First published Sat Feb 2, 2008; substantive revision Mon Feb 21, 2022

Certainty, or the attempt to obtain certainty, has played a central role in the history of philosophy. Some philosophers have taken the kind of certainty characteristic of mathematical knowledge to be the goal at which philosophy should aim. In the Republic, Plato says that geometry “draws the soul towards truth and produces philosophic thought by directing upwards what we now wrongly direct downwards” (527b). Descartes also thought that a philosophical method that proceeds in a mathematical way, enumerating and ordering everything exactly, “contains everything that gives certainty to the rules of mathematics” (Discourse on the Method, PW 1, p. 121). Other philosophers have adopted different models for how to best understand certainty. For example, Aristotle and Aquinas take scientific explanation to be essential to certainty (see Pasnau 2017, pp. 5–7), while Al-Ghazālī thought that certainty arose out of religious practice (see Albertini 2005). For many empiricists, certainty with respect to empirical matters is to be found in basic beliefs that are grounded in some fundamental aspect of perceptual experience (see, e.g., Lewis 1952).

Like knowledge, certainty is an epistemic property of beliefs. (In a derivative way, certainty is also an epistemic property of subjects: S is certain that p just in case S’s belief that p is certain.) Although some philosophers have thought that there is no difference between knowledge and certainty, it has become increasingly common to distinguish them. On this conception, then, certainty is either the highest form of knowledge or is the only epistemic property superior to knowledge. One of the primary motivations for allowing kinds of knowledge less than certainty is the widespread sense that skeptical arguments are successful in showing that we rarely or never have beliefs that are certain (see Unger 1975 for this kind of skeptical argument) but do not succeed in showing that our beliefs are altogether without epistemic worth (see, for example, Lehrer 1974, Williams 1999, and Feldman 2003; see Fumerton 1995 for an argument that skepticism undermines every epistemic status a belief might have; and see Klein 1981 for the argument that knowledge requires certainty, which we are capable of having).

As with knowledge, it is difficult to provide an uncontentious analysis of certainty. There are several reasons for this. One is that there are different kinds of certainty, which are easy to conflate. Another is that the full value of certainty is surprisingly hard to capture. A third reason is that there are two dimensions to certainty: a belief can be individually certain at a particular moment, or it can be certain over some greater length of time in a system of beliefs.

1. Kinds of certainty

There are various kinds of certainty (Russell 1948, p. 396). A belief is psychologically certain when the subject who has it is supremely convinced of its truth. Certainty in this sense is similar to incorrigibility, which is the property a belief has of being such that the subject is incapable of giving it up. But psychological certainty is not the same thing as incorrigibility. A belief can be certain in this sense without being incorrigible; this may happen, for example, when the subject receives a very compelling bit of counterevidence to the (previously) certain belief and gives it up for that reason. Moreover, a belief can be incorrigible without being psychologically certain. For example, a mother may be incapable of giving up the belief that her son did not commit a gruesome murder, and yet, compatible with that inextinguishable belief, she may be tortured by doubt.

A second kind of certainty is epistemic. Roughly characterized, a belief is certain in this sense when it has the highest possible epistemic status. Epistemic certainty is often accompanied by psychological certainty, but it need not be. It is possible that a subject may have a belief that enjoys the highest possible epistemic status and yet be unaware that it does. (More generally, a subject’s being certain that p does not entail that she is certain that she is certain that p; on this point, see Van Cleve 1979, and see Alston 1980 on level confusions in epistemology.) In such a case, the subject may feel less than the full confidence that her epistemic position warrants. I will say more below about the analysis of epistemic certainty and its relation to psychological certainty.

