Notes to Isaiah Berlin

1. The distinction between the human or cultural ‘sciences’ (as Berlin rarely called them in his own voice) – history, philosophy, law and the various social ‘sciences’, such as sociology, economics, anthropology etc. – had become a major issue in nineteenth-century German philosophy. It continued to play an important part in Germany in the earlier twentieth century, and also became a significant issue in the English-speaking world, as a result both of the influence of the Vienna Circle and of the emergence of the social sciences as an increasingly self-confident and respected field of study. Berlin’s work, even though it invoked earlier figures such as Giambattista Vico and J. G. Herder, closely resembled, and was influenced by, attempts by such thinkers as Heinrich Rickert, Wilhelm Dilthey and Max Weber to explain the nature of the ‘Geisteswissenschaften’, the German word for the humanities, usually translated as ‘human sciences’.

Berlin’s use of the terms ‘humanities’ and ‘humane studies’ is motivated by his insistence that their aims and methods differ radically – a position that would be masked by using the term ‘human sciences’, which is the normal rendering of ‘Geisteswissenschaften’, as opposed to ‘Naturwissenschaften’, the ‘natural sciences’. The locus classicus for his distinction is ‘The Divorce between the Sciences and the Humanities’ (in Berlin 1979). ‘Humanities’ is by far his most frequent term, and the one we adopt here except in historical contexts that make ‘human sciences’ more natural (Berlin’s own practice). See also note 6.

2. Berlin remained vague about the nature and origin of these concepts and categories. Given his overall outlook, and hints scattered through his writings, it seems likely that he believed they come mainly from culture, education, ordinary experience and common social practices, as well as philosophical theories. Some might be ‘inbuilt’ to the extent that they are influenced by certain basic needs or tendencies intrinsic to human beings, or (like Kant’s examples of space and time) are required to make sense of the world and human existence in ways comprehensible to our minds, given the manner in which these are able to function. But Berlin believed that only a few of the concepts and categories that we use are like this; many are cultural or theoretical artefacts, subject to deliberate alteration or change in response to experience. Examples of basic concepts that have been transient include a teleological conception of nature – that is, the view that everything that exists in the world exists for a purpose, and is defined by the purpose that it pursues – and a conception of human beings as wholly different from animals, as opposed to a view that sees them as a (particularly well-developed) kind of animal.

As for the difference between concepts and categories, the passage in Historical Inevitability quoted from in the text (2002b, 144, note 1), Berlin’s only fully explicit account of the distinction between these two types of element in the structure of our thought, appears to show that categories (Berlin’s examples here are ‘the three dimensions and infinite extent of ordinary perceptual space, the irreversibility of temporal processes, the multiplicity and countability of material objects’) are more capacious, unspecific and abstract than concepts. However, the boundary between the two is left open, and it is unclear at what point it is crossed in the sequence of increasingly specific and varied examples Berlin gives: colours, shapes, (gustatory) tastes, ‘the uniformities on which the sciences are based’, ‘the categories of value’, ‘moral standards’, ‘rules of etiquette’, subjective preferences of taste. Concepts are thus perhaps related to categories somewhat as species to genus, though Berlin does not put it in exactly these terms, and the evidence for his view does not point to any precise, or consistent, position. For other, suggestive but less discriminatory, passages about categories and/or concepts see e.g. 1951, 6–7; 1978b, 9–11, 205–6, 217–20, 324; 2000a, 57–60; 1979, 130.

Berlin did not offer a definitive statement or theory about concepts and categories, not only because to do so involved doing the sort of philosophical work from which he shrank, but also because he thought that different concepts and categories differed in their origins, function, necessity, plasticity etc. For him, such concepts and categories were simply facts about the way we think, which were philosophically significant, but best approached in historical or psychological terms, rather than as fixed Kantian transcendental ideas (that is, ideas which are wholly prior to experience, and necessary conditions for any kind of knowledge).

