Notes to The Definition of Art

1. “It is in works of art that nations have deposited the profoundest intuitions and ideas of their hearts; and fine art is frequently the key … to the understanding of their wisdom and their religion” (Lectures [1886, 13]).

2. If the contention that definitions of art shouldn’t focus on artworks seems outlandish, note that nothing in the title of the present essay requires that the primary focus of the definition be artworks.

3. The example, though not the analysis, is Searle’s (see Khalidi 2013). There are, moreover, social kinds that do not depend for their existence on people’s having thoughts about those kinds themselves. For example a person can be racist, or an economic state a recession, even if no one regards anyone as a racist or anything as a recession, and even if no one regards any conditions as sufficient for counting as racist or as a recession. (Thomason, “Foundations for a Social Ontology,” Protosociology 18-19, pp. 269-290) If art and art’s associated kinds are like that, then, contrary to every version of institutionalism, extra-institutional artworks can exist.

4. Lopes 2014, 110. Actually the degree of arbitrariness should not be exaggerated; Lopes also suggests that when new arts come into existence they do so on the basis of analogies to other arts, which presumably means that new arts share significant properties with existing ones.

Copyright © 2018 by
Thomas Adajian <>

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