Pierre Bayle

First published Fri Feb 7, 2003; substantive revision Thu Jan 12, 2023

Pierre Bayle (1647–1706), the “Philosopher of Rotterdam”, was a historian, literary critic, journalist, encyclopedist, French Protestant refugee, professor, and above all, philosopher. Although he is usually grouped today among the “minor figures” in the history of philosophy, Bayle was considered by the leading philosophers of his day as an equal, as one of the most erudite authors of his or any century. Upon Bayle’s death, G.W. Leibniz wrote: “he has departed from us, and such a loss is no small one, a writer whose learning and acumen few have equalled” (1710 [1952]: 68). The Preface to the Theodicy makes clear that it was Bayle who motivated Leibniz to write the only book he ever saw fit to publish. While Leibniz sought mainly to refute Bayle in that work, the next century of Enlightenment philosophes found inspiration in Bayle’s vast oeuvre. Bayle’s six-million word Historical and Critical Dictionary (1697; 1702) was so often cited in the eighteenth century that Ernst Cassirer has called it the “Arsenal of the Enlightenment”. Inventories of private European libraries have established the Dictionary as one of the bestsellers of its age. David Hume was clearly influenced by it; he told his friend Michael Ramsay in a letter of 1737 that if he wished to understand his writings he should read Descartes, Malebranche, Berkeley, and “some of the more metaphysical Articles of Bailes Dictionary; such as [those of] Zeno and Spinoza” (Hume 2007: 203–204).

Bayle made numerous positive contributions to the history of philosophy, such as arguments for the possibility of a virtuous atheist; for the possibility of a society of atheists that is morally superior to a society of Christians; for religious toleration; and for the widest possible freedom of conscience. But Bayle is usually remembered for the destructive force of his reasoning. In the sixth chapter of his Holy Family (1845), Karl Marx claimed that Bayle

was driven by religious doubt to doubt about metaphysics which was the support of that faith. He therefore critically investigated metaphysics from its very origin. He became its historian in order to write the history of its death. He mainly refuted Spinoza and Leibniz (1845 [1956]: 171).

Richard Popkin found in Bayle’s writings the culmination of the skeptical crisis in early modernity, calling Bayle a “superskeptic” (2003: 283) and crediting him with undermining the leading philosophical systems of his day. And Jonathan Israel gives partial credit for the origin of the Radical Enlightenment to Bayle’s critiques of tradition, superstitious, religion, and authority.

However, not all of Bayle’s readers would agree with these radical interpretations. The twentieth century’s most influential Bayle scholar, Elisabeth Labrousse, read as deeply into Bayle’s writings as anyone, and found therein the signs of a sincere, and at times traditional, Calvinist Christian. Other contemporary Bayle scholars, notably Jean-Luc Solère, have traced the core of some of Bayle’s most “modern” doctrines, such as his universal freedom of conscience and religious toleration, back to traditional Medieval philosophical notions of conscience and its rights. Contradictory interpretations of Bayle’s writings flourished in his day and have continued to appear in every century since his death, leaving historians of philosophy with the problem of the “Bayle enigma”.

1. Life and Works

Pierre Bayle was born on the 18th of November, 1647, in Le Carla (now Carla-Bayle), in the south of France. The Bayles were Huguenots (French Protestants), and Pierre’s father Jean was the minister of Carla. Although Jean and his wife Jane de Bruguière descended from good families, they were poor. Pierre had two brothers, Jacob his senior and Joseph his junior, and he had to wait for the former to complete his studies at the Protestant Academy of Puylaurens before the family could afford to send the next son to school. So, to his lifelong chagrin, Bayle did not start his formal education until around the age of twenty.

Despite his lack of early formal training, Bayle flourished but also grew bored at the Protestant Academy. He would complete the work assigned, and then in his leisure time delve into the writings of Plutarch and Montaigne, his favourite authors. Puylaurens could not satisfy his desire to compensate for what he perceived as a wasted youth, so Bayle set his sights on the nearby Jesuit university in Toulouse, one of the best schools in France. He enrolled there at the age of twenty-one, and soon thereafter converted to Catholicism. This was not required of Bayle; many Protestants studied at Jesuit universities. The conversion seems to have been sincere, the logical consequence in Bayle’s mind of losing so many theological debates to Catholics upon arriving in Toulouse. This conversion was considered a great acquisition by the Church; when Bayle defended his master’s theses, the most distinguished people in the city attended and celebrated his (and their) achievement. But their pride would be short-lived. Bayle’s debate skills apparently improved at Toulouse and he found replies to the Catholic objections that had once embarrassed him. He abjured the Catholic faith mere days after completing his studies. This made Bayle a “relapse”, and rendered him subject to severe penalties in France. He therefore fled to Geneva, where he took up the mind-numbing work of tutoring.

In 1675, Bayle cautiously returned to France to take up a more stimulating post as Professor of Philosophy at the Protestant Academy of Sedan, a position he owed in part to the support of Pierre Jurieu, who was Professor of Divinity. Bayle labored day and night to compose his System of Philosophy (OD IV: 199–520), the course in Logic, Ethics, Metaphysics, and Physics that Bayle delivered to his students in Sedan. The course is traditional in its structure, but contains some content that foreshadows aspects of Bayle’s later distinctive thought. However, Bayle’s first original philosophical work is his 1679 Objections to Pierre Poiret’s Rational Thoughts on God, the Soul, and Evil (OD IV: 146–161). In his Objections, Bayle engages for the first time with the issue that would dominate much of his career: the intractability of the problem of evil.

The Edict of Nantes, which had guaranteed some limited freedom of religion to Protestants in France since 1598, was not formally revoked by Louis XIV until 1685, but it was undermined by the Sun King repeatedly for years before the Revocation. One strategy for persecuting Protestants involved closing their Academies. Louis XIV started with Sedan, dissolving it by formal decree in 1681, leaving Bayle and Jurieu out of work. Both fled to Rotterdam where the city established an “Illustrious School” for them. Shortly after arriving in Rotterdam, Bayle published the first edition of the work that would eventually be known as his Various Thoughts on the Occasion of a Comet (Pensées diverses sur la comète; OD III: 3–160), which attacks superstition and proposes the possibilities of a virtuous atheist and a society of atheists. Like nearly all of his works, it was published pseudonymously, but soon it was known widely that Bayle was its author, and he earned the moniker, “Philosopher of Rotterdam”. Initially, Jurieu praised the work; years later, he would use its arguments on behalf of virtuous atheists as the basis for accusing Bayle himself of atheism.

As the situation of Protestants in France worsened, Bayle focused his literary efforts on attacking religious intolerance and developing arguments for freedom of conscience and toleration. His major works on these topics are the General Critique of Maimbourg’s History of Calvinism (1682; OD II: 1–160); New Letters by the Author of the General Critique of Maimbourg’s History of Calvinism (1685; OD II: 161–335); The Condition of Wholly Catholic France under Louis the Great (1686; OD II: 336–354); and his masterpiece, A Philosophical Commentary on These Words of Jesus Christ: Compel Them to Enter (1686–88; OD II: 355–444). The King himself ordered the first of these works to be burned. In 1685, Bayle’s older brother Jacob was imprisoned on account of this same work, since the French authorities could not find Pierre. Soon thereafter, Bayle’s father died of natural causes, then Jacob died in his prison cell from its poor conditions. Bayle learned of all of this around the same time he learned of the Revocation. Many Bayle scholars note a shift in tone and focus in Bayle’s works before and after this crisis year of 1685; some believe he lost all faith in God in these dire months.