Some philosophers also make use of the notion of moral certainty (see Markie 1986; James 2020). For example, in the Latin version of Part IV of the Principles of Philosophy, Descartes says that “some things are considered as morally certain, that is, as having sufficient certainty for application to ordinary life, even though they may be uncertain in relation to the absolute power of God” (PW 1, pp. 289–90). Thus characterized, moral certainty appears to be epistemic in nature, though it is a lesser status than epistemic certainty (see Matthen 2014 for a similar account of what he calls “empirical certainty”). In the French version of this passage, however, Descartes says that “moral certainty is certainty which is sufficient to regulate our behaviour, or which measures up to the certainty we have on matters relating to the conduct of life which we never normally doubt, though we know that it is possible, absolutely speaking, that they may be false” (PW 1, p. 289 n. 2). Understood in this way, it does not appear to be a species of knowledge, given that a belief can be morally certain and yet false (contra Markie 1986, p. 36). Rather, on this view, for a belief to be morally certain is for it to be subjectively rational to a high degree. In a similar way, Spinoza distinguishes moral certainty from mathematical certainty and says that the former should not be rejected when “it is confirmed by the testimonies of so many prophets, is a source of great solace for those whose capacity to reason is limited, is of great value to the state, and may be believed unreservedly without danger or damage” (Tractatus Theologico-Politicus, ch. 15; see James 2020, ch. 1). Moral certainty understood in this way is not merely a form of psychological certainty, as someone who has the highest degree of confidence in a particular claim might nevertheless do so for manifestly irrational or frivolous reasons.

Although all three kinds of certainty are philosophically interesting, it is epistemic certainty that has traditionally been of central importance. In what follows, then, I shall focus mainly on this kind of certainty.

2. Conceptions of certainty

There have been many different conceptions of certainty. Each of them captures some central part of our intuitive understanding of certainty, but, as we shall see, none of them is free from problems.

2.1 Indubitability

Certainty is often explicated in terms of indubitability. This has been done in a variety of ways (see, e.g., Goodman 1952; Unger 1978, p. 328). One prominent account of certainty is suggested by Descartes’s presentation of his famous Archimedean point, the cogito (I am thinking, therefore I exist). In the Second Meditation, Descartes reviews the extensive doubts of the First Meditation before saying that even if “there is a deceiver of supreme power and cunning who is deliberately and constantly deceiving me,” still “he will never bring it about that I am nothing so long as I am something” (PW 2, p. 17). Descartes then concludes that the proposition that he himself exists is true whenever he considers it. It is often thought that the cogito has a unique epistemic status in virtue of its ability to resist even the “hyperbolic” doubts raised in the First Meditation (see Markie 1992 and Broughton 2002). However, even if Descartes took this view of the certainty of the cogito, he did not accept the general claim that certainty is grounded in indubitability. In the Third Meditation, Descartes says that he is certain that he is a thinking thing, and he explains the certainty of this “first item of knowledge” (it is unclear whether he regards it as distinct from the cogito) as resulting from the fact that it is a clear and distinct perception (PW 2, p. 24). (Matters are complicated, however, by the fact that Descartes also says in the Third Meditation that certainty depends on knowing that God exists and is not a deceiver.)

Ludwig Wittgenstein also seems to connect certainty with indubitability. He says that “If you tried to doubt everything you would not get as far as doubting anything. The game of doubting itself presupposes certainty” (1969, §115). What makes possible doubting is “the fact that some propositions are exempt from doubt, are as it were like hinges on which those turn” (1969, §341). Although Wittgenstein’s view is sometimes taken to be—or to provide the basis for—an epistemically satisfying response to skepticism (see, e.g., Wright 2003 and 2004), it is hard to see the kind of certainty he has characterized as being epistemic, rather than merely psychological or moral, in nature (on this point, see Pritchard 2005; Coliva 2010 and 2012). Thus, when Wittgenstein says, “The difficulty is to realize the groundlessness of our believing” (1969, §166) it seems clear that the so-called hinge propositions are ones that we are psychologically incapable of calling into question. This is, of course, compatible with their being false.