3. Berlin believed that philosophers make two kinds of contribution to the consideration of philosophical questions. The first is to reformulate these questions by suggesting a new outlook on the world that liberates the intellect from the mental cramp that has caused the problem. The second, critical rather than creative, contribution is to provide a violent shock to dogmatic assumptions about the solutions to philosophical questions, thus creating new problems and inspiring further thought (1996, 73). For a philosopher to do either of these required considerable force of character, and a certain amount of exaggeration and simplification, as well as self-confidence and persistence. Later in life Berlin described himself as a historian of ideas rather than as a philosopher, despite the fact that his account of the nature of philosophy emphasised philosophy’s historical dimension. This reflected his (high) standards – which he did not believe himself to meet – for considering someone a genuine or significant philosopher.

4. The topics that dominated Berlin’s early work on philosophy were the doctrines of verification and phenomenalism, derived from the Vienna Circle by way of A. J. Ayer. In the 1930s Berlin and his philosophical peers at Oxford were occupied primarily with the philosophy of knowledge, especially perception: How do, or can, we know things, and what does it mean when we say we know something? They argued that these questions were tied up with the use of language, and the evaluation of the meaning of statements with questions such as ‘How do we know what a statement means, or if it has any meaning at all?’ Verificationism held that the meaning of a statement was to be found in the way in which it could be verified; if like moral, religious or metaphysical statements it couldn’t be verified – that is, shown to be true or false – it had no meaning as a statement of fact, but was merely an expression of personal taste, or meaningless. Phenomenalism held that all our knowledge comes from our sense impressions: we can know only sense data, i.e. the deliverances of perceptual experience. Anything not founded on sensory experience is nonsense.

Berlin regarded these doctrines as beneficial in clearing away confusions and exposing errors. But, while he believed that the world of human experience is all that we can know, he rejected verifiability as the only, or the most plausible, criterion for judging beliefs or hypotheses, as well as the linked phenomenalist view that statements about the world were only meaningful if they referred to actual or possible sensory experience. Against these views, he maintained throughout his life that many statements that could not be directly verified by empirical observation, or reduced to the description of direct sensory experience, were nevertheless clearly meaningful. Examples were statements about ‘the past and the future, and absent objects, and other persons, and unrealised possibilities, and general and hypothetical judgements’ (1978b, 102). He also argued that there are certain quasi-conceptual universal truths that are not empirical in the normal sense, because we cannot ‘think them away’, i.e. imagine them to be false; nor are they analytic, because they do not follow straightforwardly from the meanings of the terms they contain. Several examples are given in his paper on ‘Synthetic A Priori Propositions’, for instance ‘Nothing can look to an observer yellow and blue all over in the same place at the same time’ and ‘You cannot be in two places [at the same time]’ (1951, 8, 1, 5). Of another example drawn from the properties of colours, ‘This pink [shade] is more like this vermilion than it is like this black’ (1937a, 76), he observed: ‘I was convinced that my proposition was, if not strictly a priori, self-evidently true, and that its contradictory was not intelligible’ (2002a, 3–4). Armed with such examples, he warned his colleagues that the principle of verification would lead to untenable consequences, and would, if not abandoned or considerably revised, breed new fallacies in the place of those it had dispelled (1978b, 15).

Berlin’s approach in these early years was shaped by the emphasis on the analysis of the meaning of words then being championed by his friend J. L. Austin. As Berlin explained at the time:

Words are examined by philosophers for the purpose of discovering whether, as they are used in successful communication, they tend to exhibit or obscure some characteristic by which one type of fact differs from another, or alternatively suggest falsely the existence of distinctions which direct inspection of experience fails to reveal. This is done because inattention to either [possibility] tends to lead to systematic confusion and error, not necessarily in the use of words, which, being conventional and intended for common practice and not the convenience of philosophers, is rightly not altered by their criticisms, but in the accurate discrimination and description of irreducible types of experience. (1937a, 102)

5. The term derives from the Ionian philosophers, the founders of Western philosophy, such as Thales, who offered different theories about the composition of the universe; a hallmark of these theories was the attempt to discover a single substance out of which everything else is composed.