The last twenty years of Bayle’s biography are indistinguishable from his bibliography. He wrote and published literally millions of words on nearly every philosophical topic. His international reputation was secured early in this period by the establishment of his journal of literary criticism, one of the first of its kinds, the News from the Republic of Letters (Nouvelles de la république des lettres; OD I: 1–760), which he edited, and authored nearly single-handedly, from 1684–1687. But just as Bayle’s star was rising, his once friend and soon-to-be enemy Jurieu did everything in his power to eclipse it. The late 1680s and early 1690s saw Bayle embroiled in bitter disputes with the jealous and vindictive Jurieu, whose accusations ultimately led to the suppression of Bayle’s Chair at the Illustrious School in 1693.

Bayle’s freedom from the burden of teaching threatened his financial security but allowed him to concentrate on the work for which he is most well-known today: the Historical and Critical Dictionary (first edition 1697). It was, and remains, unlike anything ever written before or after. Across the top of each page of this six-million-word encyclopedia, one finds short factual articles on topics arranged alphabetically, dealing mainly with ancient and modern authors, which display the vastness of Bayle’s mastery of history and literature. But roughly 80% of the work is contained in two-columns of footnotes that take up most of each page and that offer critical remarks on the slim factual content above. These footnotes, or “remarks”, give free rein to Bayle the revolutionary philosopher. In these remarks we find original objections to Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz; arguments on behalf of ancient skepticism; strong reformulations of Zeno’s paradoxes; metaphysical foundations for religious toleration; refutations of all known answers to the problem of evil; as well as obscene stories, hilarious anecdotes, feigned dialogues, and endless quotations of minor authors that Bayle thought his readers would simply enjoy. The work was a commercial success but also a scandal. The last five years of Bayle’s life were spent writing works that defended his character against various accusations against it made on the basis of the Dictionary. The influence of the work on subsequent Enlightenment philosophers, from Voltaire and Hume to Rousseau and Kant, is well established.

Bayle died in December, 1706, pen-in-hand, putting the final touches to his Dialogues of Maximus and Themistius (posthumous 1707; OD IV: 1–106), an apology of Bayle’s life and works in general, but in particular a defence of his most notorious thesis, that there is no solution to the problem of evil. Bayle allegedly declared shortly before dying that he was “a Christian philosopher”. Whether or not this confession was sincere, one thing that is beyond doubt is that Bayle’s philosophical reflection challenged the rational foundations of Christian thought more strongly than the reflection of any philosopher before him.

2. Society of Atheists

The philosophical work that earned Bayle an international reputation is the Various Thoughts on the Occasion of a Comet (1682), completed shortly before Louis XIV closed the Protestant Academy at Sedan where Bayle was employed as a Professor. The manuscript of the book accompanied Bayle in exile to Rotterdam and was soon published there. Bayle feared that the strange and complicated plan of the work would cause it to fail, but the opposite happened: the book’s originality and freshness led to a wide readership and an international reputation for Bayle. It is, nevertheless, a very strange and complicated book.

The nominal goal of the work is to refute superstitions about comets. The book is written as a series of letters to an unnamed Sorbonne theologian, each of which is dedicated to reasons for or against interpreting comets as signs of divine anger and forthcoming vengeance. Bayle offers a quick battery of purely philosophical arguments against interpreting comets as anything other than natural events, and then turns to his seventh “theological” argument, which is the focus of the bulk of the work. The main thrust of the argument is to show that if God sends comets as punishment or signs of his anger, then God is responsible for causing the most serious evil, idolatry, which God has said in the Bible in the worst of all sins. Since the entire world can see comets, and since comets do not communicate any clear message, each nation will interpret the comet in its own way. As a matter of historical fact, most nations will fall into some divine interpretation of the event, where “divine” refers to the local religion’s conception of the divine. The result is that if comets are indeed intended as divine messages, then their appearance will lead to a surge in global idol worship for which God will be responsible. If, on the other hand, comets are natural events, and it is human folly to interpret comets as divine messages, then God is innocent of any idol worship that results from the passing of space rocks.

In a surprising but logically seamless fashion characteristic of Bayle, all of this turns into an impassioned defence of the virtues of atheists and the possibility of founding a purely secular (non-religious) society. The Various Thoughts on a Comet is indeed about superstition, but it is not really about comets. The superstitions that Bayle spends the vast majority of the book targeting are, first, that belief in God is necessary to live a moral life, and second, that religion is necessary to keep society peaceful and lawful. Just as Bayle refuted superstitions about comets by demonstrating that they are purely natural, predictable events, so too, Bayle refutes superstitions about atheists by demonstrating that morality and law can and should be treated as purely natural, predictable aspects of human behaviour, based largely in education and temperament.

Bayle’s refutation of superstitions about atheism relies on a mix of historical fact, common sense, and philosophical argument. The relevant historical facts are that there have been, in every age, atheists noted for their virtue. In antiquity, Bayle points to Diagoras, Theodorus, Euhemerus, Nicanor, Hippo, and Epicurus. Closer to his own time, Bayle’s favourite example is Lucilio Vanini, renowned for his virtue, but who was tortured and then burned at the stake in 1619 for denying the existence of God. This leads to the ultimate principle of Bayle’s naturalized morality: people do not act on the basis of their principles. Whether these are religious principles or secular moral principles makes no difference: actions do not spring from belief or faith. Bayle takes this as an empirical fact and backs it up with historical examples. The real motives of human action are custom, education, and passion, all of which manifest themselves as hard-to-shake habits.

Thus we see that from the fact that a man has no religion it does not follow necessarily that he will be led to every sort of crime or to every sort of pleasure. It follows only that he will be led to the things to which his temperament and his turn of mind make him sensitive. (OD III: 113)

Atheists can live just as calmly, wisely, generously, courageously, and in general, virtuously as religious believers because all of these character traits spring from temperament, education, and custom, not from principles or judgments or faith. Therefore, a society comprised entirely of atheists can be a lawful, well-ordered place, assuming the atheist citizens are raised and educated properly. In fact, Bayle suggests in the most controversial passages of the Various Thoughts on a Comet that an atheist society may even be more peaceful than any religious society. That is because religion has a natural tendency to inflame the worst passions in human nature:

We know the impression made on people’s minds by the idea that they are fighting for the preservation of their temples and altars…; how courageous and bold we become when we fixate on the hope of conquering others by means of God’s protection, and when we are animated by the natural aversion we have for the enemies of our beliefs. (OD III: 84)

Nobody can deny that religion has been an important motive of war and violence in human history. Since atheists lack religion, they should live quieter lives.

The Various Thoughts on a Comet has been interpreted as a disinterested refutation of various widespread (then and now) superstitions about atheism, as a focused attack on the Catholic persecution of Calvinists in France (Rex 1965), and as an apology for atheism (Mori 1999 [2020]). Bayle insisted in his sequels to the work, the Addition to the Various Thoughts (1686; OD III: 161–186), and the Continuation of the Various Thoughts (1705; OD III: 187–417), that the goal of the work was simply to prove that atheism is no worse than idolatry, and that religious believers do not have a monopoly on moral behaviour. These were, from Bayle’s point of view, obvious historical facts that intellectual integrity requires us to admit.