In general, every indubitability account of certainty will face a dilemma: when the subject finds herself incapable of doubting one of her beliefs, either she has good reasons for being incapable of doubting it, or she does not. If she does not have good reasons for being unable to doubt the belief, the type of certainty in question can be only psychological, not epistemic, in nature. On the other hand, if the subject does have good reasons for being unable to doubt the belief, the belief may be epistemically certain. But, in this case, what grounds the certainty of the belief will be the subject’s reasons for holding it, and not the fact that the belief is indubitable.

A second problem for indubitability accounts of certainty is that, in one sense, even beliefs that are epistemically certain can be reasonably doubted. I shall say more about this in §3 below.

2.2 Infallibility

According to a second conception, a subject’s belief is certain just in case it could not have been mistaken—i.e., false (see, e.g., Lewis 1929). Alternatively, the subject’s belief is certain when it is guaranteed to be true. This is what Roderick Firth calls the “truth-evaluating” sense of certainty (1967, pp. 7–8). As with knowing that p, being certain that p entails that it is true that p. Certainty is, however, significantly stronger than lesser forms of knowledge (contra Mizrahi 2019, who conflates knowledge with certainty on the grounds that knowledge is factive). In cases where the subject knows without being certain that p, it is actually true that p, though it could have been false. In that case, of course, the subject would no longer know that p. But, where the subject is certain that p, it does not merely turn out to be true that p—in some sense it could not have been otherwise.

The difficulty for this conception of certainty is specifying the precise sense in which the belief could not have been false. What is meant cannot be what is called metaphysical or broadly logical impossibility. Although some of the paradigmatically certain beliefs are necessarily true in this sense, many others are not. For example, though I am certain of the truth of the cogito, it is not necessarily true (in the metaphysical sense) that I exist. That is, it is possible that I might not have existed. We might attempt to solve this difficulty by saying that the belief is guaranteed to be true by the subject’s grounds for it (see, e.g., Audi 1998, pp. 218–9). But this opens up two further problems for this conception of certainty. First, if the truth of the belief is guaranteed by the subject’s grounds for holding it, then it looks as though the certainty of the belief ought to be attributed to those grounds as well. That is to say, the belief would be certain, not in virtue of the fact that it is guaranteed to be true, but rather in virtue of its relation to the grounds that make that guarantee possible. This would be so because the grounds would provide a deeper explanation for the certainty of the belief than would the fact that the belief is guaranteed to be true. Moreover, some further account of the certainty of the grounds will still need to be provided.

The second problem is very similar to one that arises for philosophers attempting to provide an account of fallibilistic knowledge (i.e., knowledge that is less than certain). According to the standard account, the subject has fallibilistic knowledge that p when she knows that p on the basis of some justification j, and yet the subject’s belief could have been false while still held on the basis of j (see, e.g., BonJour 1985, p. 26; Lehrer 1990, p. 45). Alternatively, the subject knows that p on the basis of some justification j, but j does not entail the truth that p (see, e.g., Cohen 1988, p. 91; Fogelin 1994, pp. 88–9; Jeshion 2000, pp. 334–5; Brown 2018, pp. 15–21). The problem with the standard account, in either version, is that it does not allow for fallibilistic knowledge of necessary truths. If it is necessarily true that p, then the subject’s belief that p could not have been false, regardless of what her justification for it may be like. And, if it is necessarily true that p, then everything—including the subject’s justification for her belief—will entail or guarantee that p. Our attempt to account for certainty encounters the opposite problem: it does not allow for a subject to have a belief regarding a necessary truth that does not count as certain. If the belief is necessarily true, it cannot be false—even when the subject has come to hold the belief for a very bad reason (say, as the result of guessing or wishful thinking). And, given that the beliefs are necessarily true, even these bad grounds for holding the belief will entail or guarantee that it is true.