6. Berlin acknowledged that there were certain ‘human sciences’ that sought to emulate the aims of the natural sciences, by trying to discover regularities in human behaviour, and refining them into explanatory laws. Berlin was very sceptical about such disciplines – economics, sociology, psychology among them – but acknowledged that such scientific studies of human behaviour had some value. He maintained, though, that history remained fundamentally different from the natural sciences in its aims and techniques. Other approaches to the study of human beings may seek to abstract from a large number of stable similarities and recurrences in human behaviour across many different cases, in order to construct useful ideal models which may help us better understand such behaviour. But history is irreducibly different: it is concerned with exploring and understanding individual cases as individual, that is, unique and non-recurrent. It is richer in description and less rigorous in explanation. Other human sciences necessarily abstract: their descriptive power is extensive rather than intensive, their descriptions thinner. The subject-matter of history, on the other hand, ‘involves a “thick” texture of criss-crossing, constantly changing and melting conscious and unconscious beliefs and assumptions’ (1978b, 182). History is an ‘amalgam, a rich brew composed of apparently disparate ingredients’. In looking for satisfactory and satisfying historical accounts, we look for ‘something full enough and concrete enough to meet our conception of public life […], seen from as many points of view and at as many levels as possible, including as many components, factors, aspects as the widest and deepest knowledge, the greatest analytical power, insight, imagination can present’. ‘Historical explanation is […] arrangement of the discovered facts in patterns which satisfy us because they accord with life – the variety of human experience and activity – as we know it and can imagine it’ (ibid., 171–3). The historian’s purpose ‘is to paint a portrait … which … seeks to capture the unique patterns and peculiar characteristics of its particular subject’: to paint a portrait, rather than take an X-ray image (ibid., 164).

7. Berlin took up the problem of free will and determinism, and the related topic of the role of individual choice and agency in history, both indirectly, through an examination of Leo Tolstoy’s philosophy of history (originally published 1951, republished with additions as The Hedgehog and the Fox 1953 and in 1978a and 1997a), and in Historical Inevitability (1954; republished in 2002b). These questions had, however, no doubt preoccupied him since his work on Marx in the mid 1930s, when he would have encountered them in the form of Plekhanov’s defence of historical determinism. Plekhanov’s work served as a challenge to Berlin’s belief in the historical importance of individuals, and his conception of morality, based as it was on the human capacity for choice.

8. The influence on Berlin of Soviet Communism is obvious here; but while this was the main target for his attack, his critique could also be, and was, applied to Nazism, and even to the complacent and inhumane ‘managerial’ policies of capitalist Western democracies. See Berlin 2002b, 92–3, 337–44; Cherniss 2013, 58–9, 88–111, 118–20.

9. Apart from one 1962 essay on ancient Greek individualism (first published 1998, republished in 2002b), he devoted scant attention to the history of the ideas in the ancient world. As for the Middle Ages, while Berlin could admit that the period might have been superior to what followed in some respects – greater public order, intellectual security, social cohesion etc. – he regarded it as by and large an intellectually blank period, because of the very stability and conservatism of its intellectual life. Berlin’s interest in Renaissance thought was greater, though it yielded only one essay – a suitably original and influential examination of ‘The Originality of Machiavelli’ (1972; republished in 1979 and 1997a).

10. Berlin’s writings on the history of ideas can be classified in several different ways. One is geographical, yielding as a first category works on Russian intellectual and cultural history, particularly of the nineteenth century; here belong his several essays on Herzen, his two studies of Tolstoy, his pieces on Turgenev, Belinsky and Plekhanov, as well as those on Russian populism and the theme of artistic commitment in Russian thought (most of them included in 1978a; see also 1996 and 2000a). The other geographical category covers the history of ideas in Western Europe, primarily focusing on Germany, but also encompassing France and Italy (with glances at England and Switzerland). (A third category comprises Berlin’s essays on modern, secular Jewish thinkers.) It is also natural to divide his historical essays into portraits of individuals (in addition to those already named in this note, Fichte, Hamann, Hegel, Herder, Moses Hess, Kant, Maistre, Marx, Meinecke, Mill, Rousseau, Saint-Simon, Sorel, Verdi, Vico and others) and examinations of larger epochs, movements and themes – most notably the Enlightenment and the Counter-Enlightenment, the Romantic movement and nineteenth-century socialism.

11. Berlin derived this interpretation of the Enlightenment’s assumptions and inconsistencies largely from Plekhanov’s works on the history of materialism.

