Notes to George Berkeley

1. Berkeley also argues against abstractionism in Alciphron and A Defense of Free-thinking in Mathematics (Berkeley 1948-1957, 3: 292-293, 331-335, 4: 134-5). See also the First draft of The Introduction to the Principles, which differs in important ways from the published version (Berkeley 1948-57, 2: 121-145).

2. Interpreters have usefully distinguished several different types of abstract ideas attacked by Berkeley. See Pappas 2000, 40-44.

3. The question of what exactly Berkeley's argument against abstraction is, and what role it plays in supporting his immaterialism, is a disputed one. Winkler (1989, 30-35) and Jesseph (1993, 20-33) maintain that Berkeley's main argument against abstraction is the argument from impossibility, according to which abstract ideas are impossible because they would be ideas of impossible objects. Such an argument could only play a supporting role in the attack on materialism. Others (including Pappas 2000, Bolton 1987, Atherton 1987, Muehlmann 1992) interpret the argument differently and assign a more central role to it. McKim 1997-8 provides a critical review of several relatively recent positions on the issue.

4. More specifically, she inquired as to “how the soul of man (since it is but a thinking substance) can determine the spirits of the body to produce voluntary actions” (Atherton 1994, 11).

5. The origin of the label is Gallois 1974.

6. Analogously, I can conceive of something not thought of by me right now, even if in order to do so I must employ a representation that is conceived of by me right now. If Berkeley denies this, he ends up a solipsist and a presentist, not just an idealist, as is noted by many commentators, e.g. Tipton 1974, 161.

7. Campbell (2002, 128) attributes something like this point to Berkeley as well.

8. It presupposes representationalism because it assumes that we are immediately confronted with mind-dependent ideas and then raises the question of whether we can use them to conceive of unconceived, mind-independent objects.

9. Saidel 1993 provides a useful review and critique of some contemporary approaches to the Master Argument.

10. Another interesting and detailed account of the “identification argument” and the “argument from perceptual relativity” is offered by Muehlmann 1992, chapter 5.

11. More precisely, according to mechanism, bodies are not colored in the way we suppose them to be, based on our sensory ideas. One (Lockean) account of color is as a (mere) power to cause ideas in us. On that account, bodies are in fact colored and they would be colored even in the absence of perceivers.

12. For an alternative, phenomenalist account of Berkeleyian objects, see Winkler 1989, 191-203.

13. Contra more realistic interpretations of Berkeley's ideas (sensible objects) proffered by Luce 1963 and Atherton 1990. On this topic see also Atherton 1995 and McCracken 1995.

14. See The Search After Truth, Elucidation Fifteen (Malebranche 1980, 657-668).

15. Of course, “if we open it” also requires an idealistic gloss, which would presumably go something like this: “If we form a volition to open it, which is then followed by the having of series of ideas of our hands moving, of the watch opening, etc.”.

16. Of course, this isn't true of occasionalists such as Malebranche, who faced the same problem as Berkeley. It should also be noted that many officially rejected Descartes' stance that natural philosophy concerns only efficient causation. Boyle, e.g., decreed that it should consider final causes, thus allowing it to partner with natural theology. His own work, however, had the overwhelming effect of directing attention to mechanical, presumably efficient, causes. Berkeley piously affirms the relevance of final causes to natural philosophy at PHK 107. For more on these issues see Nadler 1998.

17. For a more detailed and somewhat subtler account, see Downing, forthcoming.

18. This oft-cited limerick and its companion (see below) can be found in Fleming 1985.

19. His claims here are interesting and perceptive. He maintains that the materialists must hold that the proper objects of the senses, e.g. light and colors, pop in and out of existence. And he highlights, à la Malebranche, the scholastic doctrine that conservation amounts to continuous creation. In both cases, however, there are clear grounds for arguing that the doctrine violates common sense less egregiously than an idealist intermittent existence.

20. Jonathan Bennett (1971, 170) turned this fact into a subject of scholarly controversy.

21. A number of controversial issues lurk here. Does Berkeley hold that ordinary objects are mediately or immediately perceived? Does Berkeley hold that all perception is immediate perception? A good guide here is George Pappas (2000, 147-182), who argues that Berkeley does allow for mediate perception, but that ordinary objects are typically immediately perceived.

22. Though done on the basis of regularities established by God.

23. Wilson 1999, 241 nicely raises a version of this worry.

24. See Wilson 1999, 241, footnote 2, where she cites Nicholas Sturgeon's comments to her as the source of this point.

25. Berkeley explicitly affirms that spirits are substances in the Principles and Dialogues. Nevertheless, Robert Muehlmann (1992, ch. 6) has argued that Berkeley's true view remains the Humean “congeries” account, although he conceals it.

26. Note that the marginal “+” sign that accompanies this entry is usually taken as Berkeley's indication that he has rejected or dropped consideration of the point contained therein.

27. The importance of regularity is not explicit in these entries, but Winkler (1989, 108-9) argues convincingly that Berkeley acknowledges it.

28. Tipton (1974, 307) notes that this definition would be “suspiciously useful” given Berkeley's purposes.

29. Though he is happy to cite established authors when he agrees with them, more especially in his later works.

Copyright © 2011 by
Lisa Downing <>

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