3. Freedom of Conscience

Everything that Bayle wrote on religious toleration is either a defence or an elaboration of the following argument, which first appeared in Bayle’s General Critique of Maimbourg’s History of Calvinism (1682):

[I]f the true religion has some right to oppress others, then every religion has this same right, provided that it is persuaded that it is God’s True Church. But it is false and impious that every religion has the right to oppress, so it follows that God has not given to his Church any way other than persuasion and peaceful instruction to bring people to the true faith. Consequently, Christian Princes do not have any greater or lesser right to torment people over matters of religion. (OD II: 105)

This argument was originally intended as an objection to Maimbourg’s argument that Catholic Sovereigns have the right to oppress Protestants in their realms, but not vice versa, and therefore the persecution of Calvinists by Louis XIV was just, while the persecution of Catholics elsewhere was unjust. Despite this narrow original purpose, Bayle’s claim eventually grew in scope to become the foundation of two of Bayle’s most well-known theses: the universal right to freedom of conscience, and the necessity of religious toleration.

Bayle’s fullest and clearest defence of the right to freedom of conscience appears in his sequel to the General Critique of Maimbourg’s History of Calvinism, namely the New Letters by the Author of the General Critique of Maimbourg’s History of Calvinism (1685). In the Ninth Letter, Bayle expands and defends the first part of the argument quoted above, namely that

if the true religion has some right to oppress others, then every religion has this same right, provided that it is persuaded that it is God’s True Church.

Bayle reports that this claim was considered an “impious paradox” by many readers. Bayle defends the claim in two steps. The first step is to demonstrate that individuals have the right and the duty to espouse any proposition that appears true to them after a careful examination. The second step is to demonstrate that everyone has the right and the duty to act on the basis of whatever apparent truths they have espoused. In other words, individuals have the right and the duty to form and to act on the basis of conscience. Following a Medieval tradition, Bayle understood conscience to be first, a set of intuited moral truths (synderesis), and second, practical judgments made on the basis of these moral truths (conscientia).

Bayle employs an example to illustrate these steps of his argument for freedom of conscience. He imagines a master who leaves his home for a long time in the care of a servant, and who orders the servant not to allow anyone to enter the home unless they produce a certificate with a particular insignia: anyone who produces such a certificate must be given entry, but anyone who lacks the certificate must be turned away. The example is an analogy meant to represent the human mind’s relationships to God and the truth. God has left minds in the care of God’s servants, individual humans. We have been ordered by God to allow into our minds—to believe—only those propositions that bear the criterion of truth, which Bayle always considered to be a certain clarity and distinctness, or “evidence” as he called it. In order to obey God, we must accept all evident propositions as true and reject all non-evident propositions as false. Just as the servant has the right and duty in the master’s absence to decide what is an authentic certificate and what is not, so too individual humans have the right and duty to decide what is evident and what is not. This is the right and duty to form our individual consciences, to decide what is morally good and true. And just as the servant has the right and duty subsequently to act on their inspection of certificates, so too humans have the right and duty to act on the basis of whatever has appeared true to them. This is the right and duty to act conscientiously. The Cartesian roots of Bayle’s epistemology and ethics of belief are clear.

The problem arises when, for example, the master’s own son arrives at the home, but lacks the required certificate; or when a bandit arrives at the home bearing a certificate that he found or that he forged. In other words, what should we do when the objective truth does not appear evident, or when falsehoods appear evident to us? Bayle takes it to be a historical fact that these cases arise frequently, and he answers that we must reject the truth and believe the falsehood:

[T]he rights that God has given to the truth depend on a condition that is so absolutely necessary, that in the absence of this condition one could not render the least homage to the truth without committing a crime. Since by this condition we can mean nothing other than that God demands that we love and respect the truth provided that we know it, it is evident that, if the truth is unknown to us, it loses all its rights over us; and that, if error appears to us in the form of the truth, then it acquires all rights over us. For, since it would displease God if we respected the truth that we thought was a lie, therefore it would also offend him if we did not respect a lie that we believed was the truth. (OD II: 219)

During the absence of the master, the servant has a duty to obey the master’s orders: to admit those with a certificate, and to reject those without a certificate. The servant must do due diligence to ensure the certificates are authentic. However, if after the servant has inspected the certificate, he is convinced that a forged certificate is authentic, or that an authentic certificate is forged, then the servant has no recourse: he must act on his own best judgment until the master returns. Even though it is objectively bad to allow a bandit into the home, nevertheless, if the bandit’s certificate is authentic or a compelling forgery, then the servant has the duty to grant the bandit entry into the home. So too, human beings must act on the basis of their individual judgment—their conscience—as long as God is invisible and silent, which God always seems to be. In the master’s absence, the servant is effectively the master. So too in God’s apparent absence, individual human beings are masters of their own minds and actions, for there is nobody else who can decide for us what is evident and what is not. Evidence, as Bayle conceives it, is an inherently individual matter, since it is a kind of appearance to an individual mind. Since the individual authority over one’s mind and actions is based in a command of God, and since God is a higher authority than any Sovereign, the Sovereign must respect the individual’s freedom to obey God’s commands as they see fit. The Sovereign must respect human autonomy, because it is God’s will. Bayle’s argument for freedom of conscience provides a clear link between Cartesian epistemology and later Kantian moral autonomy.

4. Religious Toleration

Bayle’s argument for freedom of conscience does not provide a sufficient reason for sovereigns to tolerate minority religions in their realms. Freedom of conscience establishes that everyone has the same right and duty to believe whatever appears true to them, and to act on the basis of apparently true beliefs. However, it is possible that many religious people will believe that persecuting other religions is a morally good action. Perhaps the Sovereign believes that it is their own God-given duty to persecute others. It will follow from Bayle’s argument for the freedom of conscience that all of these religious people will have the same right and duty to persecute one another. The result will be a morally justified war of all against all. Bayle devotes his magnus opus on religious toleration, A Philosophical Commentary on These Words of Jesus Christ: Compel Them to Enter (1686–88), to forestalling this unhappy consequence of his doctrine of freedom of conscience.

A universal religious war will result from Bayle’s doctrine of freedom of conscience only if religious believers think they have a right and duty to persecute other religions. This will happen only if believers think that God has commanded persecution, or in the absence of any clear direction from God, that the proposition “persecuting other religions is morally good” is evidently true after careful rational inspection. Bayle’s Philosophical Commentary therefore argues that God has not commanded persecution, and that persecuting other religions cannot appear good to any sincere rational person after careful examination. The argumentative strategy of the book is in fact to use the second claim to support the first: because persecution cannot appear good to any sincere rational person, therefore God has not commanded persecution.

The problem with Bayle’s argument is that there is a long tradition within Christianity of interpreting the Gospel of Luke, chapter 14, verse 23—which contains the words “Compel them to enter”—as a divine command to persecute. The context of this passage is the parable of the banquet, in which a master commands his servants to invite guests into his home to enjoy a feast. The servant reports that the invited guests are too busy. So, the master orders the servant to go out into the highways and byways and compel people to enter his home to enjoy the feast. The passage had been taken by Catholics since St. Augustine to justify forcing non-Catholics to join the Church.

Bayle responds to this argument for persecution by insisting that Scripture requires careful interpretation, and interpretation requires a criterion. The first chapter of the Philosophical Commentary establishes that the only possible criterion of the interpretation of Scripture is individual conscience and rational examination:

I am very persuaded that before God made Adam hear any voice to teach him what he should do, God had already spoken to Adam interiorly, by making him see the vast and immense idea of a supremely perfect Being, and the eternal laws of justice and equity. (OD II: 369)

Therefore, in order to decide whether Luke 14:23 is a divine command to persecute, Bayle proposes to investigate whether persecution is consistent with our perception of the eternal laws of justice and equity. In other words, the question of whether God has commanded persecution boils down to the question whether an obligation to persecute can be considered an evidently good command from the perspective of reason.