12. Berlin focused, in his accounts of the Enlightenment, on the radical, materialist, naturalist, proto-Utilitarian element among the philosophes – Holbach, Helvétius, La Mettrie and the more mild-mannered Condorcet – though he acknowledged, and sought to encompass, other figures from the movement – Montesquieu, Voltaire, Hume, Kant (the last two seen, however, as forerunners of the Enlightenment’s critics, however unintentionally on their part), and sometimes Rousseau.

13. These included the ultramontane Catholic reactionary Joseph de Maistre (whom he portrayed as a precursor of Fascism and the author of a disturbingly compelling, dark and savage vision of human life as essentially characterised by violence and terror); the Italian philosopher and critic of scientism Giambattista Vico; and pre-Romantic German opponents of Enlightenment rationalism and universalism such as J. G. Hamann and J. G. Herder.

14. The term ‘rationalism’ (and its cognate ‘rationalist’) is used by Berlin – as by many others – in multiple, not clearly or consistently distinguished, ways. The ambiguity is not incidental, but is very much woven into – and perhaps constitutes a serious problem in – Berlin’s account of the history of ideas. He consistently identifies the Enlightenment with ‘rationalism’ without acknowledging that many Enlightenment thinkers, as empiricists, rejected a central tenet of rationalism understood as a philosophical doctrine precisely set against empiricism (let us call this anti-empiricist rationalism), holding that the world can be made sense of correctly only through the use of pure reason, because reality perfectly conforms to the dictates of reason (see Berlin 2002b, 317). Berlin does sometimes use the term in this way (see e.g. Berlin 1978b, 74, 116, 89; Berlin 1990, 5; Berlin 2002b, 238). But he also sometimes uses it interchangeably with what we might more accurately call materialism (so that many ‘rationalists’ might also be empiricists; see Berlin 1978b, 10).

More broadly (or sweepingly), ‘rationalism’ for Berlin is often the larger anti-empiricist metaphysical view just identified. It is also the related ethical view that identifies freedom, or goodness, or flourishing with the acceptance of and conformity to what is rational, that is, the rational laws or principles governing reality (see Berlin 1990, 4; Berlin 2002b, 188–90, 197–9, 258–9, 265, 277–8; it should be stressed that in these passages Berlin does not distinguish epistemological, metaphysical and ethical dimensions of ‘rationalism’, but treats these as identical – so that what we identify as ‘ethical’ rationalism here is said by Berlin to be ‘the metaphysical heart of rationalism’). He further identified such rationalism closely with monism, writing that monism lay ‘at the heart of much metaphysical rationalism’ (Berlin 2002b, 213; see also ibid., 42, 278). He also sometimes uses ‘rationalism’ to refer to a psychological doctrine, a view (which he regards as unrealistically optimistic and shallow) of human beings as actually or potentially motivated primarily by rational considerations (see e.g. Berlin 2018, 274–5); or to what we here term ‘scientism’ – the belief that all of experience could be grasped through the methods of the (natural) sciences, and (related to this) that all problems could be solved through the application of scientific knowledge or expertise (see e.g. Berlin 2002b, 111, 130, 195).

Berlin rejected all these forms of rationalism. But he was also anxious to distance himself from what he called ‘anti-rationalism’. In this context, he seems to have been referring to a radical rejection of any attempts to make rational sense of the world – to render experience rationally intelligible, predictable and consistent (see e.g. Berlin 2002b, 27, 66–8). Berlin may have classed himself among those he called ‘troubled rationalists’ (1978b, 201): he retained an attachment to – even if he also entertained doubts about – the larger tendency of ‘critical rationalism’, which continued to hold on to ‘a cautious and highly qualified optimism about the moral and intellectual future of the human race’ (Berlin 2002b, 88), and rested hope for the future on belief in the capacity of human intelligence both to achieve greater self-understanding, and to alleviate social and material problems of human life. His attacks on various forms of ‘rationalism’ were themselves motivated by a desire to understand the world, so as (in part) to be able to act rationally; this was very much within the tradition of the larger, looser, more encompassing ‘rationalism’ of which he sometimes wrote.

