Beardsley’s Aesthetics

First published Tue Sep 13, 2005; substantive revision Wed Dec 28, 2022

Monroe Beardsley (1915–1985) was born and raised in Bridgeport, Connecticut, and educated at Yale University (B.A. 1936, Ph.D. 1939). He taught at a number of colleges and universities, including Mt. Holyoke College and Yale University, but most of his career was spent at Swarthmore College (22 years) and Temple University (16 years).

Beardsley is best known for his work in aesthetics—and this article will deal exclusively with his work in that area—but he was an extremely intellectually curious man, and published articles in a number of areas, including the philosophy of history, action theory, and the history of modern philosophy. Indeed, his interests weren’t confined to “pure philosophy” or even to philosophy broadly conceived. Practical Logic, his first book (1950), was one of the first informal logic or critical thinking texts of the contemporary era, and Thinking Straight, (1950) a related book, saw four very different editions over a period of 25 years. Outside of philosophy, he wrote literary criticism and books and articles on style, writing, and the humanities. In short, Beardsley had broad humanistic interests that were centered in philosophy, and aesthetics in particular.

Three books and a number of articles form the core of Beardsley’s work in aesthetics. Of the books, the first, Aesthetics: Problems in the Philosophy of Criticism (1958; reissued with a postscript, 1981), is by far the most substantial, comprehensive, and influential. More than that, it’s also the first systematic, well-argued, and critically informed philosophy of art in the analytic tradition. Although not the main purpose of the book, it showed that analytic philosophy and a keen interest in the arts needn’t exist in isolation but can, and should, inform each other. It’s part of the book’s achievement that that’s taken for granted today. It wasn’t at the time it was written, and many people, both in Anglo-American philosophical circles and in art-critical circles, thought exactly the opposite in the mid-1950s. Given the wide range of topics covered in Aesthetics, the intelligent and philosophically informed treatment accorded them, the historically unprecedented nature of the work, and its effect on subsequent developments in the field, a number of philosophers, including some of Beardsley’s critics, have argued that Aesthetics is the most impressive and important book of twentieth century analytic aesthetics.

The Possibility of Criticism (1970), the second of the three books, is more modest in scope and less groundbreaking. Exclusively concerned with literary criticism, it limits itself to four problems: the “self-sufficiency” of a literary text, the nature of literary interpretation, judging literary texts, and bad poetry. Views propounded and defended in Aesthetics are further explained and defended in The Possibility, and several new concepts, for instance, that of an illocutionary act, are introduced and put to work. As with all of Beardsley’s writing, many poets, novelists, short story writers, essayists, critics, and philosophers are quoted and discussed. The style, tone, and approach are also characteristic Beardsley: eminently clear and guileless prose, gentle in tone but firm in argumentation.

The last of the books, The Aesthetic Point of View (1982), is a collection of papers, most old, some new. The book takes its title from the lead article, but the title is also emblematic, indicating Beardsley’s approach to the philosophy of art as a whole: the necessity of taking the aesthetic point of view. Fourteen papers, largely on the nature of the aesthetic and art criticism, are reprinted, and six new pieces are added. The new pieces are of special interest because they constitute Beardsley’s final word on the topics covered, and the topics are themselves central ones: aesthetic experience, the definition of art, judgments of value, reasons in art criticism, artists’ intentions and interpretation, and art and culture.

1. Background

In Aesthetics, Beardsley develops a philosophy of art that is sensitive to three things:

  1. art itself and people’s pre-philosophical interest in and opinions about art,
  2. critics’ pronouncements about art, and
  3. developments in philosophy, especially, though not exclusively, those in the analytic tradition.

More than anyone else, Beardsley took a love of the arts, independent of overarching philosophical commitments, seriously, and tried to make sense of it. Although he didn’t automatically defer to pre-reflective opinion about or interest in art, he, like Aristotle, thought they deserved respect and balked at any philosophy of art that didn’t make contact with them, or cavalierly dismissed or overrode them. His was a philosophy of art based on a love of the arts—that, and not a love of philosophy or any agenda, psychological, political, religious, philosophical, or otherwise. The copious examples and discussions of individual works of art in his writings illustrate as much, as do his philosophical arguments and conclusions. Much the same can be said of his concern with, and respect for, but far from automatic deference to, the remarks of art critics.

The historical backdrop against which Beardsley developed his philosophy of art in the late 1940s and early 1950s includes the three elements mentioned at the beginning of the preceding paragraph. There were developments in the arts—new forms in music, painting, and literature had appeared and were appearing—but there was also a well-established and relatively large canon of works almost universally regarded as aesthetically superior and worthy of attention. Art criticism had become an industry, with major schools of all sorts flourishing: Marxist, Formalist, psychoanalytic, semiotic, historical, biographical. And philosophy had changed in rapid and unexpected ways. Analytic philosophy, with its emphasis on language and strong empiricist tendencies, had gained ascendancy in American universities in little more than 20 years, and dominated the philosophical scene.

Beardsley responded to each of the three. His position on developments in the arts is probably best described as open-minded moderation. He welcomed new developments, and reference to new works and works that lack the luster of fame, notoriety, or ready recognition appear frequently in Aesthetics and his other work. He didn’t automatically embrace the latest fad, fashion, or movement, however, but tried, as he said, to get something out of a work. Failing that, a work could be ignored, though tentatively and perhaps temporarily—the fault might be his and not the object’s, he always thought. Certainly, though, the well-established works of the Western tradition—the Bachs, Goyas, and Popes—had to be respected and accounted for in any philosophy of art worthy of the name.

As for art criticism, Beardsley thought that a great deal of it read like the ruminations of a batter who kept his eyes on the scoreboard, the fans, his contract, his place in history, or his wife in the stands—instead of on the ball. Much of it, in other words, ignored what should be the main object of attention, the work itself. The school of criticism that attracted Beardsley, and that his philosophy of art ultimately underwrites, is the so-called New Criticism. Based in literature, the New Criticism made the literary work the center of critical attention, and denied, or at least greatly devaluated, the relevance of facts about the origin of literary works, their effects upon individual readers, and their personal, social, and political influence. Close reading is what is required of a critic, not biographical information about the author, a rundown of the state of society at the time the work was written, data about the psychology of creation, predictions about the effects of the work on society, and certainly not a piece of autobiography detailing the critic’s own personal response to the work. New Critics were explicators more than anything else, and investigated literary works, and especially poetry, as if they were found objects—worthwhile ores, rare jewels, and mundane rocks, each with its own unique properties. As an expert assayer, the critic must thoroughly and sensitively examine the objects before him in order to discover their exact nature and, in the best cases, special value. The rallying cry, in Allen Tate’s words, was, “We must return to, we must never leave, the poem itself” (Tate 1955, 63). Much the same sentiment is expressed in Beardsley’s remark that “[the critic’s] task is to keep [his] eye on… textual meaning” (PC: 34). Though based in literary criticism, the New Criticism could be, and should be, extended to the other arts, Beardsley thought: all art criticism should make a serious effort to recognize its objects as special, autonomous, and important in their own right, and not subservient to ulterior aims or values; all art criticism should attempt to understand how works of art work and what meanings and aesthetic properties they have; all art criticism should strive for objective and publicly accessible methods and standards to test its pronouncements. The New Criticism did just that, and did what other criticism, and especially Romantic criticism (in a broad sense of the term), did not: studiously focused on the work of art itself, as an object existing in its own right, with its own properties. Far too much criticism was essentially Romantic, the New Critics thought, and concentrated on the artist, not the art.

Developments in philosophy were a different story. In general, the philosophy of art has always been regarded as a backwater by philosophers, as by far the least rigorous and least important of the major branches of the field (a sentiment that remains widespread today), but the low regard in which aesthetics was held was even more pronounced at the time that Beardsley began work on Aesthetics. In its early, palmy days, analytic philosophy tended toward logical positivism, which dismissed judgments of aesthetic value—the core of art criticism, in Beardsley’s estimation—as cognitively meaningless, and ordinary language philosophy, a species of analytic philosophy that flourished briefly after World War Two, was unsystematic in its treatment of problems and even anti-systematic in its objectives—strong philosophical theses were either verboten, a sign of mistake, or an aberration. Neither brand of analytic philosophy boded well for aesthetics as a systematic field of study. There was, however, also a general form of analytic philosophy not connected with either approach, that is, analytic philosophy without an overarching commitment to the scientism of logical positivism or the dogged adherence to everyday language of ordinary language philosophy. Philosophers like Bertrand Russell, G.E. Moore, and C.D. Broad, among many others, were analysts without an agenda, and Beardsley was more in their camp—that is, no definite camp of analytic philosophy at all—than anyone else’s. For him, an analytic approach to the philosophy of art meant no more than critically examining the fundamental concepts and beliefs underlying art and art criticism. Doing philosophy of that sort required clarity, precision, and a good eye for identifying, exposing, and evaluating arguments, but left aesthetics, as a systematic study, as a real possibility.

2. The Nature of Aesthetics

Not all the arts could be covered in detail in even so long a book as Aesthetics—it’s over 600 pages—so Beardsley had to content himself with concentrating on three relatively disparate arts: literature, music, and painting. In keeping with the conception of philosophy mentioned above, aesthetics was thought of as meta-criticism. “There would be no problems of aesthetics”, Beardsley says, “if no one ever talked about works of art…. We can’t do aesthetics until we have some critical statements to work on” (Aesth: 1, 4]). Aesthetics is concerned with “the nature and basis of criticism,… just as criticism itself is concerned with works of art” (Aesth: 6). The then-current and still widespread view that philosophy is a second-order, meta-level, and essentially linguistic activity, taking as its object of study the pronouncements of first-order activities, such as chemistry, religion, or history, is reflected in Beardsley’s view on the nature of aesthetics.

It’s a problematic view, however, and one somewhat belied by Beardsley’s own philosophic practice. Questions like, What sort of being or existence do works of art have?—a question of ontology, and one of Beardsley’s questions—arise from the statements of art critics only in that critics use the term ’work of art’ and, with that concept available, inquiry into the ontological status of the objects that answer to it is then possible. But the question isn’t itself one that arises out of, or concerns the nature and basis of, critical practice, at least not in any significant sense of the term. For one thing, others besides critics use the term “work of art”—art dealers and art suppliers, for example—so the case could just as easily be made that the ontological question arises out of, and concerns the nature and basis of, art dealership or art supply-manship. A related point is that the same argument applies outside the arts. Farmers and grocers speak of apples, and unless we had some such term as “apple”, the question, What sort of being or existence do apples have?—again, a question of ontology—couldn’t be posed. It isn’t a question that arises out of the cultivation or sale of apples, however—not in any very direct or meaningful way—nor is it one that concerns the nature and basis of apple farming or running a supermarket. Critics, like farmers and art suppliers, do very well without ontological inquiries; ontological questions don’t lurk in the background, waiting to be asked. In short, Beardsley’s meta-philosophical view that aesthetics is meta-criticism is underdetermined by the reasons that he advances for it, inaccurate or correct only if the term “meta-criticism” is stretched beyond its usual bounds, and belied to some extent by Beardsley’s own philosophic practice. All of that is not to deny, however, that a great deal of aesthetics can be profitably viewed as meta-critical, as a critical examination and evaluation of the nature and basis of at least some of the statements that art critics make, at least if art critics are conceived broadly enough to include almost everyone who has ever stood before a painting, listened to a piece of music, or read a novel, and then ventured a judgment about it.

Critical statements are of three kinds, Beardsley thinks: descriptive, interpretative, and evaluative. The first concerns non-normative properties of works of art that are simply in it, in some sense, and are available, at least in principle, to anyone of normal eyes and ears if sufficiently sensitive, attentive, and experienced. “There is a small red patch in the upper right-hand corner of the painting” is a descriptive statement, but so is “Haydn’s 23rd Symphony abounds in dynamic tension”. The philosophical problems that descriptive statements give rise to involve the concept of form, Beardsley thinks. Interpretive statements are also non-normative but concern the “meaning” of a work of art, with “meaning” here referring to a semantic relation, or at least a purported semantic relation, between the work and (a small number of exceptions aside) something outside it. “That’s a picture of Notary Sojac” is an interpretive statement, as are “That’s a picture of a unicorn”, “The passage refers to Brutus’s betrayal of Caesar”, and “The thesis of Macbeth is exceedingly simple: Thou shalt not kill”. Last, critical evaluations are normative judgments that basically say that a work of art is good or bad, or how good or bad it is. “Mozart’s ‘Turkish March’ is an excellent short piano piece” is a critical evaluation, and so is “‘The Face on the Barroom Floor’ is wretched verse”. The judgment “This is beautiful”—the paradigm of a judgment of taste according to Kant—is sometimes thought of as a critical evaluation (Aesth: 9), but more often (e.g., Aesth: 463, 507), and always in Beardsley’s later writing, as a descriptive judgment, and one that frequently forms at least a partial basis for a critical evaluation.