Bayle anticipates Kant once again in the first chapter of the Philosophical Commentary where he establishes a test to determine what should be considered an eternal law of justice:

[A]nyone who wants to know distinctly the natural light with respect to morality should elevate himself above his own personal interest, and above the customs of his country, and should ask himself in general whether the action is just by considering this: if the action in question were proposed in a country where it had never been the custom, and where people were free to adopt or not to adopt the proposed action, would the people in that country find, upon careful examination, that the action was just enough to merit adoption? (OD II: 368–369).

Like Kant’s categorical imperative, this test requires us to consider morality as a form of legislation over a possible kingdom of people who are guided by reason and examination. Moral laws that pass this test will be universal: anyone in any land will be capable of appreciating their worth and will find the laws worthy of adoption. Whether or not a moral command is evident or not depends on whether or not it can be adopted universally by all people. In order to apply this test, a clear maxim must be articulated. The maxim Bayle considers throughout the Philosophical Commentary is this: “Compelling religious heretics to enter the true Church is just”. The meaning of “compelling to enter” that motivates Bayle’s arguments is one that he learned first-hand while living in France: Compulsion is violence. It is dragooning. It is forced conversions. It is imprisonment. It is confiscation of material goods. It is expelling one from home and country if they continue to refuse the “invitation”. It is barring certain people from employment, school, or office. It is Bayle’s brother dying in a damp basement after being imprisoned unjustly by Catholics. It is Bayle himself needing to change the spelling of his last name while in France and eventually to live as a refugee in Rotterdam for thinking twice about Catholicism. When put this way, one hardly needs an argument against such compulsion. To some extent, that’s Bayle’s point: persecution is evidently bad, not good. But he offers nine arguments against persecution anyway.

Religious persecution does not pass Bayle’s proto-Kantian categorical imperative test, and therefore Luke 14:23 must not be interpreted as a command to persecute. Why not? The First Part of the Philosophical Commentary offers nine reasons why persecution fails the test. What most of these arguments have in common—and again the proto-Kantian tone of the arguments cannot be overstated—is the claim that persecution is morally wrong because it leads Christians to contradict themselves. The essence of Baylean morality that emerges from these arguments is integrity: consistency in one’s beliefs and between one’s beliefs and actions. Persecution is morally wrong because it necessarily entails internal inconsistency: a lack of integrity. The first argument that Bayle offers against persecution in Part 1, chapter 2, of the Philosophical Commentary is also the best. Persecutors wish to bring people into the one true Church, presumably because they want these people to love God properly. To love God properly is to form correct judgments about God and to have the right movements of the will toward God (such as love). However, the actions of persecutors in Bayle’s day, like “threats, imprisonment, exile, beatings, torture” (OD II: 371), cannot possibly give rise to true knowledge and sincere love of God; on the contrary, persecutors’ actions are far better suited to making people hate God. Persecutors cannot possibly report sincerely that they are motivated to persecute by the desire to spread the love and knowledge of God. Persecutors lie to themselves, to their victims, and to God.

Bayle scholars have grappled for a long time with this seemingly dogmatic assertion of Bayle, who is usually more circumspect, if not downright skeptical. What if there was a sincere persecutor who, after long examination of Luke 14:23 and the tradition of biblical commentary surrounding it, came to the conscientious conviction that God wished him to use force to bring heterodox people into conformity with what the persecutor believes is the one true Church? Then does it not follow from Bayle’s doctrine of the freedom of conscience that the persecutor must persecute? This is known as the “Persecutor Paradox” or “Sincere Persecutor Aporia” (see Solère 2016). Some scholars believe that this objection undermines the foundation of Bayle’s moral argument for toleration, and requires Bayle to have recourse to a legal or political solution to intolerance (Mori 1999 [2020]). Others believe that Bayle offers a valid response to the objection, or that the objection is not very strong in the first place. The debate remains open.

5. Criterion of Truth and Skepticism

Bayle never referred to himself as a skeptic, he never defended skepticism or skeptics at any length in his own voice, and his works establish far more positive theses than you would expect from the pen of a skeptic. Nevertheless, the oldest interpretation of Bayle is that he was a skeptic. In Bayle’s day, the title “skeptic” or “Pyrrhonist” was usually an insult only slightly less offensive than another one frequently hurled at Bayle: “atheist”. However, even Bayle’s first and greatest admirers freely admitted there was a skeptical character to Bayle’s writings. In his Poem on the Lisbon Earthquake, Voltaire said of Bayle:

Wise enough and great enough to live without a system, Bayle destroys all systems and then turns against himself. He is like Samson, buried with his enemy Philistines under the rubble of a Temple toppled by his own hands.

Later admirers, like Richard Popkin, also view Bayle as a skeptic, but praise him for his ingenious use of this ancient philosophical methodology (Popkin 2003). Most recent debates focus on the particular kind of skepticism employed by Bayle: Pyrrhonian, Academic, or other (Maia Neto 1999). A few Bayle scholars deny that Bayle was a skeptic of any sort (McKenna 2015).

Putting labels aside, the clearest view of Bayle’s connection to skepticism comes from focusing on what he wrote concerning the criterion of truth. The skeptical interpretation of Bayle gets support from the article “Pyrrho” in the Historical and Critical Dictionary. A famous footnote to this article features a discussion between two Catholic abbots about the possibility of defeating skeptics in debate. The “philosophical abbot”, who is really a skeptic, argues that victory can never be won over skeptics:

Right away the philosophical abbot declared to the other that in order to hope for some victory over a skeptic, it is necessary to prove to him before anything else that the truth is recognizable with certainty by some marks. We usually call these marks the criterion of truth. You will rightly claim that evidence is the criterion of the truth; for if evidence is not this criterion, then nothing would be. “So be it”, the skeptic will respond, “I have been waiting for you here all along; I will show you that there are things you reject as false that possess the highest degree of evidence”. (Dictionary, “Pyrrho”, remark B)

The philosophical abbot proceeds to demonstrate that the clearest, most evident axioms of metaphysics are proven false by certain fundamental tenets of the Christian faith, which proves that evidence and truth do not always go hand-in-hand. For example, the Trinity forces us to reject the proposition that “if two things are identical to a third, then they are identical to each other”, because both God the Father and God the Son are identical to God, but the Father is not identical to the Son. Therefore, propositions can be both supremely evident and false, thereby undermining the claim that evidence is the criterion of truth.

There are two reasons not to accept the article “Pyrrho” as definitive proof that Bayle was a skeptic. First, the rejection of the criterion of truth in this passage requires the assumption that the Trinity, and other Christian dogmas, are true. At best, therefore, the article demonstrates that there is a conflict between faith and reason, not that there is no certainty in philosophy. Many religious thinkers, including many Calvinist theologians, have held this same position without being considered skeptics. The second reason is that, in various later works, Bayle revisits the issue of the criterion of truth in his own voice and, rather than reject the criterion like the skeptical abbot did, supports a more nuanced view that evidence is a reliable, but merely probable criterion of truth. Like Descartes, Bayle argues that one should not assent in the absence of evidence. But unlike Descartes, Bayle argues that evidence comes in degrees and its presence does not guarantee the truth. These issues were the main focus of the debate between Bayle and Jean Le Clerc in Bayle’s last years, and are dealt with at length in the first part of the Dialogues of Maximus and Themistius (Bayle 1707 [2016]). Bayle defends his position on the criterion of truth against the accusation of skepticism, so there is good reason not to consider him a skeptic, and not to align his own views with those of his imagined philosophical abbot in the Dictionary.