Berlin’s multiply ambiguous use of this key term is an object lesson in the dangers of falling in with an established pattern of misleading terminology, the kind of danger traded on, according to Berlin, by enemies of freedom who exploit ambiguities in the term ‘liberty’ (or ‘freedom’) to commit the ‘monstrous impersonation’ of freedom by its opposite (2002b, 180).

For further discussion of Berlin’s views on rationalism, see Gray 2013, 43–5, 57–9, 153–5, 158–60, 172–4, 190–1 (Gray reproduces Berlin’s varying use of the term); Gustavsson 2018; Smith 2018.

15. Berlin used the terms ‘values’, ‘ideals’, ‘ends’, ‘principles’, ‘goods’, ‘demands’ and ‘goals’ more or less – but not quite – interchangeably.

16. Why ‘absolute’? Since Berlin’s solution to the problem of conflicting values is to establish compromises, trade-offs, between them, it cannot be said that the claims they make are absolute in the sense that they must be met in full, without concessions to other values. So what is he getting at here? ‘Absolute’ is a polysemous term that deserves to be used with care. Characteristically, he offers no formal definition(s), using the term in different senses in different contexts, from which we have to do our best to tease out his implicit meanings.

It seems most consistent with his most frequent usage elsewhere to say that he regards (at least some) human values as ‘absolute’ in the sense that they are irreducibly distinct ends-in-themselves, valuable each in its own right, and not just in terms of some other value (or super-value). Thus he holds, for example (and against utilitarianism), that justice, liberty, enlightenment and so on are each sui generis, valuable intrinsically rather than instrumentally, i.e. not just because and in so far as they conduce to the super-value of happiness (though they may do this too). From this it follows that these values are, by virtue of this ‘absoluteness’, or distinctness of intrinsic value, incommensurable: that is, they cannot be weighed or measured against one another on a single scale, in terms of a single metric.

Berlin also frequently suggests that these values are ‘absolute’ in another, related sense, close to that of ‘universal’: their claims on us are non-relative, not only to other values (liberty does not derive its value solely from its contribution to happiness), but also to circumstances (liberty does not derive its value from being part of or contributing to a certain way of life, or allowing for success in a particular situation; it is valuable for all human beings, as such).

Yet Berlin does also use ‘absolute’ in a number of places to indicate inviolablity or un-cancellability: in this sense, for a value to be ‘absolute’ means that it cannot be overruled (see e.g. Berlin 2002b, 211, where he speaks of ‘an absolute right to refuse to behave inhumanly’). This understanding of the absoluteness of values is harder to square with the idea of balances or compromises between values. Instead Berlin acknowledges, or insists, that when such balancing or compromising occurs, there is a genuine loss or sacrifice: we may, for instance, sacrifice a certain degree of liberty for the sake of equality or security, but we should acknowledge that, in doing so, we are sacrificing something that remains valuable, and that therefore this sacrifice is to be regretted (this view is developed in Walzer 1973, and the contributions by Thomas Nagel, Charles Taylor and Bernard Williams in Lilla, Dworkin and Silvers 2001) .

17. Berlin writes:

I am reading the philosopher Malebranche who says that a better world than ours might exist but it would be far more complicated, & God being good, & desiring to give us a world not wholly unintelligible produced this compromise between simplicity & goodness, which are he thinks (odd interesting view!) incompatible. Hence our miserable makeshift universe. Indeed if our universe is the best of all possible worlds what must the others be like?

This seems to go somewhat beyond the passages in Malebranche 1680 cited in the text, so there may be other relevant passages that we have yet to locate.

18. Most prominent among these other pluralist thinkers have been George Crowder, William Galston, John Gray, Stuart Hampshire, John Kekes, Steven Lukes, Thomas Nagel, Joseph Raz, Michael Walzer and Bernard Williams; positions advanced at times by Robert Nozick, John Rawls, Richard Rorty and Charles Taylor in some ways resemble pluralism, but are difficult to categorise in relation to it.

19. Berlin did not respond to Leo Strauss’s direct and powerful attack except in a private letter to Harry Jaffa in 1992 (2015, online supplement); he did respond to Arnaldo Momigliano’s criticism (Berlin 1990, 73–94), which made the pluralism = relativism accusation through an examination of Berlin’s interpretations of Vico and Herder; and he was anxious to draw a sharp distinction between relativism and pluralism in his later work. Nevertheless, the charge continues to be made by critics, and rejected by supporters, of Berlin’s pluralism. For some recent treatments, not discussed in the main text, see Barry 2001 (highly critical), Connolly 2005, Ferrell 2008, Moore 2009, Crowder 2020, Lyons 2020.