3. The Ontology of Art: Phenomenalism and Friends

The first chapter of Aesthetics is in part devoted to the ontology of art—or aesthetic objects, as Beardsley was then wont to say. The term “work of art” was largely avoided by him at the time, because, as he later admitted, he did

not [want] to become enmeshed… in [the question of the definition of “work of art”, a question] that… [had] not convince[d] [him] of its importance or promise[d] any very satisfactory and agreeable resolution. (Aesth: xviii)

That was to change, and Beardsley later did offer a definition of art. In any case, it’s the ontology of “aesthetic objects” that’s first discussed in Aesthetics.

The ontology argued for begins with a distinction between physical objects and perceptual objects. In speaking of a thing being six feet by six feet in size and at rest, we’re speaking of a physical object; in speaking of a thing being dynamic and frightening, we’re speaking of a perceptual object. Perceptual objects are the objects we perceive, objects “some of whose qualities, at least, are open to direct sensory awareness” (Aesth: 31). Aesthetic objects are a subset of perceptual objects. This doesn’t necessarily mean that aesthetic objects aren’t physical objects, however. Aesthetic objects might be other than physical objects—the conceptual distinction might mark a real distinction—or they might be physical objects—the conceptual distinction, though somewhat misleadingly couched in terms of objects, might simply mark “two aspects of the same” thing (Aesth: 33). At first indifferent as to which alternative is opted for—Beardsley mentions that he doesn’t “see that it makes much difference which terminology [that of objects or aspects] is chosen” (ibid.)—he then proceeds to develop an ontology that stresses objects more than aspects.

The ontology is phenomenalistic in its leanings, though open to a more physicalist interpretation. A presentation of an aesthetic object is defined as the object as experienced by a particular person on a particular occasion. Essentially, presentations are sense-data of aesthetic objects. Aesthetic objects aren’t presentations, however, for that would invite not just an uncontrollable population explosion of aesthetic objects, but chaos in criticism; and neither are aesthetic objects classes of presentations, for aesthetic objects must have at least some perceptual properties, but classes, as abstract entities, have none. However,

whenever we want to say anything about an aesthetic object, we can talk about its presentations. (Aesth: 54)

This, Beardsley says,

does not “reduce” the aesthetic object to a presentation; it only analyzes statements about aesthetic objects into statements about presentations (Aesth: 54).

In effect, this is a form of linguistic phenomenalism, and commits Beardsley to adequate translations of statements about aesthetic objects into statements about the presentations of such objects—in effect, statements about experiences of such objects. As linguistic phenomenalism as a general ontology—or surrogate for ontology—has met with very strong criticism over the years, Beardsley’s ontology would have problems enough if it stopped here.

But it doesn’t. Not satisfied, Beardsley presses on to distinguish

  1. the artifact—the play itself, say, as written down—from
  2. a particular production of it—the Old Vic’s production, as opposed to the Marquette University theater department’s production—from
  3. a particular performance of it—last night’s performance in the Helfaer Theater—from
  4. a particular presentation of it—the play as it shows up in Peter Alelyunas’s experience of it, upon attending last night’s performance.

The same distinctions hold across the arts, though differently in different arts, and somewhat more naturally in some than others. There is Beethoven’s D Minor Symphony (the artifact), a production of it (The Philadelphia Symphony Orchestra’s recording of it), a particular performance of it (my playing the recording last night, in my house), and particular presentations of it (mine and other people’s experiences of it last night, in my house). At least in many arts, a single artifact can have many productions; a single production can have many performances; and a single performance can give rise to many presentations. As Beardsley notes, these distinctions collapse to some extent in some of the arts, and would have to be stretched a bit to fit them all. In reading a poem silently, he says, the production is the presentation (and I would also think the performance); “in architecture, the architect’s plans are the artifact; the completed building is the production” (Aesth: 57–58) (and also presumably the performance); and in painting and sculpture, “the distinction between artifact and production almost disappears” (Aesth: 58) (with the performance presumably being identical with both).

But what is the aesthetic object, the object of critical attention? It’s not a presentation or class of presentations, and it’s not the artifact—Beethoven’s 9th Symphony, for example. If the aesthetic object were the artifact, it would have contradictory characteristics, since different recordings of the 9th have different, incompatible characteristics: some are shorter than 60 minutes long, some longer. What’s left, and what the aesthetic object must be, is the production. Thus the primary object of critical attention is the production of an artifact, and the basic job of the critic is to describe, interpret, and evaluate such productions.

While interesting, original, and elegant, this position has its problems. Difficulties with carrying out the translation program that Beardsley is committed to aside, linguistic phenomenalism is little more than an attempt to enjoy the benefits of a reductive, sense-data ontology without paying the price for it. Reductive translations have commitments; there would be little point in proposing and defending an elaborate, difficult, counterintuitive, and otherwise inexplicable translation program, even in schematic form, unless it had some point beyond translation for the sake of translation. There’s either an ontology and a philosophical purpose behind such translations—and there certainly seems to be both (an adequate reductive translation of ‘p’ as ‘q’ entails commitment only to the entities mentioned in ‘q’)—or there is not—in which case the possibility of such translations may be of interest to linguists and those who like odd parlor games but no one else. In short, arguing that one can, in principle, avoid speaking of one sort of entity in favor of another is indirect ontology if it’s philosophy at all, and avoiding taking an explicit stand on ontology doesn’t change the fact. Beardsley would thus seem to be committed to phenomenalism, despite his explicit claim that aesthetic objects aren’t presentations.

But presentations are ill-suited objects of critical attention in any case. They’re too numerous and variable to ground objective criticism, and thus too unwieldy to make criticism of any kind worth the effort. In addition, taking aesthetic objects to be presentations conflicts with much of the practice—that is, many of the remarks—of critics themselves. None of this would be news to Beardsley—he says as much himself in several places—but it does mean that he shouldn’t have walked down the phenomenalist road as far as he did.

Phenomenalism, even in linguistic dress, also conflicts with identifying aesthetic objects with productions, since in a great many cases the production of an aesthetic object isn’t the same thing as a presentation of it. But even if phenomenalism is put to the side and Beardsley is simply taken at his word, and aesthetic objects are identified with productions, there are still anomalies. The first and most important is that the ontological status of aesthetic objects would be variable to the point of being of little philosophical interest. A production of a novel, if read silently, is something mental, a series of thoughts, perhaps conjoined with images. The production of a play or symphony, however, isn’t mental at all, but a publicly accessible event or process. It thus has whatever ontological status events or processes do. In architecture, the production is a building (or a bridge or a walkway), and thus a physical object (or a cultural object, with physical properties, some would say). Such wide variability suggests that there’s no real ontology of art at all, nothing firm, finite, or systematically related enough among the arts to be worth taking note of. A second problem with taking aesthetic objects to be productions is that, since some aesthetic objects are mental objects, the problems with phenomenalism noted at the end of the last paragraph reemerge in at least some cases, literature among them. A third problem, one in effect already noted, is that even within one art aesthetic objects would have a shifting ontological status. In the case of poetry, for example, if a poem is read silently, the production, and thus the aesthetic object, is a mental thing, but if the same poem is read publicly, to an audience, the production, and thus the aesthetic object, is an event.

By themselves, these objections don't refute Beardsley’s views on the ontology of art. What they show is the price that has to be paid for them. Perhaps alternative views offer less insight, or perhaps they offer more insight but at a higher cost, that is, generate more or even greater anomalies. Beardsley’s views might still be the best, all things considered. If so, the moral to be drawn may be that the ontology of art isn’t a very fruitful or important area of philosophical investigation, and that no harm to philosophy or art criticism is done by ignoring it.

4. Art as Essentially Institutional

One view that Beardsley certainly did think unacceptable, even if, as he later came to realize, his own early position wouldn’t do, is that works of art are “essentially institutional”. Depending on the context, this could be a claim either about the definition of “art” or about the ontology of art. Beardsley rejects both claims, but it’s important to distinguish them.

In speaking of money as “essentially institutional”, a person is probably claiming no more than that the definition or truth conditions of “this is money” include a reference to social institutions. The claim isn’t that quarters, dimes, nickels, and so on fall under a distinct ontological category other than physical objects, namely, cultural or institutional objects.

If taken ontologically, on the other hand, the force of the claim is that a work of art isn’t a physical object but a different kind of object altogether, an object whose nature and existence are in part constituted by culture, tradition, or social institutions. Arthur Danto’s distinction between artworks and “mere real things”(1981, 1), with beds and ties being paradigms of mere real things, suggests just such an ontological distinction. For Danto, it’s (1) theories of art and (2) the “aboutness” of art, or the fact that art is necessarily subject to interpretation, that make mere real things transform, so to speak, into artworks, and gain a new ontological status. The nature of a theory of art is never spelled out by Danto, but apparently all such theories require an object to be properly placed in an “artworld” to be a work of art, and not just anyone, at any time, can do such placing. But even if the indefinite and unexplained nature of Danto’s key concepts is put aside, and the fact that many works of art (for example, a typical concerto) don’t seem to be about anything at all, or subject to interpretation in any significant sense (at least until something for it to be about or interpreted in terms of is cooked up, such as that it’s about the very notes being played, or that it comments on the history of concertos)—even if that’s also put aside, it’s hard to see how (1) and (2) can effect ontological transformations, how things which are otherwise physical objects become, ontologically speaking, different objects. Rather, Beardsley thinks, what (1) and (2) suggest is that if a physical object is a work of art, it has, or at least can have, properties it wouldn’t otherwise have. If a person’s a policeman, he has properties—being able to arrest people, for example—that he wouldn’t otherwise have, but a policeman has whatever ontological status a person has, no more and no less. Receiving a certificate from the police academy and putting on a badge may “transform” a man, but a new object, an essentially institutional or cultural object, a policeman, doesn’t enter the world because of such doings. The argument that works of art are cultural objects, not physical objects, because the former have properties the latter don’t, is thus rejected by Beardsley.

5. Physical Objects and Kinds

Although Beardsley’s early views on ontology tended to either linguistic phenomenalism or unsystematic pluralism, there were hints, even at that time, of a simpler and more commonsensical view. That ontology can be seen lurking beneath the surface of his postulates of art criticism:

  1. The aesthetic object is a perceptual object; that is, it can have presentations.
  2. Presentations of the same aesthetic object may occur at different times and to different people.
  3. Two presentations of the same aesthetic object may differ from each other.
  4. The characteristics of an aesthetic object may not be exhaustively revealed in any particular presentation of it.
  5. A presentation may be veridical; that is, the characteristics of the presentation may correspond to the characteristics of the aesthetic object.
  6. A presentation may be illusory; that is, some of the characteristics of the presentation may fail to correspond to the characteristics of the aesthetic object.
  7. If two presentations of the same aesthetic object have incompatible characteristics, at least one of them is illusory. (Aesth: 46, 48)

Taking “aesthetic object” to mean “work of art”, the underlying ontology isn’t a sense-datum ontology or a mixed-category ontology at all. Several of the postulates—2, 4, and 6; possibly 3 and 7—are in fact prima facie incompatible with a sense-datum ontology. Rather, what 1–7 strongly suggest is that a work of art is a physical object: it’s perceptible, publicly or inter-subjectively available in both time and space, can appear differently from different points of view and at different times, may not be exhaustively understood on any given occasion, has properties that may be correctly or incorrectly perceived, and is such that attributions to it obey the law of non-contradiction.

Not surprisingly, after 1958 Beardsley

moved steadily in the direction of some form of non-reductive materialism, of seeing how far it is possible to go in treating artworks as physical objects. (Aesth: xxiv)

The materialism is non-reductive in that works of art have properties that physical objects generally don’t. Such materialism works well with “singular” works of art, such as paintings, Beardsley thinks, but “multiple artworks”—musical compositions which have many performances, poems which exist in multiple printings—present problems. The musical composition isn’t any single score or performance, the poem any single printed text. For that reason, Beardsley once again is driven back in the direction of ontological pluralism: perhaps works of art are either physical objects (the singular works) or kinds of physical object (the multiple works), with “physical object” construed broadly here so as to include events (such as a dance). This position is only slightly more economical than Beardsley’s earlier one—no works of art are ideas, which is good, since taking works of art to be ideas doesn’t fit in well with a number of his critical postulates—and only slightly tidier—essentially, the proliferation of ontological categories is limited by the broad but abstract concept of a kind.

Most philosophers would be dissatisfied with such a disjoint ontology, and Beardsley was no exception. There are basically two ways to avoid it:

  1. subsume physical objects under kinds;
  2. subsume kinds under physical objects.

(A third possibility is to subsume both under a broader, inclusive category. Absent a relatively revisionist ontology, however, it’s hard to see what such a third category would be.) Both strategies involve assigning primacy to one of the categories, but each requires that that be done in a way that does justice to what we say and think about art.