6. Problem of Evil

If a perfectly good and all-powerful God alone created everything in the universe, then why do pain, moral wickedness, and so many varieties of imperfection exist? Philosophers today refer to the family of issues raised by this question as “the problem of evil”. There is perhaps no thesis for which Bayle is more well-known than the skeptical claim that there is no rational solution to the problem of evil. The centerpiece of any discussion of Bayle and the problem of evil must be the Dictionary, particularly the articles “Manicheans” and “Paulicians” of the first edition, and the “Clarification on the Manicheans” of the second. It is in these texts that Bayle attempts to refute every theodicy he had yet encountered, thereby demonstrating the incapacity of reason, especially within the confines of Christian dogma, to explain the origin of evil in a way that does not make God its sole author. The suggestion that reason leads us ineluctably to the conclusion that God is morally responsible for all evil was found so scandalous that Bayle was forced to spend the last decade of his life defending himself against charges of atheism and even sedition on account of it. The Rationalist theologians Jean Le Clerc and Isaac Jaquelot were Bayle’s principal adversaries, and their objections to Bayle, as well as their attempts at theodicy, prompted him to expand his skeptical reflections on evil in subsequent books, including the Responses to a Provincial’s Questions, and the posthumous Dialogues of Maximus and Themistius. These final works were the occasional cause of Leibniz’s Theodicy (1710), as well as the inspiration for (and source for many of the arguments of) Voltaire’s satirical novella, Candide (1759), several chapters of Hume’s Dialogues concerning Natural Religion (1779), and possibly Kant’s late essay, On the Miscarriage of All Philosophical Trials in Theodicy (1791).

Bayle’s controversial “doctrine” on the problem of evil that caused so much commotion was carefully summarized by Bayle himself in three points:

  1. The natural light and revelation teach us clearly that there is only one principle of all things, and that this principle is infinitely perfect;
  2. The way of reconciling the moral and physical evil of humanity with all the attributes of this single, infinitely perfect principle of all things surpasses our philosophical lights, such that the Manichean objections leave us with difficulties that human reason cannot resolve;
  3. Nevertheless, it is necessary to believe firmly what the natural light and revelation teach us about the unity and infinite perfection of God, just as it is necessary to believe by faith and submission to divine authority the mysteries of the Trinity and the Incarnation. (OD III: 992b–993a)

The first principle was a common supposition in Bayle’s day, and so obviously caused no controversy. Nevertheless, Bayle argued on behalf of the principle in “Manicheans”, remark D, in passages that render more precise the nature of Bayle’s skepticism about theodicy. Bayle imagines a monotheist philosopher, Melissus, arguing with a dualist philosopher, Zoroaster, over the origin of evil. The dispute begins with a contest over a priori arguments. In other words, the first question raised is whether one principle of creation or two is most in accord with ideas of pure reason. Melissus wins this particular debate, in Bayle’s view, because it is more agreeable to a priori reason to suppose that there is just one necessary and infinitely perfect being responsible for the creation of the universe than to suppose that there are two warring gods, one good and the other evil (which is the view of Bayle’s fictionalized Zoroaster). Melissus’ monotheism is, in short, simpler and more elegant than Zoroaster’s dualism.

The contentious elements of Bayle’s doctrine begin to surface when the debate then turns to a posteriori reasons; that is, once the question shifts away from the beauty of the theory to its ability to account for the observable phenomena. In this debate Melissus fares worse than his interlocutor, since human reason finds

the manner in which evil was introduced under the empire of a sovereign being, infinitely good, infinitely holy, and infinitely powerful … not only inexplicable, but even incomprehensible; and everything that is opposed to the reasons why this being permitted evil is more agreeable to the natural light and to the ideas of order than these reasons are. (Dictionary, “Paulicians”, remark E)

Simplicity and elegance are now on the side of Zoroaster (and the Manichean tradition that followed him, if Bayle’s history is correct), for whom all the good in the world is traceable to a perfectly benevolent deity, while all the evil is the effect of his malevolent enemy. Therefore, whereas a priori reason and Christian Scripture point toward monotheism (Bayle’s first principle), a posteriori reason raises perpetual difficulties for this picture in light of the way the world actually is (Bayle’s second principle).

Some of the most notorious remarks in the Dictionary are those in which Bayle details how a dualist could refute the traditional Christian accounts of the origin of evil, most of which begin from the story of the Fall of Adam and Eve in the Garden of Eden. Bayle begins his critique by asking how such a Fall was even metaphysically possible. If Adam and Eve were created wholly good, then they should not have had the capacity to sin, since such a capacity is hardly a good quality. But supposing an answer to this worry could be given, Bayle moves on to demand why God would permit the possibility of sin to reduce to an actual sin, considering the terrible consequences that befell humanity as a result of it. The most common response to this question was that God had given human beings free will, the most generous divine gift of all, and the autonomy of which God willed to respect in order to make true worship and love of him possible. Bayle’s response again focuses on the metaphysical possibility of the explanation: can a creature that derives all its being from God ever act in a manner that is truly free? Even supposing an account of freedom could be offered to answer this question, Bayle still finds the free-will defence unsatisfying on account of God’s alleged omniscience. Surely God foresaw the first sin of humankind from all eternity, yet he created humans with freedom anyway. Is this not comparable, Bayle asks, to supplying a criminal with a knife knowing full-well that he will commit murder with it? If so, the responsibility for the murder falls at least partially on the supplier of the weapon. But perhaps God allowed humans to fall so that he could send his Son to redeem them. To this last resort of the Christians—the felix culpa theodicy—Bayle observes that God in this case would resemble a father who allowed his son to break his arm (though he could have prevented it) just so that he could display his skill at cast-making to the neighbors. Or God would be like a king who permitted a deadly uprising just so he could demonstrate his ability to quell it. God would not appear infinitely perfect on any of these hypotheses.

Such reflections demonstrate the need for Bayle’s third principle (assuming that one is interested in upholding Christian monotheism). The origin of evil, like the Trinity, is a mystery fraught with endless difficulties. On Bayle’s view of religious mysteries, which he lays out at the beginning of his Clarification on the Manicheans, philosophical objections to mysteries are nothing troubling, but merely serve to confirm that God’s mind infinitely surpasses human minds. If there were no insoluble philosophical objections to mysteries, then there would be nothing mysterious about the doctrines in question-reason could answer every difficulty, and could claim equality with God’s own mind. For these reasons Bayle conflated the traditional categories of “above reason” and “against reason”, claiming that mysteries were necessarily both. Reason is consequently useless, even pernicious, as a basis for belief in the mysteries, and so must be replaced by simple faith (Bayle’s third principle).