20. One of the best-known forms of relativism is cultural relativism – the view that all values emerge from particular cultures, and are valid within and for those cultures, but not necessarily for others. Berlin sometimes appears to say this; he also seems sometimes to endorse, and sometimes to disavow, a major assumption underlying most versions of cultural relativism, namely, a holistic conception of culture. This regards cultures as unified and wholly separate entities, webs in which each belief is bound together with every other belief, and within which members cannot disentangle their beliefs one from another, rejecting some, retaining others, judging each critically and separately. It remains controversial whether Berlin’s view of culture was holistic, and, if so, to what extent and in what way; but it has been maintained – most notably and persistently by Steven Lukes – that pluralism can be rescued from the shoals of relativism if the pluralist rejects a holistic conception of culture, which, Lukes maintains, is fundamentally mistaken (Lukes 1994, 1995, 1998, 2001a). Lukes’s critique of holism, and his de-coupling of pluralism from holism, are plausible; it does not however necessarily follow that not accepting holism allows the pluralist to believe consistently in universal standards or values (conflicting though these may be) transcending all cultures. But the rejection of a holistic view of culture does remove a major obstacle to a belief that certain values transcend cultural differences, by suggesting that cultures aren’t wholly self-contained, closed off and unconnected. If we add the wide recurrence of certain beliefs in different cultures, some at least of them justifiable in terms of human welfare, belief in a universal human nature and universal values underlying cultural variety, conflict and dissent is one step closer.

21. Gray has sometimes presented his critique of liberalism as a critique only of a certain sort of liberalism, or strain within the liberal tradition, and has opposed to this another, better, more pluralistic liberalism (see Gray 2002); at other times, he has presented his critique as a more wholesale indictment of liberalism as such (see e.g. Gray 1993, 1995, 1998).

Gray’s arguments can be summarised in vastly simplified form as three main propositions about liberalism. The first of these is that liberalism is absolutist and monistic: it is based on assigning an absolute moral/political priority to liberty as the paramount political value (it should be emphasised that Berlin explicitly rejects such a claim). If values really are incommensurable, then this is unallowable. The second is that liberalism is one value-system or way of life among many. If pluralism is conceived of in terms of ways of life, value-systems, cultures etc., rather than in terms of individual values, then the conclusion would be that liberalism is just one of these many valid but conflicting ways of life, with no claim to privilege. Therefore, liberals living in liberal societies are free to be liberal and pursue liberal values; but they have no right to impose their views on others, or regard themselves as superior or their way of doing things as preferable. Finally, Gray charges that liberalism by its nature has historically been a universalist doctrine – that is, it has denied this last proposition, and indeed claimed to be superior to other forms of life, for all people, everywhere, at all times. Therefore, if pluralism is accepted, and liberals accept liberalism as just one form of life among many, then one of the central goals of traditional liberalism must be abandoned. (All these propositions can be challenged from within Berlin’s oeuvre.)