The first proposal, to subsume physical objects under kinds, entails that the Mona Lisa isn’t a physical object but a kind of painting. One difficulty with this is that as a kind, the Mona Lisa wouldn’t have any perceptual properties, which is both strange and in violation of Beardsley’s critical postulates. A second difficulty is that it’s a necessary truth—or at least many philosophers think it’s a necessary truth—that there’s only one Mona Lisa, yet the view in question entails that there could be many Mona Lisas, many instances of the kind.

Neither objection is definitive, however. Although Beardsley discusses neither objection, the first can be deflated by noting that although, strictly speaking, the Mona Lisa is a kind, it has perceptual properties in that all of its instances do. In other words, since all instances of the kind have perceptual properties, instances-of-a-kind are near enough to kinds to allow kinds to have perceptual properties in an extended sense of the term, by a small conceptual courtesy. That’s close enough for government work (as the saying goes). Even if this response is acceptable, however, the question of what the perceptual properties of the Mona Lisa are, if two of its instances differ markedly in their perceptual properties (due, say, to exposure to sunlight), would remain an odd one. Not an unanswerable one, however. That question and others like it could be answered by taking the Mona Lisa to be, in effect, an etching, with the first of its instances as a reference point for others.

That reply, in fact, previews a response to the second objection. Perhaps it’s simply a contingent, historical fact that we can’t create extremely accurate duplicates of paintings, and for that reason attach great importance to first instances of painting-kinds. That may be why we’re very reluctant to admit—reluctant to the point of thinking it impossible—that there could be more than one Mona Lisa.

Even if both objections can be rebutted, though, Beardsley is still inclined to reject the view that works of art are, all of them, kinds.

He’s also inclined to reject the second view, that works of art are, all of them, physical objects. Though the topic isn’t pursued at length, his reasons center around the fact that many works of art—woodcuts, for instance—have multiple instances, and it’s impossible to account for that fact if every work of art is a physical object. Is Pastijn’s The Last Supper in Rome or in Paris? If it’s a physical object, it can’t be in both places, so which of the two is it? Since both “Paris” and “Rome” seem wrong, the correct thing to do is to reject the assumption that the woodcut is a physical object. Rather, it’s a kind, and has instances that are located in Paris and Rome.

But if that’s enough to quell doubts about some works of art being kinds, it should also be enough, for the reasons mentioned two and three paragraphs back, to quell doubts about all works of art being kinds. The remaining barrier to the first reductive view, that works of art are, all of them, kinds, would then be removed.

On the other hand, the overall argument could just as easily cut the other way. If it’s physical objects that literally have perceptual properties, then why not take works of art, all of them, to be physical objects, with kinds being granted the title in an extended sense of the term, by a small conceptual courtesy? As traditionally interpreted, Aristotle holds that in the primary sense a substance is an individual, but in a secondary sense, by extension, a species is also a substance. Why not say something similar about works of art? Why not say, that, strictly speaking, works of art are physical objects, but in a secondary sense, works of art are kinds?

Beardsley doesn’t pursue the issue to the lengths that it has been here, so it’s impossible to know how he’d respond to the above. On the record, though, he embraces the untidy pluralism he’d rather avoid. Doing so doesn’t especially bother him, however, as he doesn’t think ontological questions as important as many other questions in aesthetics.

6. The Definition of Art

As mentioned above, Beardsley “sedulously avoided” (Aesth: 59) the term “work of art” as much as possible in Aesthetics. Even so, he came close to defining it. “Aesthetic object” is his surrogate term, and he does offer a schematic definition of it.

The genus of “aesthetic object” is perceptual object. What is its differentia? It’s not, Beardsley argues,

  1. a motive or intention, even an aesthetic motive or intention, that stands behind the creation of the object,
  2. an effect, even if an aesthetic effect, that the object produces in those who experience it, or
  3. an attitude, even if, again, an aesthetic attitude, that people bring to the object.

What’s needed is objective differentia, not subjective ones like (a), (b), and (c). Such differentia could be of either of two sorts. First, it could express the characteristics of perceptual objects that all and only aesthetic objects have. This, Beardsley thinks, can’t be done until a great deal of knowledge of aesthetic objects and the philosophy of art is at hand; and it isn’t. Second, an objective definition could proceed by first dividing up aesthetic objects into classes according to their sensory fields—as seen, heard, felt, and so on—and then, within each field, determining what objective characteristics distinguish aesthetic objects from other perceptual objects.

The second route is the one Beardsley takes in Aesthetics. Schematically, an aesthetic object is: a visual perceptual object that isn’t in the class of things that plastic forks, crumpled pieces of paper, and so on are in; or an auditory perceptual object that isn’t in the class of objects that scratches, noises, and so on are in; etc. This is more the beginnings of an outline of an approach to a definition than the beginnings of a definition itself—something Beardsley realizes—and it has problems of its own. The interesting question, however, isn’t what those problems are or the ultimate success or failure of this “divide and conquer” approach, but why he adopted it in the first place, and why he later abandoned it.

He adopted it for two reasons. First, approaches of the (a), (b), and (c) sort have numerous and serious problems (Aesth: 60–63). Second, if art criticism can amount to knowledge, as Beardsley believes it can, then what’s called for is an object of study that can be examined in its own right, in respect to its own objective qualities. Both of these factors led him in search of an objective definition of “aesthetic object”. Since, however, identifying necessary and sufficient conditions seemed out of the question—there was too much variety among aesthetic objects, and too much disagreement among philosophers—“divide and conquer” seemed a better strategy.

The reason why he later abandoned it is that he came to realize not only that his objections to an (a)-type definition weren’t definitive, but that there’s much to be said for an intentionalistic definition, a definition couched in terms of the artist’s intention.

7. Against Institutional Definitions

Before he arrived at that view, though, he spent some time arguing against a popular definition proposed by George Dickie. According to Dickie,

a work of art in the classificatory sense is (1) an artifact, (2) a set of aspects of which has had conferred upon it the status of candidate for appreciation by some person or persons acting on behalf of a certain social institution (the artworld). (Dickie 1974, 34)

Beardsley has no quarrel with (1), but he finds fault with (2) on several counts.

First, he wonders whether the “appreciation” spoken of can be any sort of appreciation at all—historical, moral, personal, professional, or whatever. If it can, the definition is far too broad. Perhaps, though, it’s distinctly aesthetic appreciation that’s meant. In that case, Dickie would have to square his second condition with his attack on the idea of aesthetic appreciation as a distinct sort or kind of appreciation.

Second, the idea of candidacy for appreciation is problematic. A candidate for appreciation can’t be merely something, some property (or aspect), that’s potentially appreciable. Too many properties of too many things are potentially appreciable. If “candidacy” is interpreted more narrowly and strictly, however, the idea that a property needs a status like “candidate for appreciation” bestowed upon it seems wrongheaded. A candidate for President of the United States, for example, isn’t just anyone who’s eligible but someone who has taken at least some steps toward attaining that office, or someone who has had an official endorsement. But what’s comparable in the case of aspects of works of art?

What sort of preparation or endorsement is contained in the assignment of candidacy for appreciation? The term suggests that something cannot be appreciated until it has been declared a candidate for appreciation. (APV: 133)

but being appreciated, or even appreciable, stands in need of no one’s imprimatur.

Third, there’s the question of who confers the status of candidate for appreciation. Dickie’s explicit answer is “some person or acting on behalf of a certain social institution (the artworld)”, with the artworld itself being

a bundle of systems: theater, painting, sculpture, literature, music, and so on, each of which furnishes an institutional background for the conferring of the status on objects within its domain (Dickie 1974, 33).

In calling the artworld an institution, Dickie says, he’s saying that “it is an established practice” (1974, 31). Music, painting, literature, and so on are social practices.

Beardsley will have none of this. What it is to act on behalf of an institution is clear enough when an identifiable social institution, such as a university, is in question. The president of Marquette University, for example, declares a tuition hike, or signs a document granting tenure to David Decker. He acts on behalf of the institution in doing so, because there are clearly defined rules, roles, rights, responsibilities, powers, positions, concepts, and acts that constitute the institution that is the university, and he fits into it in a way that enables him to raise tuition, or to confer the status of tenured professor. There’s nothing remotely comparable in “the artworld”—no formal, identifiable set of interlocking rules, roles, relations, and so on constituting an institution, and so nothing like an institutional token (comparable to Marquette University or the Department of the Treasury) with empowered individuals capable of conferring the status of painting, literature, or music on objects. What there are are loose collections of people of various sorts interested in painting, music, and literature. The same is true of gardening and cooking, however, and roses and veal cutlets need no social institutions, no “gardenworlds” or “foodworlds”, to be what they are. Neither, Beardsley thinks, do paintings, poems, or concertos need social institutions, subdivisions of the “artworld”, to be what they are. Museums, books of poetry, academies of music, and journals of art criticism exist because of a felt need to accommodate, promote, explore, and otherwise reap the benefits of pre-existing, logically prior objects known as works of art. And as for practices,

Does it make any sense to speak of acting on behalf of a practice? Status-awarding authority can center in an institutional token, but practices, as such, seem to lack the requisite source of authority. Perhaps the artworld, as Dickie conceives it, could not confer status. (APV: 134)

Last, and independent of the other objections, there is the problem of circularity. Works of art are defined in terms of the artworld; the artworld consists of people who have some sort of special doings with works of art. Ultimately, art is defined in terms of itself. To the response to this—basically, Dickie’s—that the circle is large enough to make the definition interesting and informative, Beardsley shakes his head in dismay: if works of art are

ultimately defined in terms of themselves, some important piece of the truth must not have been encompassed in the circle. (APV: 134)

Although some of these objections apply to Dickie alone, most, Beardsley thinks, apply in one form or another to every institutional definition of art.

8. A Neo-Romantic Definition

His own preferred view is neo-Romantic and intentionalistic—perhaps surprisingly, since Beardsley opposes Romanticism and intentionalism in the philosophy of art on every other front. A work of art is defined as

either an arrangement of conditions intended to be capable of affording an experience with marked aesthetic character or (incidentally) an arrangement belonging to a class or type of arrangements that is typically intended to have this capacity. (APV: 299)

The first disjunct is the more important one; it says that something’s a work if it’s an artifact, “an arrangement of conditions”, that was intended by its creator to be capable of providing an experience with non-negligible aesthetic character. It’s important to realize what’s not being said here. First, the definition doesn’t say that a work of art is intended to provide (or be capable of providing) a full-blown aesthetic experience. Only “an experience with marked aesthetic character” is required. Second, the definition doesn’t say that a work of art doesn’t or can’t have a utilitarian function, in the everyday sense of the term. A work of art could be a chair that’s many times simply sat in, for example. Third, the definition doesn’t say that the primary intention behind the creation of the artifact is an aesthetic one. The primary intention behind the creation of a religious icon, for example, could be to bring worshipers closer to God. What makes such an icon a work of art, however, is not that intention but another one: the intention that it be capable of affording viewers an experience with marked aesthetic character. How marked this character must be isn’t specified, but that may be all to the good. As the exact extension of “work of art” is somewhat indefinite, so is the extension of “artifact created with the intention of being capable of affording an experience with marked aesthetic character”. If the extensions of the two are the same or very nearly so, and the objects in the “gray areas”, the areas not definitely within or without the extension of the two, are also the same or very nearly so, then so much the better for the definition.

The second part of the definition picks up those objects that definitely are works of art but were created in a mechanical, almost an assembly-line fashion, or as just another instance of its kind. Some beautiful vases may fall into the first class, and many medieval icons into the second. To make sure that the extension of the definiens matches that of the definiendum, the second disjunct of the definition is needed.

Why accept the definition? For several reasons, Beardsley thinks. First, a definition

chosen for a role in aesthetic theory should mark a distinction that is… significant for aesthetic theory (APV: 299),

and Beardsley’s does. Second,

in selecting key terms for aesthetic theory we ought to stay as close as convenient to ordinary use (APV: 300).

Not everyone’s use of a term needs to be captured in fashioning a definition, which would be impossible in any case with a term as elastic and tendentiously used as “work of art”. Beardsley’s definition has the merit of capturing

reasonably well a use that has been prominent for some centuries and still persists quite widely today, outside the speech and writing of or about the avant-garde. (APV: 300)

In other words, Beardsley’s definition captures the ordinary extension of a term. The fact that it may not capture the extension of a term as used by the avant-garde—who may claim that Waltina Weber’s arthritis is a work of art—doesn’t count against it to any appreciable extent. Third, a definition of “work of art”

should be of the greatest possible utility to inquirers in other fields besides aesthetics—fields to which aesthetics itself should (sometimes) be thought of as a support and underpinning. (APV: 304)

The fields Beardsley has in mind, more than any other, are art history and anthropology. Fourth and last, a definition of “work of art” should “conceptually link… art and the aesthetic” (APV: 312). That Beardsley’s does in spades, directly defining art in terms of the aesthetic as it does.

