same item cannot possibly be the mover and the moved entity at the same time. Consequently, these eternal circular motions are envisaged as having a cause responsible for their motion, the causal influence of which produces (and upholds) this motion continuously in them. Aristotle does not specify in any detail what exactly the actuality of the mover is; nor does he indicate what relationship there is between this actuality and the actuality that is being continuously communicated by the mover to the entities in eternal circular motion.

A further requirement is that the mover of these eternal circular motions has to be unmoved.[46] But then the actuality of this mover should not be restricted to a causally efficacious single property. Rather, the mover should be actual all way through. Any potentiality it might have would carry with it the jeopardy that it might undergo possible changes of its own.[47] This is ruled out to the extent that such a first cause cannot house motion even accidentally.[48] In other words, the mover cannot be related to the moving object in the way the soul of an animal is related to the moving animal; in the case of an animal wherever the living being, the animal, moves, its soul will follow suit and will also move,—accidentally—to the same place.[49]

Moreover, the entity causally responsible for the eternal circular motions in the world has to possess an infinite power,[50] which it communicates to the bodies it moves. As a result, this entity cannot be divisible and cannot have extension. Moreover, it must be located where the motion is quickest, at the periphery of the physical realm (Physics 8.10).

All this testifies to the exceptional status of the first movement, and behind it, of the first mover in the universe. The mover of these spheres possesses nothing but actuality, but this actuality is not what is transmitted in the process of causation. As we have seen in Section 3 above, this would not be exceptional as such: locomotion need not be caused on the transmission model of causation. But locomotions, although caused without the transmission of an actuality of being located in any particular location, were understood to be embedded in larger patterns of causation which observe the principle of causational synonymy. It is precisely any such larger pattern of causation which is missing in the case of celestial motions.[51] Note furthermore that what we hear in Metaphysics 12.6, that the first mover moves as an object of love and striving,[52] comes perilously close to abandoning the claims of Physics bk. 8 to the effect that there is an unmoved mover serving as the efficient cause of the motions of the cosmos. Such doubts, however, should be dismissed. In these two contexts Aristotle gives distinct descriptions of some principle that is beyond the realm of physics. First, still connecting it to the framework of the Physics, he is characterizing a supra-physical entity without which the universe could not function or persist, and then, second, in the Metaphysics, he is offering an account of the causal efficacy of the supra-physical substance in terms of what this entity itself is. Small wonder that these two accounts situate the mode of operation of this entity in two different frames of physical causation.

Glossary of Aristotelian terms

  • action: poiein
  • activity: praxis
  • actuality: energeia or entelecheia
  • art, craft: technê
  • capacity: dunamis
  • cause: aitia or aition
  • change: kinêsis or metabolê
    to effect change or motion: kinein
    to undergo change or motion: kineisthai
    qualitative change: alloiôsis
    quantitative changes—growth: auxêsis; decay: phthisis
    locomotion: phora
  • to come to be: gignesthai
  • coming to be: genesis
  • force: bia
    forced: biâi
  • form: eidos or morphê
  • in so far as: hêi
  • genus, kind: genos
  • goal: telos
  • kind, species: eidos
  • known, knowable: gnôrimon
    more known, more knowable: gnôrimôteron
  • matter: hulê
  • magnitude: megethos
  • motion: kinêsis
  • nature: phusis
    natural: phusikos, phusei
    according to nature: kata phusin
    contrary to nature: para phusin
  • passion: paschein
  • to perish: phtheirein
  • perishing: phthora
  • place: pou (as one of the categories, literally: where) or topos
  • potentiality: dunamis
  • power: dunamis
  • quality: poion
  • quantity: poson
  • substance: ousia
  • time: pote (as one of the categories, literally: when) or chronos


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