Bayle’s most able philosophical critic on these issues during his lifetime was Le Clerc, who argued that Bayle’s doctrine on the problem of evil was intentionally subversive of religion. The basis of Le Clerc’s accusation of atheism against Bayle was his claim that it is not psychologically possible to continue to believe some doctrine after one has conceded that it is met with insoluble difficulties. If this psychology of belief were true, then the second principle of Bayle’s doctrine would destroy belief in monotheism because, by supposition, it would be impossible to believe in the unity of God after acknowledging the irresistible force of the Manicheans’ objections. In response to Le Clerc, Bayle argued in his posthumous Dialogues of Maximus and Themistius that it is not only psychologically possible to believe in a proposition that has been defeated in argument, but also very common. Bayle points to the debate over the continuum to illustrate his thesis. Those engaged in the debate over whether lines are infinitely divisible or ultimately reducible to points of finite size recognize that there are insoluble paradoxes opposed to each point of view. Yet there are adherents of both views all the same, which demonstrates, by historical fact, that it is possible to believe in a proposition (e.g., “lines are infinitely divisible”) despite recognizing unanswerable difficulties (e.g., Zeno’s paradoxes). Far from a recommendation of adopting irrational fideism in response to the problem of evil, Bayle therefore believed he was urging the same rational retreat from certain debates that philosophers are commonly forced into when they argue about labyrinthine philosophical topics like the continuum.

7. Bayle Enigma

There are few authors in the early modern period whose works are more difficult than those of Bayle to interpret on even the most basic level. What is the ultimate conclusion of any particular work by Bayle? What are the main arguments? When is Bayle writing in his own voice and when is he writing in the voice of an imagined character? What are the appropriate contexts in which to read Bayle’s works? Who were the intended audiences? These can be straightforward questions to answer when reading philosophical authors; most authors answer the questions themselves in a Preface. However, Bayle usually wrote books anonymously for fictional audiences with explicit aims that were often mere pretences for the real purpose behind his books. If there is any single, overarching thesis of any of his works, it is buried very deeply indeed. Taking Bayle’s oeuvre as a whole, the interpretive difficulties are even more challenging. Thomas Lennon gives the most memorable statement of this problem that is known as the “Bayle Enigma”:

To take just the twentieth-century literature, the suggestions are that Bayle was fundamentally a positivist, an atheist, a deist, a skeptic, a fideist, a Socinian, a liberal Calvinist, a conservative Calvinist, a libertine, a Judaizing Christian, a Judaeo-Christian, or even a secret Jew, a Manichean, an existentialist…to the point that it is tempting to conclude that these commentators cannot have been talking about the same author, or at least that they have not used the same texts. There can be overlap among these classifications, so that not all of the interpretations entirely exclude one another. Implausible as it may seem, moreover, all of these suggestions have at least some plausibility. (Lennon 1999: 15)

“The Bayle Enigma” is the term used to denote the difficulty one faces when trying to label or to categorize or to interpret Bayle’s works as a whole or individually. The difficulty arises from the fact that numerous labels seem to fit Bayle’s writings, but some of these labels are mutually exclusive. It is tempting to dismiss the Enigma on the basis that all great authors are complex and write works with multiple layers of meaning: why do we need to label authors anyway? But in the case of Bayle, the problem is that his works are not just complex, but seemingly self-contradictory. In one and the same book, and even in one and the same argument, Bayle might be advocating faith in God or he might be undermining belief in the existence of God—it depends how you read him. Some engagement with the Bayle Enigma is therefore necessary just to enter into Bayle’s works on the most elementary level.

Four global interpretations of Bayle’s works have recurred since his death over three centuries ago: the atheist reading, the skeptical reading, the Christian-fideist reading, and the Rationalist reading. These are by no means the only possible interpretations of Bayle’s writings; they are just the most common readings because they are the most plausible. Bayle’s enemy Jurieu was the first to launch the accusation of atheism against Bayle in his own lifetime, making his case largely on the basis of the Various Thoughts on a Comet with its elaborate defences of the virtuous atheist and the Society of Atheists. The most recent and influential interpreter to find a commitment to atheism in Bayle’s works is Gianluca Mori, whose 1999 Bayle philosophe argues that “[a]ll the roads of the philosophical reflection of Bayle lead to atheism” (Mori 1999 [2020: 189]). The main evidence of Bayle’s atheism, according to Mori, is his obsession with the problem of evil throughout his life, and in particular his contention that there is no system of Christian thought that can resolve this problem. The everyday experience of every human being, no matter how privileged they are, provides ample evidence that the universe is not the work of an infinitely good creator. Any theodicy that attempts to reconcile the experiences of pain and sin with the existence of an infinitely good creator will have to limit that creator in some way, either in its power, its knowledge, or its uniqueness, to the point that the creator will cease to resemble anything worthy of the name “God”. According to Mori, the simplest way to read Bayle’s hundreds of thousands of published words devoted to the problem of evil is to read them as an argument that God does not exist.

Mori’s interpretation of Bayle is compelling, especially today when the problem of evil is routinely viewed not only as an argument, but as the most powerful argument, against the existence of the Abrahamic God. However, there are at least two problems with Mori’s interpretation taken broadly. The first is that Bayle was consistent and adamant throughout his career that the conclusion of his reflection on the problem of evil is not that God does not exist, but that reason is too weak to reconcile the existence of a perfect God with the human experience of evil. This conclusion is, on the surface at least, skeptical rather than atheistic. For Bayle, the problem of evil is just another example of human reason’s incapacity to resolve problems involving the concepts of infinity and unity. Intractable difficulties relating to infinite divisibility, like Zeno’s paradoxes, and persistent problems in explaining the union of mind and body in a single human person are non-theological examples in Bayle’s thought of the failure of reason in matters relating to infinity and unity. The problem of evil, on the skeptical reading of Bayle, is just Bayle’s favorite theological argument for the limits of reason.

According to the Christian-fideist reading, the problem of evil is Bayle’s main tool for displaying to readers the need for faith in addition to reason. Calvin and Jurieu were two thinkers whose commitments to Christianity were never questioned and who, prior to Bayle, argued in print that human reason could not resolve all the difficulties relating to evil. Seen in this context, Bayle’s writings on evil are not original attacks on theism, as Mori reads them, but rather traditional Calvinist attacks on reason with the aim of pointing the way to faith. Elisabeth Labrousse (1964) and Walter Rex (1965) demonstrate the ways in which all of Bayle’s writings can be illuminated by reading them in the context of Christian polemics, mainly between Calvinists and Catholics. According to Labrousse and Rex, Bayle was an opponent not of Christianity in general, but only of one branch of Christianity—Roman Catholicism.

Another clarifying context for understanding much of Bayle’s philosophical reflection is Rationalism. Todd Ryan (2009) and Antony McKenna (2015) have shown that Bayle was not skeptical of all philosophical dogmas. He remained committed, in Ryan’s view, to a variety of specific Cartesian metaphysical doctrines, like mind-body dualism, the ontology of substance, and matter as extension, throughout his career. In McKenna’s view, Bayle remained committed to the rational certainty of “common notions” of reason, especially in the domains of metaphysics and morality. These are first principles that form the basis of all other reasoning, including theological reasoning; without these principles, human reason is not only weak but entirely silent. Bayle was, therefore, a Rationalist on this reading.