What can be said against the definition? Complaints could come from any number of quarters, but most would focus on its being too narrow. The definition simply doesn’t get the extension of “work of art” right, it would be argued, because of its antiquated focus on the aesthetic. Developments in art, art criticism, and the philosophy of art in the twentieth century have shown the independence of art and the aesthetic, with the result being a marked divergence in their extensions. Pieces of driftwood and stones, for example, have been displayed in museums and catalogued as works of art. Artifactuality thus isn’t a necessary condition of art. And many objects obviously have no aesthetic intention behind them, and yet are works of art. Duchamp’s famous Fountain, for example, a urinal turned upside down, is a work of art, but it was manufactured in a factory. No aesthetic intention stands behind it, it has no aesthetically interesting properties, and it doesn’t belong to a kind whose members are normally created with an aesthetic intention. Literally thousands of objects of the same sort can be found in museums and galleries today. They’re listed in museum catalogues, discussed in art history texts, and analyzed in journals of art criticism. If they aren’t works of art, what are they?

Beardsley never explicitly responded to this objection, but he wouldn’t be fazed. The objection assumes that if an object is displayed in a museum—a fine arts museum, not a history museum or any other sort of museum—or if an art historian or art critic discusses an object, then it must be a work of art, or at least that there’s very strong reason to think that it’s a work of art. That it’s some reason to think so Beardsley wouldn’t deny; but that it’s necessarily a strong or definitive reason he certainly would. Fine arts museums sometimes display the working clothes or palettes of artists, but they aren’t works of art. This has to do with the fact that even if the primary business of a museum is to display art, it has other functions as well, and justifiably extends its mission in various ways. Palettes and working clothes are an extension in one direction, for one reason, but pieces of driftwood and stones are a different extension, in a different direction, and for a different reason. They’re displayed—in small numbers—because they’re aesthetically interesting, just as most works of art are. And Duchamp’s Fountain might be displayed not because it’s a work of art—although presenting an upside down urinal to a museum might be regarded as a small joke, and thus a minor work of art—but because (a) art, as a human endeavor, has a history, (b) museums, as a social institution, have a duty to acknowledge and exhibit that history, and (c) Fountain, as a well-chosen memorial to the joke, has a place in that history. Much the same can be said about the remarks of art critics and art historians respecting Fountain and its many kin. If such objects are called “works of art” for a long enough period of time, by a large enough group of people, the term can easily acquire a secondary sense or a number of derivative senses. Beardsley is probably alluding to as much in his remarks about the use of the term by or about the avant-garde. But that the appearance of coatracks, old shoes, broken sticks, and such like in museums, or that mention of them in books and journals by art critics and historians means that “art” in the primary sense is wrongly defined in terms of artifactuality and aesthetic intention—that hasn’t been shown, he would say. A perfectly good explanation of such phenomena can be provided in accord with a relatively traditional definition of art.

9. The Intentions of the Artist

Despite his many books and articles, Beardsley is probably best known for his very first article in aesthetics. In “The Intentional Fallacy”, a paper co-written with William K. Wimsatt and published in 1946, he argued against the neo-Romantic view that a work of art means what the artist says it means, or what he intends it to mean. Since many pens have run dry in writing about—and in the great majority of cases attacking—The Intentional Fallacy, another pen will run dry in discussing it below.

The issue can be put in terms of the relation between

The artist intended x to mean p in work w


x means p in work w.

According to E.D. Hirsch, (1) entails (2), at least if w is a literary work, because the meaning of ‘x’ simply is what the writer meant or intended by ‘x’. Knowing the artist’s intention is thus knowing the work’s meaning (Hirsch 1967). That’s one end of the spectrum on the relation between (1) and (2).

Beardsley sits at the other end. He holds that the intentions of the artist aren’t relevant to the interpretation of a work of art at all. (1) not only doesn’t entail (2); in and of itself, it provides no direct evidential support for (2). An artist’s intentions have nothing to do with what a work means.

Between Beardsley and Hirsch are any number of intermediate positions, in general characterizable as holding that the intentions of the artist provide some direct evidential support for (2) but not definitive support. Artists’ intentions have some weight, in other words, but not, as Hirsch in effect has it, infinite weight, weight that entails that the work means what the artist intends it to mean. Other factors may well outweigh that of the artist’s intention in a particular case, and the meaning of the work, or part of the work, not correspond to what the artist intends. Many philosophers, probably the majority, would subscribe to such an intermediate position. The question, however, isn’t which position is most popular, but which has the most to say for it.

One steadfast conviction of Beardsley’s is that his does. He returned to the issue of the relation of intention and interpretation a number of times, and never wavered. In fact, he was more than consistent on the issue; he also held that

The artist intended w to have descriptive property p

provides no direct evidential support for

W has descriptive property p,

and that

The artist intended w to have evaluative property e

provides no direct evidential support for

W has evaluative property e.

An artist’s intentions are utterly irrelevant to the descriptive, interpretive, and evaluative properties of his work. If we want to know what properties a work has, we should examine the work, not the worker.

And in addition to “The Intentional Fallacy”, there’s also the lesser known and lesser discussed “The Affective Fallacy”. In a paper bearing that name (1949), also co-written with William Wimsatt, Beardsley argued that a person’s affective responses to a work of art are irrelevant to its descriptive, interpretive, and evaluative properties. If we want to know what properties a work has, we should look at the work, not those looking at the work.

Beardsley’s claims about the irrelevance of the artist’s intentions to the descriptive and evaluative properties of his work have elicited little in the way of critical response. That may or may not mean that philosophers are generally in agreement with him. As far as the irrelevance of the artist’s intentions to interpretation is concerned, however, there has been a great deal of dissent. Since there has, what follows will concentrate exclusively upon interpretation.

Beardsley’s arguments against intentionalism are of a variety of sorts. In “The Intentional Fallacy”, he says that the intentions of the artist are neither “available nor desirable”, with this meaning that such intentions aren’t always available and are never desirable. Since we frequently can and do correctly interpret a work of art with little or no knowledge about the artist, the fact that the artist’s intentions aren’t always available is enough to show that Hirsch’s position is wrong. But that it’s never desirable to consult the artist’s intentions when they’re available is what Beardsley has to prove.

Partial support can be found in his argument that

Judging a poem is like judging a pudding or a machine. One demands that it work. It is only because an artifact works that we infer the intention of the artificer…. A poem can be only through its meaning… yet it is, simply is, in the sense that we have no excuse for inquiring what part is intended or meant. (IF: 469)

In other words, a poem or other work of art is independent of its creator, just as any other artifact—a pudding or a washing machine—is. A pudding consists of milk, eggs, and other ingredients; a washing machine of a metal drum, rubber gaskets, and other parts; and a poem of words. In all three cases, the parts exist and are what they are independently of the artificers, and the artifacts are to be judged—and interpreted—on the basis of their properties. There’s no need to bring in the artificer, for he doesn’t remain behind in the parts, and critical judgment, including interpretation, concerns the how, why, what, and how well of the artifact, not the how, why, what, or how well of the artificer. The proof of the pudding is in the eating, not the chef’s intentions.

The principal point at which this argument—admittedly, an extended reconstruction of a few remarks in “The Intentional Fallacy”—might be questioned is in the assumption that works of art are like standard, garden-variety artifacts—lawn chairs and television sets—in leaving their creators behind. For Beardsley, a work of art isn’t fundamentally different from a pair of fingernail clippers: it’s made and then begins its own autonomous life. It is what it is—who knows or cares who created it, and with what intentions. This is a plausible position, but not an unassailable one. The alternative view is that not all artifacts lead autonomous lives, and that for some, works of art as well as, on many people’s view, linguistic artifacts of all kinds (sentence tokens, memos, book chapters, and so on), what they are is intimately linked to their creator, and more particularly to the intention-laden conditions of their origin. Put more concretely and slightly too strongly in terms of an imperfect analogy with physical objects: a rock isn’t space, and to understand a rock we can many times can ignore considerations of space, but if we remove space altogether from our understanding of a rock, there isn’t a rock to understand at all. On this view, then, a proper understanding of works of art—which includes correctly interpreting them—requires the admissibility of considerations of the artist’s intentions, even if those intentions aren’t always available or needed.

But why, Beardsley would ask in reply, are works of art so special? What makes them categorically different from your run-of-the-mill artifact? The view in question distinguishes kinds of artifact without providing a principled or well-argued basis for doing so. At the least, additional support is needed. Absent such support, the view is nothing but special pleading.

One possible reply is that there is a non-arbitrary difference between works of art and other artifacts, namely that other artifacts aren’t essentially meaning-laden and works of art are. Still, in and of itself, this isn’t sufficient, Beardsley would say, for (i) some works of art, such as “pure music”, aren’t meaning-laden, (ii) many objects which aren’t works of art, such as newspapers, are meaning-laden, and (iii) even if (i) and (ii) weren’t true, the fact that all and only works of art are meaning-laden has to be shown to make for the relevance of artists’ intentions, and that hasn’t been done.

In Aesthetics, the attack is a little different. “We must distinguish between the aesthetic object and the intention in the mind of its creator”, Beardsley says, and the irrelevance of the latter to interpretation can be shown if we consider a certain sculpture, “a large, twisted, cruller-shaped object of polished teak, mounted at an oblique angle to the floor”. The creator of the sculpture intends it to “symbolize… Human Destiny”. Try as we might, however, we “see in it no such symbolic meaning”. The philosophical question then is:

Should we say that we have simply missed the symbolism, but that it must be there, since what a statue symbolizes is precisely what its maker makes it symbolize? Or should we say, in the spirit of Alice confronting the extreme semantic conventionalism [intentionalism] of Humpty Dumpty, that the question is whether that object can be made to mean Human Destiny?

Obviously, the latter, Beardsley thinks, for the former entails that

anyone can make anything symbolize anything just by saying it does, for another sculpture could copy the same object and label it “Spirit of Palm Beach, 1938”. (Aesth: 18–19, 21)

The argument here is fine as far as it goes, but it doesn’t go as far as Beardsley apparently thinks it does. What it shows is that an artist’s say-so or intention isn’t absolute as far as the meaning of his work is concerned. That’s a far cry from showing that (1) is utterly irrelevant to (2).

In addition to sculpture, the irrelevance of the author to the meaning of his text is also argued for by Beardsley, though only partly by counterexample. “Suppose someone utters a sentence”, he says.

We can [then] ask two questions: (1) What does the speaker mean? (2) What does the sentence mean?

Although answers to the two questions usually coincide, they can diverge; people can mean one thing and say another. The reason that’s possible is that

what a sentence means depends not on the whim of the individual, and his mental vagaries, but upon public conventions of usage that are tied up with habit patterns in the whole speaking community.

Sentence meaning—that is, textual meaning—is thus one thing, and is anchored in the “the whole speaking community”, while speaker meaning—what the author meant—is quite another, and is anchored in his own, quite possibly idiosyncratic intentions. Thus an author can be wrong about what his own work means. A.E. Housman, for example, was probably wrong in claiming that his poem “1887” wasn’t ironic (Aesth:, 25–26).

Once again, there’s something wrong and something right in what Beardsley says. He’s undoubtedly right that sentence meaning and speaker meaning needn’t coincide, and that that proves that the two aren’t identical. Thus the author’s intention isn’t always the final word on what a text means. That, however, doesn’t prove that the author’s intention carries no evidential weight at all. According to the alternative position, it does, but in some cases, perhaps the majority of them, not enough to carry the day. In other cases, however, and perhaps Housman’s among them, the author’s intention can tip the scales in favor of one reading rather than another. In any case, the argument here might conclude, the unease that many people feel in dismissing Housman from the interpretation of his poem argues that we should accord his intentions at least some weight.

In The Possibility of Criticism, three arguments are advanced against intentionalism, which is again taken to be the view that the meaning of a work of art is what the artist intends it to mean. The first is that

some texts that have been formed without the agency of an author, and hence without authorial meaning, nevertheless have a meaning and can be interpreted. (PC: 18)

What Beardsley has in mind is the kind of verbal mistake made at a publishing house, or by a computer in scanning a document. He cites the sentence “Jensen argued like a man filled with righteous indigestion” as an example of a text that can be read and interpreted, yet no agency, a fortiori no author’s intention, stands behind it. “Indignation” became “indigestion” at the printer’s, by mechanical error.

True enough, his opponent would say in reply, but what that shows is that the author’s intention isn’t identical with the meaning of a text or needed in all cases to correctly interpret a text. What it doesn’t show is that the author’s intention, if present, is irrelevant to interpretation. Besides, the reply would continue, printer’s errors and similar cases are parasitic on normal cases in which there is authorial intent. Our conception of a text is that of an intentionally created artifact of a certain kind, and cases in which authorial intent is altogether missing are admitted as texts only by conceptual courtesy, based on the similarity of such texts to standard, intention-laden texts.