22. Galston has argued that pluralism and liberalism are compatible if neither is seen as a fully comprehensive or encompassing doctrine, and has sought to suggest what a politics that is both truly pluralist and truly liberal would look like. Crowder, in probably the most systematic and careful discussion of the topic to date, has sought to show that Gray’s account of value pluralism incorporates a number of assumptions and conclusions that make his position closer to relativism than to a truly objective value pluralism; that genuine value pluralism is wholly consistent with a belief in a core or minimum of universal human values, as well as non-monistic and non-quantitative comparison of and choice between values based on practical reason; and that value pluralism’s recognition of both genuine moral variety and a basic, minimal standard of human decency supports liberalism. Crowder has further suggested that liberalism and value pluralism are mutually supporting, in so far as effective moral reasoning under conditions of value pluralism will require the exercise of certain virtues (such as generosity, broad-mindedness, flexibility, moderation and attentiveness to values, situations and persons) which for him are characteristically liberal or promoted by liberalism; and value pluralism gives us reason to prefer social orders in which there is a greater variety of realised or realisable values, and a greater opportunity for individuals to choose among those values – that is, characteristically, liberal societies (see Crowder 2002). Others who have contributed significantly to this debate include Hans Blokland (1999), Jason Ferrell (2009), Jeffrey Friedman (1997), Amy Gutmann (1999), Ira Katznelson (1994), Charles Larmore (1994), Steven Lukes (1989, 1994), Pratap B. Mehta (1997), Matthew Moore (2009), Ella Myers (2010), Jonathan Riley (2001, 2002 and in Müller 2019), Robert Talisse (2010), Michael Walzer (1995), Daniel Weinstock (1997) and Alex Zakaras (2013). There is a significant review of earlier literature on the topic by Albert Dzur (1998), a collection of essays exploring the political implications of pluralism (Baghramian and Ingram, 2000), and a recent overview and restatement by Crowder (2019). So far these works – in particular, Galston and Crowder’s volumes – seem not to have exhausted the pluralism/liberalism debate.

23. The distinction goes back at least to Kant, and it (or something like it) had appeared in the works of T. H. Green, Bernard Bosanquet and Boris Chicherin, and had more recently been used by Guido de Ruggiero, R. G. Collingwood, John Petrov Plamenatz and Dorothy Fosdick, among others; Berlin himself acknowledged Benjamin Constant (who spoke of ‘the liberty of the ancients’ as against that of the ‘moderns’: see FIB2 53–4, 230–3) as the main influence on his thinking. His conception of positive and negative liberty may also owe something to Rousseau’s distinction between the liberty of the man and that of the citizen, and to the more general distinction among earlier theorists, of whom Rousseau was the most prominent, between natural and moral liberty.

24. Berlin cites Stoicism’s preaching of self-discipline and renunciation as a way of resisting, and remaining uncorrupted by, overwhelmingly powerful earthly authorities; Rousseau’s insistence that the only just society is one in which people retain their liberty by transmuting it from the individual self-governance of solitary selves in a state of nature to the collective self-rule of the people by the people, so that obedience to the civil authority is really obedience to oneself, and thus freedom rather than subjection; and finally Kant’s philosophy of moral autonomy, whereby the individual’s inalienable freedom and dignity lie in the fact that the individual acts in accordance with a self-given moral law, and is therefore recognised as a freely choice-making being, dependent on no one and nothing else. Berlin has considerable sympathy for this last, Kantian, outlook, though he believed that it had inspired profound errors. He acknowledged that the Stoic ideal was admirable, but charged that it rested on a misuse of words: to attain independence through a renunciation of those desires that make one prey to the domination of others might be sublime, and it might be the best that one can do in certain circumstances; but the fact remains that one is then less free than one would be otherwise, in that there are constraints preventing one from acting with true freedom.

25. It has been argued that the former part of Berlin’s argument here is somewhat stronger than the latter, because although the conflict of values may mean that the making of choices is an inescapable and even significant part of life, this is not, in itself, a reason for embracing the making of choices as something valuable and central to both dignity and fulfilment. Indeed, if making choices involves the tragic losses that Berlin claims it sometimes does, one may be inclined to try to escape the painful and difficult need to choose, rather than proudly embracing it. Some have made this point by claiming that Berlin turns an ‘is’ into an ‘ought’, in contravention of Hume’s law forbidding the derivation of values from facts. However, the value of choice is not derived from its inevitability, but from its role in forming our lives and identities. Berlin writes:

The world that we encounter in ordinary experience is one in which we are faced with choices between ends equally ultimate […], the realisation of some of which must inevitably involve the sacrifice of others. Indeed, it is because this is their situation that men place such immense value upon the freedom to choose; for if they had an assurance that in some perfect state, realisable by men on earth, no ends pursued by them would ever be in conflict, the necessity and agony of choice would disappear, and with it the central importance of the freedom to choose. (2002b, 213–14)

The grounds for valuing freedom of choice may not be fully spelt out here, but it is not hard to read between the lines. Our ultimate ends are of the greatest importance to our welfare, and are therefore imbued with value; the pluralist’s value choices are a vehicle of self-creation; they cannot be delegated to experts, because no single choice is uniquely right, and the judgement that is needed to make one choice rather than another has to be reached autonomously by the situated individual, who alone knows from inside the full context in which a choice has to be made, and is a position to take responsibility for that choice. This is why choosing is a valuable activity in and for itself, a central, formative part of human life, independently of its unavoidability.