What do we make of an author who might have been an atheist or a Christian, depending on how you read him; or who might have been a skeptic or a Rationalist, depending on your perspective? This is the main outstanding problem in the Bayle literature. One compelling solution is provided by Lennon’s 1999 Reading Bayle. Lennon, following the pioneering work of José R. Maia Neto (1999), interprets Bayle’s oeuvre in the light of a commitment to Academic integrity as it was expressed by Cicero in his writings on the Academic skeptics. The goal of this integrity is to keep one’s power of judgment untrammelled; it is to keep an open mind. The method the Academics used to achieve this kind of intellectual freedom was the rigorous presentation of both sides of a debate; to express competing positions not as a lawyer would do, with the goal of making one side look weaker than the other, but as a reporter would do, allowing each side to make its best case in its own words. Lennon finds a commitment to these goals and methods especially in the Dictionary, where Bayle quotes like a reporter far more than he argues like a lawyer. The power of this Academic reading of Bayle is that it explains why Bayle appears to contradict himself. The problem arises because readers of Bayle fail to recognize that Bayle did not personally believe everything he wrote; sometimes he was merely laying out somebody else’s position for the sake of balancing arguments and promoting Academic freedom of judgment. Just as God, the author of creation, allows creatures to conflict with each other and even to oppose God’s owns plans for creation, so too Bayle, the author of a vast oeuvre, allows the characters and philosophical theses in his works to conflict with each other and even to oppose Bayle’s own stated aims in his works. The Bayle enigma, just like Bayle’s beloved problem of evil, may well be insoluble because of the role played in each by the conflict between authorial design and human freedom.


A bibliography of all Bayle’s primary literature and most secondary literature up to 2020 is contained in Mori 1999 [2020].

A. Primary Literature

A.1 French

  • Bayle, Pierre, 1697, Dictionaire historique et critique, par Monsieur Bayle, two volumes, Rotterdam: R. Leers.

    [First edition of Bayle’s Dictionary.]

  • –––, 1702, Dictionaire historique et critique, par Monsieur Bayle, seconde édition, revue, corrigée et augmentée par l’auteur, three volumes, Rotterdam: R. Leers.

    [Second edition of the Dictionary, the last that Bayle lived to see published.]

  • [Dictionary] –––, 1740, Dictionaire historique et critique, par Mr. Pierre Bayle, Cinquième édition, four volumes, Amsterdam: P. Brunel et al.

    [The fifth edition of Bayle’s Dictionary is the one most often cited by Bayle scholars on account of its reliability. It includes revisions and additions that Bayle made before his death that were not included in the second edition.]

  • [OD] –––, Oeuvres diverses, nine volumes, edited by Elisabeth Labrousse, Hildesheim: G. Olms, 1964–1990.

    [The first four volumes consist of all of Bayle’s major works, besides the Dictionary. The next five volumes include mainly works by Bayle’s contemporaries that provide helpful context for reading Bayle.]

  • –––, Correspondance de Pierre Bayle, Fifteen volumes, edited by Élisabeth Labrousse, Antony McKenna, et al., Oxford: Voltaire Foundation, 1999–2017.

    [The most complete active and passive correspondence of Bayle, along with helpful notes.]

  • –––, Bayle Corpus–Oeuvres completes, edited by Antony McKenna and Gianluca Mori, Classiques Garnier Numérique, 2012.

    [A digital, searchable copy of the Oeuvres diverses, Dictionaire, and other supplemental works by Bayle.]

A.2 English Translation

  • Bayle, Pierre, 1734 (2nd ed.), The Dictionary Historical and Critical of Mr Peter Bayle, P. Desmaizeaux (trans.), London: Knapton et al..

    [A reliable and complete translation of Bayle’s magnum opus, reprinted in 1984 from New York: Garland Publishing.]

  • –––, 1991, Historical and Critical Dictionary: Selections, Richard H. Popkin (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett.

    [A useful translation of some of the philosophically most important material from the Dictionary.]

  • –––, 2000, Bayle: Political Writings, Sally L. Jenkinson (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139163866

    [A selection of articles from the Dictionary that portrays Bayle as primarily a political thinker.]

  • –––, 2000, Various Thoughts on the Occasion of a Comet, Robert Bartlett (trans.), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.

    [The first English translation of the Pensées diverses since 1708. Includes a helpful introduction and supplementary notes.]

  • –––, 1708 [2000], A Philosophical Commentary on These Words of the Gospel, Luke 14:23, “Compel Them to Come In, That My House May Be Full”, reprinted and introduced by John Kilcullen and Chandran Kukathas, Indianapolis: Liberty Fund. [Bayle 1708 available online]

    [A quaint but reliable and unabridged translation of the Commentaire Philosophique. The text is from the 1708 London edition whose translator is unknown.]

  • –––, 2014, “Pierre Bayle’s The Condition of Wholly Catholic France Under the Reign of Louis the Great (1686)”, translated and introduced by Charlotte Stanley and John Christian Laursen (trans.), History of European Ideas, 40(3): 312–359. doi:10.1080/01916599.2013.806706

    [A contemporary English translation of Bayle’s most passionate political work, with a very helpful historical Introduction.]

  • –––, 2016, Dialogues of Maximus and Themistius, translated, edited, and introduced by Michael W. Hickson, (Brill’s Texts and Sources in Intellectual History, 256/18), Leiden/Boston: Brill.

    [The first English translation of Bayle’s last work, Entretiens de Maxime et de Thémiste (posthumous, 1707), which was Bayle’s final word on skepticism and the problem of evil.]

  • –––, 2017, “Pierre Bayle’s Reply of a New Convert (1689)”, translated, edited, and with an Introduction by John Christian Laursen, History of European Ideas, 43(8): 857–883. doi:10.1080/01916599.2016.1266013

    [The first English translation of Bayle’s passionate critique of Protestants, with a historical and critical Introduction from a top historian of Bayle’s political thought.]

B. Secondary Literature

  • Bost, Hubert, 2006, Pierre Bayle, Paris: Fayard.

    [An award-winning intellectual biography of Bayle that provides a useful introduction both to Bayle and to his major philosophical works.]

  • Dibon, Paul (ed.), 1959, Pierre Bayle: Le philosophe de Rotterdam, Amsterdam: Elsevier.

    [The origin of modern Bayle scholarship that re-established the importance of reading Bayle in the context of French Protestantism.]

  • García-Alonso, Marta, 2017, “Bayle’s Political Doctrine: A Proposal to Articulate Tolerance and Sovereignty”, History of European Ideas, 43(4): 331–344. doi:10.1080/01916599.2016.1203593

    [Establishes the importance of Bayle’s theory of sovereignty for understanding his theory of toleration.]

  • –––, 2019, “Tolerance and Religious Pluralism in Bayle”, History of European Ideas, 45(6): 803–816. doi:10.1080/01916599.2019.1616312

    [Distinguishes Bayle’s theory of toleration from his theory of freedom of conscience.]

  • Hickson, Michael W., 2013, “Theodicy and Toleration in Bayle’s Dictionary”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 51(1): 49–73. doi:10.1353/hph.2013.0011

    [Argues that Bayle’s early works on toleration provide the foundation for his later works on the problem of evil.]

  • –––, 2018, “Pierre Bayle and the Secularization of Conscience”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 79(2): 199–220. doi:10.1353/jhi.2018.0013

    [Traces the gradual separation of Bayle’s conception of conscience from all religious doctrines.]

  • Hume, David, 2007, An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding and Other Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Irwin, Kristen, 2013, “Bayle on the (Ir)Rationality of Religious Belief”, Philosophy Compass, 8(6): 560–569. doi:10.1111/phc3.12044

    [Survey of opposing interpretations of Bayle on faith and reason.]

  • Kilcullen, John, 1988, Sincerity and Truth: Essays on Arnauld, Bayle, and Toleration, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198266914.001.0001

    [Includes a careful recapitulation and analysis of Bayle’s argument for toleration.]