The second argument is that

the meaning of a text can change after its author has died. But the author cannot change his meaning after he has died. Therefore, textual meaning is not identical to the authorial meaning.

Bolstering this argument is the fact that

the OED furnishes abundant evidence that individual words and idioms acquire new meanings and lose old meanings as time passes; these changes can in turn produce changes of the meaning in sentences in which the words appear.

As an example, Beardsley cites a line from a poem written in 1744, “He raised his plastic arm”, and notes that “plastic arm” has “acquired a new meaning in the twentieth century”. Thus the line “in which it occurs has also acquired a new meaning” (PC: 19).

This argument is highly doubtful. Just as the doings of the homosexual community in the 1970s, and the terminology that such doings introduced, don’t mean that the line “Now we don our gay apparel” has acquired a new meaning in the Christmas carol, a call to dressing in drag, so the doings of the oil industry in the twentieth century, and the terminology surrounding petrochemical products that such doings introduced, don’t mean that the line “He raised his plastic arm” has acquired a new meaning in the poem, a meaning having to do with the movement of a prosthetic limb. Newer meanings of a term, distant from original meanings and far removed in time, are utterly irrelevant to the meaning of a line written long ago. In effect, the principle of interpretation underlying Beardsley’s argument, that new meanings of a term are relevant to the interpretation of older texts in which it occurs,

  1. underwrites unbridled anachronism,
  2. entails ever changing but correct interpretation—that is, no stable textual meaning—and
  3. seriously threatens the autonomy of the text and, by extension, the autonomy of all works of art.

Although Beardsley might regard (a) as an acceptable consequence of his argument, at least if “unbridled anachronism” were replaced with a less loaded term, he’d undoubtedly be unhappy with (b) and (c). (b) challenges the objectivity of criticism, something that he’s at pains to establish, and (c) endangers his comprehensive outlook on art and art criticism. Perhaps that’s why he later seems to have renounced the argument, even if only implicitly (cf. Aesth: li).

The third argument is the familiar one that

a text can have meanings that its author is not aware of. Therefore, it can have meanings that its author did not intend. Therefore, textual meaning is not identical to authorial meaning. (PC: 20)

While all this can be granted, Beardsley’s critic would say, the last sentence gives the game away: the argument doesn’t show the complete irrelevance of the author’s intentions to the meaning of his work, just that the two aren’t identical.

10. The Intentionalist Strikes Back

One line of argument to show that

The artist intended x to mean p in work w

is logically or epistemically related to

x means p in work w

begins by noting that the facts expressed by (1) and (2) may not be “constantly conjoined”, but there’s at least a very strong correlation between the two: the great majority of cases of (1) are cases of (2), and the great majority of cases of (2) are cases of (1). More than that, given our knowledge of the world, it’s plausible to assume that there’s a causal relation between type-(1) facts and type-(2) facts: in general, type-(1) facts bring about or cause type-(2) facts. A universal causal law of the form, All M-type facts bring about or cause N-type facts, wouldn’t be quite correct in this case, but neither would it be in the case of throwing rocks and breaking windows. The causal generalization is sound enough in both, however.

That much is common sense and is readily admitted by Beardsley. The intention of the artist and the aesthetic object “are causally connected”, Beardsley says in Aesthetics (Aesth: 19), and if two things, for example, Jones, Sr. and Jones, Jr., are causally connected, then

any evidence about the height of either of them will be indirect evidence about the height of the other, in virtue of certain laws of genetics, according to which the tallness of the father affects the probability that the son will be tall, though it does not, of course, render it certain (Aesth: 19–20).

Thus, Beardsley adds,

In the case of aesthetic object and intention we have direct evidence of each: we discover the nature of the object by looking, listening, reading, etc., and we discover the intention by biographical inquiry, through letters, diaries, workbooks—or, if the artist is alive, by asking him. But also what we learn about the nature of the object itself is indirect evidence of what the artist intended it to be, and what we learn about the artist’s intention is indirect evidence of what the object became. (Aesth: 20)

There are two important points to note about this passage. First, although Beardsley wrote that in his early work he was concerned

with the logical relevance of information about the intentions of an author to the interpretation… of his work,

and he “took the position that there is no such relevance” (II: 188), in the last sentence he admits that there is a “logical relation” between (1) and (2): (1) is indirect, inductive evidence of a causal sort for (2). Reasoning from type-(1) facts to type-(2) facts is simply reasoning from causes to effects. Such reasoning doesn’t yield certainty, but it’s generally dependable nonetheless. Thus, in at least many cases, if we knew that the artist intended his work to mean p, we would have good, though not definitive, reason for believing that his work means p.

The second point concerns the distinction between direct and indirect evidence drawn by Beardsley. A diary entry is direct evidence of what the artist intended his work to mean; the artist’s intention is indirect evidence of what his work means. But why the difference? In both cases, the relation between the items is causal, yet in one the evidence is direct, and in the other indirect. If a diary entry is direct evidence of an artist’s intention (reasoning from an effect to a cause), then the artist’s intention ought to be direct evidence of what his work means (reasoning from a cause to an effect). That’s a conclusion Beardsley certainly wants to avoid. If, on the other hand, the artist’s intention is indirect evidence of what his work means (reasoning, as just noted, from a cause to an effect), then a diary entry ought to be indirect evidence of what he intended (reasoning, again as just noted, from an effect to a cause).

This second way of resolving the tension in Beardsley’s remarks would probably be more acceptable to him, but it still carries problems in its train. What does the distinction between direct and indirect evidence amount to on it? Something like this: direct evidence that S is P is evidence gleaned from an inspection of S itself, no other objects being taken into consideration or made epistemic use of. Indirect evidence that S is P is evidence that takes objects other than S into consideration, or that makes epistemic use of such objects. Thus evidence respecting the height of Jones, Sr. is indirect evidence of the height of Jones, Jr., and conversely; diary entries are indirect evidence of an artist’s intentions, and conversely; and an artist’s intentions are indirect evidence of the meaning of his text, and conversely. Direct evidence of Jones, Jr.’s height requires scrutinizing him and not looking elsewhere, however, and by the same token direct evidence of the meaning of a work of art requires scrutinizing it and not looking elsewhere.

But the problem with drawing the distinction this way is that objects other than the work of art itself often have to be consulted in order to know what the work means, and many of these objects have to be regarded as legitimate sources of information, lest interpretation become impossible. The OED is consulted by even the best of critics, and social histories are many times needed to understand cultural and historical references. Beardsley knows as much and, from “The Intentional Fallacy” onward, insisted on the legitimacy of such sources. But as drawn, the distinction between direct and indirect evidence doesn’t distinguish between dictionaries and diaries, and Beardsley never did define the direct evidence/indirect evidence distinction with sufficient precision to put one on one side of the critical fence, and the other on the other, and have them stay put. Perhaps the distinction can be drawn in some way along the lines indicated above (which are suggested by Beardsley’s own remarks), but more rigor and a principled argument would be needed.

11. Halfway Between Induction and Deduction

A different way to draw the distinction, not hinted at by Beardsley but perhaps acceptable to him, would be in terms of the nature of the inferential relation between (1) and (2). (1) doesn’t entail (2), but, as Beardsley admits, it does provide inductive support for (2). (1) may or may not be criterial evidence for (2), however. What this last claim means can be made clearer by an analogy with W.D Ross’s theory of ethical reasoning.

According to Ross,

Act A is a lie

doesn’t entail

Act A is wrong,

for A might be right even so, when all ethically relevant factors are taken into account. If A helps to save innocent people’s lives, for example, it’s right—actually right, as Ross says—even though it’s a lie. Nor is the relation between (L) and (W) causal or inductive. Lying doesn’t cause wrongness, and although it might be that most (or even all) lies are all-things-considered wrong—actually wrong—it might be that most (or even all) lies aren’t all-things-considered wrong—actually wrong. Regardless of which alternative (if either) is correct, (L) still provides some reason for thinking that (W) is true. That’s to say that the inference from (L) to (W) isn’t based on an empirical generalization of any kind. Rather than being deductive evidence or empirically based inductive evidence, (L) is criterial evidence for (W). All by itself, irrespective of any other considerations, any other premises, it lends some but not definitive support to (W). The inference is an immediate one, in other words, in the logician’s sense of the term, and since it is and isn’t grounded on empirical facts, it looks like a deductive inference. It’s not a deductive inference, however: unlike a standard deductive inference, but like a standard inductive inference, additional premises—such as “Act A saves many people’s lives”, or “Act A leads to many people’s deaths”—can affect the strength of the inference, weakening it in some cases, strengthening it in others, and having little to no effect on it in still others. As with a typical inductive argument, strength of inference isn’t an all-or-nothing affair. The inference is defeasible, in that countervailing considerations can weigh against the support the premise provides, even to the point of nullifying it altogether, or at least very nearly doing so; but it’s also buttressable, in that additional considerations can bolster or further strengthen such support, even to the point of making the inference well-nigh deductively sound. Or, of course, the inference can be strengthened by some considerations and weakened by others.

What this means is that there can be criterial evidence of an altogether different sort for (or against) (W).

Act A is an act of betraying a friend

is also criterial evidence for (W), and there are many other examples of such evidence. Whether the wrongness of an act is constituted by such factors as lying and betrayal, or whether it’s a different property which supervenes on such factors, is of no moment as far as the matter at hand is concerned. The important point is the logic—or better, the epistemology—of the inferential relation.

What all this has to do with the intentional fallacy is this. The intentionalist shouldn’t claim that (1) entails (2), for that claim is subject to the numerous counterarguments that Beardsley makes full use of. But the anti-intentionalist, such as Beardsley, shouldn’t claim that there’s “no logical relation” between (1) and (2), for there clearly is, even on his own showing, a causally grounded, empirically based, standard inductive relation between the two. The intentionalist shouldn’t rejoice at this admission, however. For two reasons, such a relation tells us nothing of any significance about the proper way to interpret art. First, similar causal relations can be found to obtain in virtually every domain of inquiry, and they tell us nothing significant about proper methodology in those domains. The fact that tall parents generally have tall children, and tall children generally have tall parents, is of no help in establishing proper methodology in genetics, or even in telling us where to begin our investigation. Second, and more importantly, being founded on a causal connection between two distinct things, namely the artist’s intention and the meaning of his work, the empirical generalization that underlies the inference from (1) to (2) presupposes that there’s a way to identify the meaning of an artist’s work independent of consulting his intentions. That’s not something the intentionalist who relies only on a causal connection between the two should be very happy about, for it suggests that the artist’s intentions are altogether extrinsic to and independent of the meaning of the artist’s work.

The real debate about the intentional fallacy is, or at least should be, over whether (1) provides criterial evidence for (2). Beardsley argues against an entailment relation between the two, admits that there’s an inductive relation but relegates it to the category of indirect evidence, and thinks the job is done. The intentionalist typically wonders how the meaning of a work can be utterly divorced from the voice, the uttering or creating with an intended meaning, of the artist, and brings up hard cases to support the relevance of the artist’s intentions. But neither has focused the issue properly. Beardsley apparently takes direct evidence to be deductively adequate evidence or evidence gleaned from the object itself, and indirect evidence to be evidence based on empirical generalizations or gleaned from something other than the object itself. In neither sense is an artist’s intentions direct evidence of what his work means, and Beardsley is right that there’s an intentional fallacy. But if, as it should be, direct evidence is identified with criterial evidence, and indirect evidence with non-criterial but inductive evidence, Beardsley has failed to establish that there’s an intentional fallacy. On the other hand, the mere strong feeling of the intentionalist that the meaning of a work isn’t independent of the intentions of the artist who created it is no proof of anything, and the hard cases brought up in support of the relevance of the artist’s intentions—typically, cases that involve allusion, irony, or obscure passages—can almost always be explained or explained away, and not implausibly, by the anti-intentionalist. The mistake of Beardsley is to neglect a possibility and thus focus the issue wrongly. The mistake of the intentionalist is typically not to focus the issue with any degree of precision, and to rely on relatively vague but strongly held intuitions.

12. Meaning and Speech Acts

What’s needed to decide whether there’s an intentional fallacy, whether (1) does or doesn’t provide criterial evidence for (2), is, more than anything else, a theory of meaning. A theory of meaning is a theory of what it is for w (some object, in the broad sense of the term) to mean p. Beardsley was always aware of the need for a theory of meaning, and in Aesthetics he proposed one, a complicated theory which he later rejected. A few years later, however, in his final paper on the topic, he embraced a speech-act theory based on the work of William Alston and used it to defend the intentional fallacy.