26. Berlin’s Zionism has been the subject of controversy. Some critics have complained that it led him to turn a blind eye to injustice and tacitly approve of Israeli chauvinism. This was not so. Berlin was a liberal and humane Zionist; he believed in the justice and necessity of a Jewish homeland, but also opposed violence, nationalist aggression and chauvinism wherever they appeared. Indeed, his aversion to political radicalism led him to support the moderate, pro-British Chaim Weizmann against more assertive Zionist leaders such as David Ben-Gurion in the 1940s, even when it became apparent that Ben-Gurion’s strategy was likely to be more effective than Weizmann’s in establishing a Jewish state. Later in life Berlin was a quiet but firm, and at times privately vehement, critic of the Likud bloc and of Israeli policy in the West Bank and Gaza, and a supporter of the Peace Now movement and a ‘two-state solution’ to the Israeli–Palestinian conflict (2015, 568).

27. The insensitive and authoritarian rule of managerial bureaucrats – those whom Stalin, in one of Berlin’s favourite quotations, called ‘engineers of human souls’ (see e.g. 2002b, 82, note 1) – particularly worried Berlin throughout the 1950s, when most of his work on political judgement was written (Cherniss 2013, 88–111).

28. While Herzen’s combination of ironic wit, moral passion and vivacity naturally appealed to Berlin, it may seem strange that the apparently complaisant British academic should have identified himself with the wayward Russian aristocrat turned wandering revolutionary, or that the very embodiment of cautious, sceptical and moderate liberalism should have regarded a radical malcontent, the father of Russian agrarian socialism, as a political guide.

In fact, Herzen was a deeply ambivalent revolutionary, and Berlin, while certainly every inch the liberal, was a less impassive and more radical thinker than is sometimes recognised. The two men shared a passion for liberty, a suspicion of authority, an opposition to both injustice and intellectual complacency. However, what Berlin seized on in Herzen was the latter’s opposition to – and occasional passionate denunciation of – the doctrine of historical inevitability, and the political ethics to which this attack was joined.

29. This paints with a broad – not to say distorting – brush. We may, while still simplifying wildly, distinguish two traditions or positions within political thought that are often associated with the term ‘political realism’. One is a tradition of realism in the theorising of international relations, a tradition defined by a shared conviction that (1) states in the international system are motivated primarily by a competitive quest for power – or for security from the predations of other states (which is understood to require the acquisition of power); (2) the rulers of states should take the interest or well-being of their state, understood as its relative power and security, as the primary objective of their policy; (3) states (or their rulers) will seek to secure their authority over the territories and subjects under their power, subordinating or eliminating any competitors; and (4) they are right to do so. Politics and policy, on this view, are defined by the goal of securing and extending the power of the state; the state is the highest of values and most basic of political units, and thus has analytic and normative primacy in thinking about politics; (sometimes violent) competition is the basic mode, and power the central objective, of political action.

The second form of (doctrinal or theoretical) ‘realism’, which is commonly found in political theory, begins from a picture of human nature and social dynamics as dominated by competitiveness, vanity, fearfulness, aggression, selfishness and imperfect rationality. This view sees politics as naturally, inevitably conflictual, and political authority or order as resting on some combination of force, fear and irrational belief, rather than on consent or moral conviction. (The preceding draws on Cherniss 2018.) On the history of realism, and the plurality of its meanings, see Meinecke 1957; Bew 2015; McQueen 2017. On ‘realism’ in recent political theory see Galston 2010, Sabl and Sagar 2017.

30. These included Raymond Aron, Daniel Bell, Norberto Bobbio, Michael Oakeshott, Karl Popper and Arthur Schlesinger, Jr. For a synthetic study of these figures and of the ethic of moderation they championed see Craiutu 2017. For a survey of the liberalism of Berlin and some of his contemporaries see Cherniss 2021.

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Joshua Cherniss <>
Henry Hardy <>

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