  • Labrousse, Elisabeth, 1963 [1985], Pierre Bayle, tome I: Du pay de foix à la cite d’Erasme, second edition, (International Archives of the History of Ideas 1), Dordrecht/Boston/Lancaster: Martinus Nijhoff.

    [The classic biography of Bayle, first published in 1963, by the most important Bayle scholar of all time.]

  • –––, 1964, Pierre Bayle, tome II: Hétédoxie et rigorisme, (International Archives of the History of Ideas 6), La Haye: Martinus Nijhoff.

    [An extensive and thematic analysis of Bayle’s philosophical works. The two volumes of Labrousse’s Pierre Bayle are essential reading for any serious Bayle scholar.]

  • –––, 1983, Bayle, Denys Potts (trans.), (Past Masters), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press.

    [An excellent introduction to the life of Bayle, his religious, political, and philosophical contexts, and the main philosophical theses that he supported and refuted.]

  • Laursen, John Christian, 2011, “Baylean Liberalism: Tolerance Requires Nontolerance”, in Beyond the Persecuting Society: Religious Toleration Before the Enlightenment, Cary J. Nederman and John Christian Laursen (eds), Philadelphia, PA: University of Pennsylvania Press, 197–215.

    [An exposition of the necessary role that intolerance plays in Baylean toleration.]

  • Leduc, Christian, Paul Rateau, and Jean-Luc Solère (eds.), 2015, Leibniz et Bayle: Confrontation et Dialogue, (Philosophie 43), Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.

    [A collection of essays dedicated entirely to Bayle and Leibniz on a wide range of philosophical issues.]

  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm, 1710, Essais de Théodicée sur la bonté de Dieu, la liberté de l’homme et l’origine du mal (Theodicy), Amsterdam: I. Troyel. Translated as Theodicy: Essays on the Goodness of God, the Freedom of Man, and the Origin of Evil, Ausin Farrar (ed.), E. M. Huggard (trans.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1952.
  • Lennon, Thomas M., 1999, Reading Bayle, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.

    [A book-length treatment of the “Bayle enigma” that resolves the interpretive difficulties surrounding Bayle by reading him as an Academic skeptic.]

  • Maia Neto, Jose Raimundo, 1997, “Academic Skepticism in Early Modern Philosophy”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 58(2): 199–220. doi:10.1353/jhi.1997.0018
  • –––, 1999, “Bayle’s Academic Skepticism”, in Everything Connects: In Conference with Richard H. Popkin. Essays in his Honour, edited by James E. Force and David S. Katz, Leiden: Brill, 263–76.

    [The pioneering paper on Academic skepticism, as distinct from Pyrrhonism, in the early modern period; and the paper that applies the distinction to Bayle.]

  • Marx, Karl, 1845 [1956], Die Heilige Familie, oder Kritik der kritischen Kritik, Frankfurt am Main. Translated as The Holy Family or Critique of Critical Criticism, Richard Dixon (trans.), Moscow: Foreign Language Publishing House, 1956.
  • McKenna, Antony, 2015, Études sur Pierre Bayle, Paris: Honoré Champion.

    [A collection of essays by a leading Bayle scholar that offers a Rationalist, anti-skeptical interpretation of Bayle’s thought. ]

  • Mori, Gianluca, 1999 [2020], Bayle philosophe, Paris: Honoré Champion. Nouvelle édition, 2020.

    [Second edition of the 1999 work that has been at the center of Bayle scholarship for two decades. Mori argues for the controversial thesis that “all the roads of Bayle’s philosophical reflection lead to atheism”.]

  • Paganini, Gianni, 1980, Analisi della fede e critica della ragione nella filosofia di Pierre Bayle Florence: La Nuova Italia.

    [By a leading Italian historian of early modern philosophy.]

  • –––, 2008, Skepsis: Le Débat des Modernes sur le Scepticisme, Paris: J. Vrin.

    [A book awarded the Prix La Bruyère, the last chapter of which offers a thorough and rigorous analysis of Bayle’s skepticism viz-a-viz Cartesian philosophy.]

  • Popkin, Richard H., 2003, The History of Scepticism: From Savonarola to Bayle, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. (Earlier editions were entitled The History of Scepticism from Erasmus to Descartes, 1960, and The History of Scepticism from Erasmus to Spinoza, 1979.)

    [The last edition of this pioneering work concludes with a chapter on Bayle in the context of the early modern revival of Pyrrhonian skepticism.]

  • Rétat, Pierre, 1971, Le Dictionnaire de Bayle et la lutte philosophique au XVIIIe siècle, Paris: Société d’Édition “Les Belles Lettres”.

    [The classic history of the legacy of Bayle’s Dictionary in the Enlightenment.]

  • Rex, Walter, 1965, Essays on Pierre Bayle and Religious Controversy, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.

    [Places Bayle’s Various Thoughts on the Comet (1683) and Philosophical Commentary (1686–1688) in the context of the Protestant-Catholic polemics of the seventeenth century.]

  • Ryan, Todd, 2009, Pierre Bayle’s Cartesian Metaphysics: Rediscovering Early Modern Philosophy, (Routledge Studies in Seventeenth-Century Philosophy 11), New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203876923

    [A careful analysis of Bayle’s critiques of Locke, Leibniz, and Spinoza, which establishes Bayle’s commitment to the metaphysics of Descartes.]

  • Solère, Jean-Luc, 2016, “The Coherence of Bayle’s Theory of Toleration”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 54(1): 21–46. doi:10.1353/hph.2016.0019

    [The most rigorous presentation and defence of Bayle’s argument for toleration. This article won the prize for best article in JHP in 2016, and was chosen as one of the top ten articles published in all of Philosophy in 2016 by The Philosopher’s Annual.]

  • –––, 2017, “Bayle and Panpsychism”, Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 99(1): 64–101. doi:10.1515/agph-2017-0003

    [A careful analysis of Bayle’s view of the philosophical prospects of materialism. The question is important for understanding Bayle’s late attitude toward atheism.]

  • van der Lugt, Mara, 2016, Bayle, Jurieu, and the Dictionnaire Historique et Critique, (Oxford Historical Monographs), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198769262.001.0001

    [A beautifully written, accessible introduction to the logical structure and historical context of Bayle’s best-known work, the Dictionary.]

  • –––, 2021, Dark Matters: Pessimism and the Problem of Suffering, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.

    [A history of philosophical pessimism with a prominent role played by Bayle.]

  • van Lieshout, H.H.M., 2001, The Making of Pierre Bayle’s Dictionnaire historique et critique with a CD-ROM containing the Dictionnaire’s Library and References between Articles, Amsterdam: APA-Holland University Press.

    [A fascinating account of the process of researching, composing, and publishing the Dictionary.]

  • Whelan, Ruth, 1989, The Anatomy of Superstition: A Study of the historical theory and practice of Pierre Bayle, Oxford: Voltaire Foundation.

    [A thoroughly scholarly and accessible account of Bayle from as important a perspective as any: as an historian.]

Other Internet Resources

  • Correspondance de Pierre Bayle
    [The richest source of information about Bayle and Bayle scholarship on the Internet. It includes a digital edition of Bayle’s active and passive correspondence up to 1693; numerous videos about Bayle’s life and works; a complete Bibliography of Bayle studies up to 2015 organized both by date and then again by author; and a variety of pdf documents aimed at introducing Bayle to non-specialists. All resources are available only in French.]
  • Dictionnaire de Bayle (The University of Chicago ARTFL Project)
    [A searchable copy of the authoritative 1740 edition of Bayle’s Dictionary.]

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