Speech act theory in general is derived from the work of J.L. Austin, a British philosopher who flourished shortly after World War II. Austin distinguishes three things a person typically does in uttering a sentence, say, “The door is open”. He utters certain words—“the”, “door”, “is”, and “open”—with certain meanings; this is a locutionary act. He states that the door is open; this is an illocutionary act. And he convinces someone that the door is open; this is a perlocutionary act. As Austin says, it is in uttering a sentence with a certain meaning (that is, in performing a locutionary act) that we perform an illocutionary act. Illocutionary acts have come to be called speech acts. Asserting, requesting, arguing, ordering, promising, and so on are all examples of speech acts, but there are many, many different speech acts. Last, as Austin also says, it is by uttering a certain sentence with a certain meaning that we perform certain other acts, acts partly defined in terms of their effects on listeners: convincing, enraging, pleasing, deceiving, and so on. These are perlocutionary acts. I utter the words “The door is open”; in doing so, I state that the door is open; by so doing, I convince you that the door is open.

These suggestive distinctions led Alston to believe that the meaning of a sentence is the sentence’s total speech act potential, its potential for performing all of the various speech acts it could be used to perform. In effect, this is to take the slogan “Meaning is use” very seriously, and to cash in “use” in terms of the performance of speech acts. Sentence meaning is primary on this theory, and word meaning secondary and derivative, since it’s defined in terms of a word’s contribution to the speech act potential of the sentences into which it can figure. Beardsley thought this theory correct and used it to argue that the intentional fallacy is indeed a fallacy.

In “Intentions and Interpretations” (1982), he claims that in composing a poem the poet doesn’t perform a speech act, but rather represents the performance of a speech act or acts. When Wordsworth writes

Milton! Thou shouldst be living at this hour:
England hath need of thee—

his words are ostensibly addressed to a long-dead poet, but to perform an illocutionary, any illocutionary action, a person must believe that he can “secure uptake”, that is, secure understanding of his sentence and the speech act performed. Wordsworth, however, knew that Milton was long dead and had no such belief. He thus didn’t perform the illocutionary act of addressing Milton or stating that England needs him. He does represent the performance of those illocutionary acts, however. What poets and other authors of literary works do, Beardsley thinks, is represent the performance of illocutionary acts, not perform illocutionary acts themselves.

To perform illocutionary acts A, B, and C is therefore one thing; to represent the performance of illocutionary acts, A, B, and C, quite another. The latter doesn’t entail the former, as the above example shows. In addition, even if the performance of an illocutionary act is necessarily intentional in one respect—and Beardsley says that “only intentional text production can generate illocutionary actions” (II: 195)—it doesn’t follow that the performance of illocutionary act x requires, as a condition for its performance, the intention to perform x. I can inadvertently insult or warn someone. Some illocutionary acts are defined in terms of an intention, of course—lying, for instance, is defined in terms of the intention to deceive—but that doesn’t mean lying is defined in terms of the intention to lie. That would be circular. And it also doesn’t mean that representing the act of lying requires the intention to deceive. Storytellers frequently represent the act of lying without having any such intention. A person could intend to lie, or intend to represent the act of lying, of course, but those are different matters.

The upshot of this is that

it is… plain that representing [an illocutionary act, such as] an accusation cannot have as its condition an intention to accuse, and indeed these are somewhat at odds, for to take the representational stance is to renounce or withhold or suspend the illocutionary action. (II: 197)

The complete argument, then, is something like this:

The meaning of a sentence ‘S’ is its total illocutionary act potential, that is, its capacity to be used to perform the speech acts, I, J, K.
The performance of speech acts I, J, K in using ‘S’ does not require the corresponding intentions to perform speech acts I, J, K in using ‘S.’
Thus, the meaning of ‘S’ is independent of the intentions of the speaker to perform the speech acts that constitute, as potentially performable acts, the meaning of ‘S.’
Differently put, the meaning of ‘S’ is logically independent of the speaker’s intention to mean what ‘S’ does in fact mean.
Therefore, a speaker’s intention that sentence ‘S’ mean p is logically irrelevant to whether it does mean p.
But even if (4) were false, and the meaning, M, of a non-literary sentence—a sentence not in a work of literature—were partly a function of the speaker’s intention that it mean M, the same wouldn’t be true of a literary sentence.

The proof of (6) is that

An author does not perform an illocutionary act, I, J, K in uttering (writing, dictating, signing, etc.) ‘S.’
Rather, he represents the performance of illocutionary acts I, J, K in uttering ‘S.’
Representing an illocutionary action involves renouncing, withholding, or suspending the performance of that action.
Thus, representing the performance of I, J, K doesn’t require the intention to perform I, J, K.
Consequently, even if (4) were false as far as non-literary sentences were concerned, it would be true as far as literary sentences were concerned, for the meaning of ‘S’ is logically independent of the speaker’s intention to mean what ‘S’ in fact does mean.

This is an interesting and provocative argument, but it can be questioned at several points. One of its limitations is that, even if it’s successful, it proves only that an author’s intentions are irrelevant to the correct interpretation of his text. Essentially employing speech act theory as it does, it doesn’t apply to the interpretation of works of art other than literature—paintings, sculptures, and dances, for example. This is a minor point, though, as analogous concepts are probably available, or could be introduced without too much unnaturalness, in all the arts.

More bothersome is that the key concept here is an unexplained and seemingly unexplainable one. No one has provided a rigorous definition of a speech act. Even these many years after Austin first introduced the concept in the 1950s, little more has been done to clarify and ground it than to cite some handy examples, place the foils of locutionary and perlocutionary acts to the left and right of it, and invoke the “in” versus “by” distinction found above and in virtually every other exposition of the notion. Most philosophers are at least somewhat hesitant to make a concept that’s technical yet so little explained or pinned down the mainstay of a substantial theory, such as a theory of meaning.

That aside, speech act theories of meaning have received their own share of criticism over the years. One objection to a theory like Alston’s—and the acceptability of his theory can’t be pursued at length here—is that it explicates sentence meaning in terms of speech act potential, and thus requires that the illocutionary acts that a sentence can be used to perform be identifiable independently of and prior to the meaning of the sentence used to perform those illocutionary acts. But that’s impossible, the objection runs, and in fact gets things backward. To identify the act of stating that the door is open, rather than, say, the act of asking for an ice cream cone, as an act that the sentence “The door is open” can be used to perform—to identify the former but not the latter as part of the sentence’s speech act potential—requires that the meaning of the sentence first be understood and identified. Absent an understanding of its meaning, it’s anyone’s guess what acts it could be used to perform. Speech act potential is a function of meaning, not, as the theory has it, meaning a function of speech act potential.

Independent of these objections is the fact that the argument doesn’t really prove what it’s supposed to. If it’s correct, it shows that within and/or without literary discourse, it’s possible for ‘S’ to mean M without it being true that the speaker or author intended that ‘S’ mean M. But all that means is that

S’ means M

doesn’t entail

The speaker or author intended that ‘S’ mean M.

In effect, this is another demonstration that Hirsch is wrong, that sentence meaning isn’t identical with speaker meaning. The question at issue, however, is whether speaker meaning is criterial evidence for sentence meaning. For all that the argument shows, it could well be.

There’s also the matter of whether literature is representation, that is, as Beardsley uses the term, one kind of “imitation of a compound illocutionary act”. “The writing of a poem”, Beardsley writes elsewhere (PC: 58, 59),

is not an illocutionary act; it is the creation of a fictional character performing a fictional illocutionary act.

But in his Essay on Man, does Pope create a fictional character who details his views, or does he simply speak his mind in poetic form? The more intuitive answer is the latter, but Beardsley is committed to the former. What makes the Essay on Man didactic, he says, is not that it contains arguments put forward by Pope (arguing is an illocutionary act), but that it contains imitations of arguments put forward by a fictional character (PC: 60–61). We know this because Pope

embodies his doctrines in a discourse that flaunts its poetic form (in sound and meaning) and directs attention to itself as an object of rewarding scrutiny.

The “illocutionary fuse is [therefore] drawn”, and the poem

relinquishes its illocutionary force for aesthetic status, and takes on the character of being an appearance or a show of living language use. (PC: 60)

Although this position can’t be definitively refuted, it’s implausible and subject to the rejoinder that what Pope did is himself speak in the poem, making sure that neither aesthetic interest nor useful instruction were ever altogether lacking. Independent of strong theoretical reasons for thinking otherwise, that’s a simpler and better explanation than Beardsley’s. The point can be reinforced if didactic literary works other than poems are considered. Aldous Huxley’s essays are literary works, but it’s even more implausible to posit a fictional speaker for them, and to think of them as imitations of compound illocutionary acts, rather than simply as compound speech acts performed by Huxley.

But even if Beardsley’s view that a literary work is a representation or imitation of a speech act is acceptable, still another curious feature of the argument concerns his treatment of the distinction between performing a speech act and representing the performance of a speech act. Beardsley writes as if the two were mutually exclusive. They’re not. While it’s true that it’s one thing to state that p and quite another to represent that someone is stating that p, representing (in language) is itself a speech act just as much as stating is. Representing that someone is stating that p is like stating that someone is stating that p—just a speech act with a more complicated conceptual content and structure than simply stating that p. Given that that’s so, the two halves of Beardsley argument, (1)–(5) and (6)–(11), merge.

And it’s probably a good thing that representing is a speech act. If “Milton!” in Wordsworth’s poem were being used in a representation that wasn’t the performance of any speech act at all, that would presumably be because it had no speech act potential. On the Alston/Beardsley theory of meaning, it would then have no meaning. Since it evidently does have meaning, it has to have some speech act potential. And since it seems to share a good deal of its meaning with “Milton!” as bellowed by a seventeenth century fish-monger hailing the poet, its speech act potentials within and without the poem must overlap to a fair extent—all this on the assumption that the Alston/Beardsley theory of meaning is correct. The gulf that Beardsley sees between literary discourse and non-literary discourse, as far as speech acts are concerned, thus isn’t nearly as wide as he seems to think, even if a literary work is a representation or imitation of a speech act.

13. Criteria and Meaning

The problems with Beardsley’s argument are significant enough to conclude that it needn’t be accepted. The question still remains, however, whether an author’s intention that ‘S’ means M is criterial evidence for its meaning M. That question can be asked independently of Beardsley’s argument, but on the assumption that his preferred theory of meaning is correct (thereby, as in much of the above, putting to the side general objections to speech act theory and speech act theories of meaning) or on the assumption that another theory of meaning is correct. As far as the question at issue is concerned, in other words, it probably doesn’t make much difference whether the Beardsley/Alston theory is correct, or some other theory is. In all likelihood, the result would be the same. But regardless of whether it would or wouldn’t, exploring alternative theories of meaning is impossible in this context, so only the Alston/Beardsley theory will be considered below.

In addition, though, and as Beardsley’s argument in effect reminds us, there might be important differences between non-literary and literary discourse, such that what holds (or doesn’t hold) in one doesn’t hold (or holds) in the other. The very nature of literature might itself make a difference. Two determinations are needed, then, one respecting the relevance or irrelevance of an authors’ intentions in non-literary discourse and one respecting whether the fact that a discourse is literary makes it importantly different from non-literary discourse as far as the relevance of authors’ intentions is concerned. In what follows, the issue concerning non-literary discourse will be discussed first and at length; the issue concerning literary discourse, second and much more briefly.

On a speech act theory of meaning, the inference from

The author intended x to mean p in work w


x means p in work w

is the inference from

The author intended x to mean p in writing work w


x means p in work w.

Further glossed in terms of speech acts (but slurring over considerations of intensionality), this is the inference from

The author intended x to have illocutionary act potential z in writing x in work w


x has illocutionary act potential z in work w,

where the inference is supposedly criterial, and z is the total illocutionary act potential—the potential to perform illocutionary acts I, J, K—that constitutes the meaning of x. The question at issue here is a species of a genus, the genus being whether intending that s is p is criterial evidence for s’s being p, with the differentia being that s is a piece of non-literary discourse and p a meaning, a speech act potential.

Answering this question requires taking a slight detour. In the 1950s and 1960s premises respecting behavior were frequently said to be criterial evidence for the existence of mental states of certain kinds (though the matter wasn’t very clearly delineated or explained, and the term “criterial evidence” didn’t exist). The most discussed example, originating in the work of Wittgenstein, concerned pain behavior and pain: a person’s pain behavior was said to be criterial evidence for his being in pain. The inference from (C) to (D) is, near enough, the converse inference, from a mental state to behavior or, more properly, from a mental state to an effect, an object (a piece of discourse) having a certain property (a certain speech act potential).

The central question to ask about any supposed criterial inference is whether we understand the nature of the phenomena mentioned in the premise and conclusion to be necessarily caught up with other, but not in such a way that the presence of either entails the other. If A is a criterion of B, then it’s a necessary truth that A is evidence for, or counts toward, B—so says Anthony Kenny in speaking of a criterion in the sense intended here. If a criterion is understood in this way—and the term is certainly being used in a technical, non-everyday sense if it is—there’s a fair amount of intuitive appeal to the claim that pain behavior is a criterion for being in pain. Our understanding of what pain and pain behavior are seems to connect the two necessarily. That’s true even if no one in pain ever exhibits pain behavior, or everyone exhibits pain behavior when not in pain. (Admittedly, the scenarios for either state of affairs would be very strange. Neither is impossible, though.) Likewise, although every act of lying could turn out to be right, and every act of non-lying turn out to be wrong, our understanding of what wrongness and lying are is such that the latter necessarily counts toward the former. On the other hand, our understanding of drinking arsenic and dying—of what they are—isn’t such that drinking arsenic is criterial for dying. It’s not that our understanding of dying is somehow necessarily caught up with the idea of drinking arsenic the way it is in the pain-pain behavior and lying-wrongness cases. Even if every time a person drank arsenic he died, and every time a person died he had drunk arsenic, the connection between the two is purely inductive.

How is it then with the inference from

The author intended x to have illocutionary act potential z in writing x in work w


x has illocutionary act potential z in work w?

Consider an example discussed on a number of occasions by Beardsley and already cited above: Humpty Dumpty. Humpty Dumpty says, “There’s glory for you!”, and his sentence, he claims, means there’s a nice knockdown argument for you. Alice doesn’t believe him. It means that, Humpty Dumpty explains, because “when I use a word, it means just what I choose it to mean—neither more nor less”. Alice doubts that he can make the sentence mean that just by choosing that it mean that. Common sense is certainly on her side. Beardsley’s reply is a little different. He says that because Humpty Dumpty has provided no stipulative definition of “glory”, he knows that Alice can’t be expected to “secure uptake”, that is, understand the novel meaning he attaches to use of the word, and thus can’t intend to perform the speech act of boasting that his argument for the superiority of unbirthdays to birthdays is a conclusive one. Since meaning is constituted by speech act potential, he therefore can’t intend to mean “nice knockdown argument” by “glory” (II: 202–203).

What Beardsley says here is basically correct. To show that the intentional fallacy is indeed a fallacy, however, to show that (C) isn’t criterial evidence for (D), the premise concerning the author’s intention should be assumed to be true, and the strength of the inference gauged on that assumption. If a fallacy has indeed been committed, the premise, considered simply by itself, will lend no support to the conclusion. But instead of examining the case of Humpty Dumpty as just indicated, Beardsley questions the truth of the premise, and correctly finds it wanting. That isn’t to the point.

In fact, several things might be said in favor of a criterial relation between (C) and (D). First, the cases of moral rightness and pain suggest that a natural home for criteria is in phenomena that are undeniable but unobservable. Much, if not all, of what can’t be observed but is obviously real needs a criterion or criteria to gain a foothold in our thinking and discourse. (It could even be argued that everything that figures in our thinking and discourse, whether observable or non-observable, stands in need of a criterion or criteria. Kenny, for one, holds as much.) Linguistic meaning seems to be just that sort of thing. Second, rightness, pain, and meaning, though real, seem to be ontologically slighter than paradigmatically real things, such as physical objects (stars), forces (electro-magnetism), or even everyday properties and property instantiations (weighing five pounds, Philadelphia’s being in Pennsylvania). Their conceptual connections to the well-anchored items of everyday life—rocks, gravity, shapes—are few in number, and re-identification of one and the same pain, for example, more inherently problematic. A pain is not something and not nothing, Wittgenstein wrote, and though the remark is cryptic, much the same seems to be true of meaning. Part of its life needs to be breathed into it by criteria. Third, there’s Beardsley’s own concession that “only intentional text production can generate illocutionary actions”, and therefore meaning, on his theory of meaning. If an author’s intention is necessary for a text to have a meaning at all, that suggests that the intention that x mean m is criterial—not logically necessary but criterial—for x’s meaning m. Bolstering this suggestion is the fact that it’s hard to imagine that x means m, but that no one has ever intended that x mean m in producing a text that contains x.

These considerations, however, are more inconclusive hints at arguments than arguments themselves. First, the fact that meanings are unobservable but real suggests that we should be on the lookout for criteria; it doesn’t mean that they have criteria. More is needed to show that. Numbers, it might be argued, are also unobservable but real, yet stand in need of no criteria. Second, apart from the obscurity of the notion of ontological slightness, meanings are surely no more ontologically slender than numbers, which, again, seem to require no criteria. Finally, there’s the point that even if the promissory notes that really are the first two considerations can be made good on, all that would show is that meaning in general stands in need of a criterion or criteria. It wouldn’t show that a criterion of a text’s having meaning is an author’s intention that it have meaning, much less that a criterion for a text’s having the meaning that it has is the author’s intention that it have that meaning.

But the third consideration may come to the rescue here. Beardsley himself says that intentional text production is necessary for a text to have a meaning (an admission, incidentally, which goes against a number of things he wrote earlier in his career), and it’s a natural step from there to an author’s intention as criterial for textual meaning, indeed, as criterial for a conceptual correspondence between the two (intending to mean m, meaning m). In addition, even if it’s not a necessary truth that if ‘S’ means m, someone at some time intended that ‘S’ mean m in producing a token of ‘S’, the former is at least criterial for the latter.

But why the claim just mentioned isn’t a necessary truth is instructive. It’s not because it’s possible that A, the first and only user of ‘S’, mistakenly thought there was a linguistic convention according to which ‘S’ means n. Operating on that assumption, he uttered ‘S’, intending it to mean n. However, because of contextual clues respecting the surroundings in which ‘S’ was used, because of the topic under discussion when it was used, and because of ignorance and misunderstanding (of the language and of what A was driving at) on the part of his listeners, all his listeners took it that there was already a linguistic convention according to which ‘S’ means m. That’s how they understood ‘S’, and they thus believed and acted accordingly. A, oblivious to the misunderstanding on their part, soon forgets about ‘S’ and the meaning he attached to it. In these circumstances, ‘S’ means m because that’s what the language-using community takes it to mean: in effect, their beliefs and behavior establish a convention according to which ‘S’ means m. The meaning rests on what might be called “community uptake”, not individual uptake of speech act performance, as Beardsley has it, and not the speaker’s intention, as intentionalists have it.

This strange little scenario is important not so much because it’s a counterexample to the claim that if ‘S’ means m, then at some time someone means m in using ‘S’, but as illustrating something of greater importance: the existence of a linguistic convention that ‘S’ means m is a criterion, in the technical sense explained above, for ‘S’ meaning m. It’s not a logically sufficient condition, not definitive evidence, at least as far as the meaning of a token sentence is concerned, for in specific circumstances other factors may override the meaning specified by the convention. That, in fact, has to be the case if metaphor, synecdoche, metonymy, and irony are to be possible at all. (Briefly, a token sentence is a sentence considered as a concrete particular, with a specifiable spatio-temporal location. Token sentences contrast with type sentences. A type sentence is an abstract particular, not locatable in space and time. All token sentences are tokens of a type, in much the same way that all token 2023 Toyota Corollas—spatio-temporal objects found on streets and highways—are tokens of a single type, 2023 Toyota Corolla. As far as sentences are concerned, what this amounts to is that a single type sentence, ‘S’, can have many tokens. There’s only one type sentence “The door is open”, but there are many tokens of that type, a number of which can be found in this article.) Linguistic conventions are one factor that has to be considered in every case of token sentence meaning. They may not be the last word in determining token sentence meaning—though they frequently are just that—but they’re always the first word.

Perhaps paradoxically, given what was just said, the counterexample also illustrates a more important claim, that a speaker’s intention that ‘S’ mean m is a criterion for its meaning m, or at least very nearly so. This is because: (1) linguistic convention is a criterion for token sentence meaning, and a linguistic convention, as the example shows, is a function of overall community understanding, treatment, and belief. (2) A speaker’s intention is one component in such understanding, treatment, and belief, and thus is criterial for linguistic convention. In other words, since a speaker of a language is a member of the linguistic community in which he speaks, and since, as Beardsley himself holds, an intention that ‘S’ means m involves a belief that ‘S’ means m, the speaker’s intention figures into the overall function that determines the creation or maintenance of a convention. (3) The relation “is criterial for” is transitive, or at least very nearly so. If X’s being criterial for Y and Y’s being criterial for Z doesn’t entail that X is criterial for Z, it still lends some near criterial support for Z. More briefly but slightly inaccurately, the argument is that since a speaker’s intention that ‘S’ means m is criterial for the existence of a convention that ‘S’ means m, and the existence of a convention that ‘S’ means m is criterial for ‘S’’s meaning m, a speaker’s intention that ‘S’ means m is criterial for ‘S’ meaning m. A speaker’s intention must thus be regarded as having some evidential weight in determining his sentence’s meaning. As far as everyday discourse is concerned, then, the intentional fallacy is no fallacy at all, strictly speaking.

14. The Letter of the Law and The Spirit of the Law

But the letter of the law is one thing, its spirit quite another. Even if speaker intention counts for something, for two reasons, it doesn’t count for much, at least in the great majority of cases. One swallow is not a summer, and a single such intention or belief not a convention or, except in very odd circumstances, sufficient for one. Cases like those of Humpty Dumpty and the counterexample discussed above show how slight the weight of a speaker’s intention is in the face of a convention that’s already established (the case of Humpty Dumpty) or even in the process of being established (the case of A and his community). And the situation we in fact find ourselves in is just that of Alice. The weight carried by pre-existing linguistic conventions makes it look as if Humpty Dumpty’s intention has no weight at all. If what was argued above is correct, it doesn’t have no weight, but a microgram is, for practical purposes, weightless when counterbalanced by a boulder. Thus even if strictly speaking, there’s no intentional fallacy, it would be much more misleading in practice to say that there isn’t one than that there is one.

The case of Humpty Dumpty shouldn’t be misunderstood, however. The establishment or maintenance of a linguistic convention isn’t simply a matter of majority opinion within a speaking community. A convention is more than a collection of beliefs, understandings, and treatments. It carries normative force with it, and normative force, although undergirded by and impossible without community support, doesn’t simply sway in the direction that the breeze of majority opinion happens to be blowing at the time. The normative nature of a convention enables it to be relatively, though not wholly, resistant to contrary opinion. That’s why it’s possible for most people to spell “accommodate” incorrectly (the conventions of spelling call for it to be spelled with two ‘m’s, but most people spell it with one) and why it’s possible for most people to have an incorrect belief about the meaning of the word “fortuitous” (the conventions of the language call for it to mean by chance or accidental, but most people think it means lucky).

The second reason why the conclusion that, strictly speaking, there’s no intentional fallacy is of limited import is in effect pointed out by Beardsley. The notion of speaker meaning—a speaker’s intention that ‘S’ mean m in his utterance of ‘S’—is parasitic on that of a convention, and thus on sentence meaning. In intending what he does, that is, in intending that his sentence mean m, and not n, o, or p, a speaker is perforce trying to conform to what he takes to be a pre-existing convention. If he doesn’t take there to be such a convention, he needs to stipulate one—which itself involves invoking pre-existing conventions. If he doesn’t do that and doesn’t try to conform to a pre-existing convention, there’s no reason to think that he’s trying to communicate, to utter a sentence with a determinate meaning, or to perform any speech act at all. In other words, without the assumption of a pre-existing convention, there’s no content to the notion of an intention to mean anything at all, much less to mean m. Even if a speaker’s intention is criterial in determining conventions and sentence meaning, conventions have to be conceptualized as relatively independent of the speaker, as logically prior to speaker meaning, and as a constraint on speaker meaning.

The upshot is that, to put a fine point on it, there’s no intentional fallacy, but that a fine point shouldn’t be put on it. As far as everyday discourse is concerned, proper interpretive practice directs us to ignore speakers’ intentions. For considered in and of itself, in the context of a living, fully developed language, a speaker’s intention has vanishingly small weight, noticeable at all, if ever, only in a very small number of circumstances. An additional merit of this view is that it helps to explain the facts that (1) in the vast majority of cases, questions of speaker intention needn’t and don’t arise in interpreting a person’s remarks; (2) hard cases are possible—conventions are of necessity open-ended, somewhat indefinite, and possibly in tension with other conventions; (3) it’s natural, and not entirely unreasonable, to evoke speaker intention to resolve such hard cases; (4) the gnawing feeling that the meaning of an utterance isn’t altogether divorced from the meaning intention of its speaker has some basis; (5) despite (3), proponents of the intentional fallacy can always find ways of resolving hard cases without invoking the intentions of the speaker.

15. Back to Literary Discourse

So much for non-literary discourse. The second question is: Does what holds for non-literary discourse also hold for literary discourse? Beardsley’s convinced that it does. He sees no fundamental difference between the two. There’s a lot to be said for that view. It largely jibes with our interpretive experience and recognizes the continuity of all forms of discourse. It also doesn’t require us to read by a new set of rules when we put down The Racing Forum and pick up Ruskin, which is certainly appealing. Those are impressive reasons in its favor, and strongly recommend it for adoption.

But the key word here is “adoption”. The view is a proposal for how to conceptualize literature (and in the long run art in general); it isn’t dictated by the facts of the case or by the very concept of literature. An alternative proposal, and a popular one in many circles, is to conceptualize literature as much more closely tied to the life of the author, and to attach greater interpretive weight to his intentions than with non-literary discourse. This proposal does bifurcate discourse, but, advocates would claim, there are cultural and aesthetic advantages to doing so. Three of them are that (1) literature is thereby tied much more closely to biography, history, and culture in general, (2) the realm of the aesthetic is not as segregated from, but is much more integrated into, other valuational realms than it would otherwise be, and (3) natural, even irrepressible, urges to look beyond art to the artist aren’t automatically frustrated or denigrated, as far as criticism is concerned. The systematic virtues and vices of both this position and Beardsley’s can’t be pursued here, but it is important to note that the issue is a large and overarching one concerning how best to conceptualize art and its place in human life.

16. The Internal and the External

Broader than concerns about the artist’s intention and encompassing them is the distinction between external and internal evidence. The distinction is similar to, but diverges from, that between direct and indirect evident noted above. “Internal evidence”, Beardsley says, “is evidence from direct inspection of the object” (Aesth: 20). What is internal is publicly accessible;

it is discovered [in the case of poetry] through the semantics and syntax of a poem, through our habitual knowledge of the language through grammars, dictionaries, and all the literature which is the source of dictionaries, in general through all that makes a language and culture. (IF: 477)

“External evidence”, on the other hand,

is evidence from the psychological and social background of the object, from which we may infer something about the object itself. (Aesth: 20)

What is external is not publicly accessible; it is

private or idiosyncratic; not [again in the case of poetry] a part of the work as a linguistic fact: it consists of revelations (in journals, for example, or letters or recorded conversations) about how or why the poet wrote the poem—to what lady, while sitting on what lawn, or at the death of a friend or brother. (IF: 477–478)

In addition to internal and external evidence, there is

an intermediate kind of evidence about the character of the author or about private or semi-private meanings attached to words or topics by the author or by a coterie of which he is a member. (IF: 478)

External evidence is verboten, but at least at the time of “The Intentional Fallacy”, intermediate evidence was admissible, the reason being that

the meaning of words is the history of words, and the biography of an author, his use of a word, and the associations the word had for him, are part of the word’s history and meaning. (IF: 478)

Caution has to be exercised, though, for the line between intermediate evidence and external evidence isn’t sharp and

a critic who is concerned with [internal] evidence… and moderately with [intermediate] evidence will in the long run produce a different sort of comment from that of the critic who is concerned with [external] evidence and with [intermediate] evidence. (IF: 478)

The distinction thus drawn is far from clear, though. On the one hand, information gleaned from a poet’s diary, workbook, letters, and rough drafts, or information about what he was reading or thinking about as he created his work, isn’t internal evidence in that it can’t be had from directly inspecting his poem. On the other hand, it does seem to be internal, in that such information is publicly accessible, and might well be part of “all that makes a language and culture”. Resolving that tension is only part of the issue, however. “The character of the author” or the “private or semi-private meanings attached to words or topics by the author or by a coterie of which he is a member” might be revealed in a diary or workbook, and part of a “word’s history and meaning” might be recorded in a letter. That makes it sound like intermediate evidence. More than anything else, though, what a diary or a workbook contains is “evidence [respecting] the psychological and social background” of a work, and such information is no different from “revelations… in journals… or letters”. It would thus seem to be external evidence, as Beardsley talks about it. Is the information found in diaries, journals, workbooks, rough drafts, letters, and so on internal, external, or intermediate evidence, then? All three, it would seem.

Though the distinction between kinds of evidence isn’t well drawn by Beardsley, that may be because when he wrote “The Intentional Fallacy” his views weren’t as clear or definite as they were later to become, or because he later changed his mind and became more tough-minded. Intermediate evidence is never mentioned in Aesthetics or in any of his subsequent writings, and if the distinction between internal and external evidence is considered only as it’s drawn in Aesthetics, it’s relatively clean: internal evidence is evidence based on a direct inspection of the aesthetic object and nothing else; external evidence is evidence based on sources outside the object. That at least seems to draw a fairly bright line between the internal and the external. Unfortunately, drawing the distinction this way re-introduces the problems about not using external sources noted above in relation to the intentional fallacy.

All of that said, the feeling remains that there has to be something to the internal/external distinction, even if it isn’t explicated in a satisfactory way by Beardsley. Intuitively, some properties are properties of a work, and some properties aren’t properties of a work. Related to this is what’s really at issue, the matter of proper methodology, or the epistemology of interpretation: some evidence is relevant to what a work means—and what else but properties of the work itself?—and some evidence isn’t logically relevant to what a work means—and what else but properties of things other than the work? Put this way, the distinction seems inevitable, and indeed, it’s hard to see how art criticism can get along without it. Rejecting it altogether is tantamount to inviting “chaos of thought and passion, all confused”—in other words, the potential relevance of anything and everything to interpretation, and thus no limits on what a work of art can justifiably be said to mean. Deconstructionists may well welcome such unlimited freedom, but lesser breeds who like the law—which includes historicist, romantic, psychoanalytic, and other critics, besides new critics—will wonder whether the very idea of interpretation has been lost in the midst of anarchy.

But even if an internal/external distinction of some sort is well-nigh necessary, it’s probably best not to couch it in exactly those terms. The real issue isn’t so much what’s in and what’s out as what’s relevant and what’s not. Beardsley’s terminology not only obscures that fact but skews the true substantive issue: strongly suggested by the very use of the terms “internal” and “external” is that relevant information is internal to a work, that is, propositions whose subject terms refer to the work or part of the work and whose predicate terms refer to properties discernible by experiencing the work; and irrelevant information is external to a work, that is, propositions whose subject terms refer to something other than the work or part of the work, or to properties not discernible by experiencing the work.

In the long run, the distinction will have to be drawn, just as the issue of the intentional fallacy will have to be decided, on the basis of a comprehensive theory of meaning in conjunction with a rich and well-worked-out conception of art.


Primary Literature

  • Beardsley, Monroe C., 1950, Practical Logic, New York: Prentice-Hall.
  • –––, 1950, Thinking Straight: A Guide for Readers & Writers, (Prentice-Hall English Composition and Introduction to Literature Series), New York: Prentice-Hall.
  • –––, 1958 [1981], Aesthetics: Problems in the Philosophy of Criticism, New York: Harcourt, Brace. Second edition with new postscript, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 1981. Page numbers are from the 1981 edition
  • [PC] –––, 1970, The Possibility of Criticism, (Criticism Monograph 2), Detroit, MI: Wayne State University Press.
  • [APV] –––, 1982a, The Aesthetic Point of View: Selected Essays, Michael J. Wreen and Donald M. Callen (eds.), Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • [II] –––, 1982b, “Intentions and Interpretations: A Fallacy Revived”, in 1982a: 188–207.
  • [IF] Wimsatt, William K. and Monroe C. Beardsley, 1946 [1987], “The Intentional Fallacy”, The Sewanee Review, 54(3): 468–488. Reprinted in Philosophy Looks at the Arts, third edition, Joseph Margolis (ed.), Philadelphia, PA: Temple University Press, 1987, pp. 367–380. Page numbers from 1946
  • –––, 1949 [1971], “The Affective Fallacy”, The Sewanee Review, 57(1): 31–55. Reprinted in Critical Theory since Plato, Hazard Adams (ed.), New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich, 1971, pp. 1022–1031.

A much more comprehensive bibliography of Beardsley’s work is available upon request from the author.

Secondary Literature

This article has concentrated on only a few of the many topics that Beardsley wrote on. Among others are aesthetic experience, aesthetic properties (regional qualities), criteria of critical evaluation, metaphor, and the place of the arts in human life. The bibliography of secondary literature that follows is, in the main, restricted to the topics discussed in this entry, but a few important articles on other topics are also included.

  • Carney, James D., 1983, “Interpreting Poetry”, Journal of Aesthetic Education, 17(3): 53–60. doi:10.2307/3332408
  • Carroll, Noël, 1992, “Art, Intention, and Conversation”, in Intention and Interpretation, Gary Iseminger (ed.), Philadelphia, PA: Temple University Press: 97–131.
  • –––, 1997, “The Intentional Fallacy: Defending Myself”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 55(3):: 305–309. doi:10.2307/431800
  • –––, 2000, “Interpretation and Intention: The Debate between Hypothetical and Actual Intentionalism”, Metaphilosophy, 31(1/2): 75–95. doi:10.1111/1467-9973.00131
  • –––, 2010, “On the Historical Significance and Structure of Monroe Beardsley’s Aesthetics: An Appreciation”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 44(1): 2–10. doi:10.5406/jaesteduc.44.1.0002
  • Danto, Arthur, 1981, The Transfiguration of the Commonplace, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Davies, Stephen, 1990, “Functional and Procedural Definitions of Art”, Journal of Aesthetic Education, 24(2): 99–106. doi:10.2307/3332789
  • –––, 2005, “Beardsley and the Autonomy of the Work of Art”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 63(2): 179–183. doi:10.1111/j.0021-8529.2005.00195.x
  • Dickie, George, 1965, “Beardsley’s Phantom Aesthetic Experience”, The Journal of Philosophy, 62(5): 129–136. doi:10.2307/2023490
  • –––, 1969, “Defining Art”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 6(3): 253–256.
  • –––, 1974, Art and the Aesthetic: An Institutional Analysis, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 1987, “Beardsley, Sibley, and Critical Principles”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 46(2): 229–237. doi:10.2307/431861
  • –––, 2005, “The Origins of Beardsley’s Aesthetics”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 63(2): 175–178. doi:10.1111/j.0021-8529.2005.00194.x
  • Dickie, George and W. Kent Wilson, 1995, “The Intentional Fallacy: Defending Beardsley”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 53(3): 233–250. doi:10.2307/431349
  • Feagin, Susan L., 2010, “Beardsley for the Twenty-First Century”, The Journal of Aesthetic Education, 44(1): 11–18. doi:10.5406/jaesteduc.44.1.0011
  • Fisher, John (ed.), 1983, Essays on Aesthetics: Perspectives on the Work of Monroe C. Beardsley, Philadelphia, PA: Temple University Press.
  • Goldman, Alan, 2005, “Beardsley’s Legacy: The Theory of Aesthetic Value”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 63(2): 185–189. doi:10.1111/j.0021-8529.2005.00196.x
  • Grossman, Morris, 2014, “On Beardsley’s ‘An Aesthetic Definition of Art’, 1983”, in Art and Morality: Essays in the Spirit of George Santayana, Martin A. Coleman (ed.), New York: Fordham University Press, 145–160 (ch. 12).
  • Hancher, Michael, 1972, “Poems versus Trees: The Aesthetics of Monroe Beardsley”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 31(2): 181–191. doi:10.2307/429279
  • Hirsch, E. D., 1967, Validity in Interpretation, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Iseminger, Gary, 2004, The Aesthetic Function of Art, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Krukowski, Lucian, 1981, “Commentary on Monroe Beardsley’s Paper, ‘Fiction as Representation’”, Synthese, 46(3): 325–330. doi:10.1007/BF01130044
  • Maier, Rosemarie, 1970, “‘The Intentional Fallacy’ and the Logic of Literary Criticism”, College English, 32(2): 135–145. doi:10.2307/374640
  • Montgomery, Marion, 1965, “On Reading ‘The Intentional Fallacy’: The Problem of ‘Internal Evidence’”, College English, 26(7): 540–542. doi:10.2307/373521
  • Morton, Bruce N., 1974, “Beardsley’s Conception of the Aesthetic Object”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 32(3): 385–396. doi:10.2307/428423
  • Reichert, John, 1972, “Monroe Beardsley and the Shape of Literary Theory”, College English, 33(5): 558–570. doi:10.2307/375415
  • Smith, Ralph A., 1984, “The Aesthetics of Monroe C. Beardsley: Recent Work”, Studies in Art Education, 25(3): 141–150.
  • Tate, Allen, 1955, “Literature as Knowledge”, in The Man of Letters in the Modern World, New York: Meridian, pp. 34–63.
  • Taylor, Paul A., 2014, “Meaning, Expression, and the Interpretation of Literature”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 72(4): 379–391. doi:10.1111/jaac.12116
  • Walhout, Donald, 1998, “A Comparative Study of Three Aesthetic Philosophies”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 15(1): 127–142.
  • Walton, Kendall L., 1970, “Categories of Art”, The Philosophical Review, 79(3): 334–367. doi:10.2307/2183933
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas, 2005, “Beardsley’s Approach”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 63(2): 191–195. doi:10.1111/j.0021-8529.2005.00197.x
  • Zangwill, Nick, 2001, The Metaphysics of Beauty, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


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