One way to solve the problem for the analysis of fallibilistic knowledge is to focus, not on the entailment relation, but rather on the probabilistic relation holding between the subject’s justification and the proposition believed (see Reed 2002 and 2013). When the subject knows that p on the basis of justification j, and P(p/j) is less than 1, the subject’s knowledge is fallibilistic. (Although epistemologists will disagree about what the appropriate conception of probability is, here is a crude example of how probability may figure in a fallibilistic epistemology. A basic historical reliabilist will say that a belief is justified just in case it has been produced by a process that has yielded a preponderance of true beliefs. So, if the process has yielded a true belief, say, 90% of the time, the probability that the next belief will be true is 90%; this is so even if the belief in question is necessarily true and has been logically deduced from a set of beliefs, each of which is necessarily true.) Adapting this solution to the problem for certainty, we can say that the subject is certain that p when P(p/j) = 1, where j is the justification or grounds for the belief (see Van Cleve 1977 and Lewis 1952). However, in order for j to impart a probability of 1 to p, it must also be the case that P(j) = 1. That is to say, j must be certain for the subject before it can make anything else certain. But, if we are to explain the certainty that p by appeal to the certainty that j, we fall into a vicious regress. The only way to stop it is to allow that some beliefs may have an intrinsic probability of 1 (see Russell 1948, p. 396, and Van Cleve 1977). It is, however, difficult to see how intrinsic probability of this sort is possible (barring, of course, a subjectivist account of probability, which could, in any case, capture only psychological certainty).

Timothy Williamson (2000, pp. 213–7) rejects the connection between a belief having probability 1 and its being absolutely certain. (On his view, one’s evidence is identical with what one knows, so what one knows will be evidence for itself. In a trivial sense, then, everything one knows will have probability 1.) He argues that the connection can be broken by denying that beliefs that have probability 1 at a particular time will always thereafter remain at that probability. Further evidence may be acquired that destroys the knowledge in question; when that happens, it is no longer evidence, let alone evidence for itself. Williamson finds this result congenial because, he says, “it is hard to see how any empirical proposition could have the intertemporal and intersubjective certainty which the conditionalization account demands of evidence” (p. 215). In breaking the connection between certainty and probability 1, then, it is important to keep in mind that Williamson has done so only for absolute certainty (or certainty over time), but not for certainty at a time. See section 3 below for more on the distinction between these two dimensions of certainty.

2.3 Inimitability

According to a third conception of certainty, a subject’s belief that p is certain when it is inimitable--i.e., justified in the highest degree (see, e.g., Stanley 2008). This is what Firth calls the “warrant-evaluating” sense of certainty (1967, pp. 8–12). Thus, Bertrand Russell says that “A proposition is certain when it has the highest degree of credibility, either intrinsically or as a result of argument” (1948, p. 396). There are various ways to understand what it means for a belief to be credible or justified in the highest degree. It could mean simply that the belief in question is justified as highly as any belief the subject happens to hold. But, in cases where the subject does not have any beliefs that are highly justified, this will imply that even a belief with relatively low justification is epistemically certain. Perhaps we could say instead that a belief is justified to the highest degree when it is justified as highly as any belief that anyone happens to hold. But this, too, leaves open the possibility that a belief with relatively low justification is epistemically certain: if all the subjects in existence are in a condition of universal ignorance, all of their beliefs—including the best of them—will have only a low level of justification. Perhaps, then, we should say that a belief is justified in the highest degree when it has the highest level of justification possible. But even this account is unsatisfactory. Suppose that global skepticism is necessarily true: it is a necessary truth that no subject is capable of having much justification for any of her beliefs; although it may seem to us as though a significant degree of justification is possible, this in fact is incorrect. It would then be intuitively correct to say that every belief falls far short of certainty, though this would not be permitted by the account of certainty under consideration. We may of course doubt that skepticism of this strong variety is correct; nevertheless, it should not be simply ruled out as a matter of definition.

Roderick Chisholm offers a variation on the above approach. According to his first definition of certainty (where h, S, and t are variables for propositions, subjects, and times, respectively):

h is certain for S at t =df (i) Accepting h is more reasonable for S at t than withholding h (i.e., not accepting h and not accepting not-h) and (ii) there is no i such that accepting i is more reasonable for S at t than accepting h. (1976, p. 27)

Clause (i) ensures that the subject has some measure of positive justification for h—if she had no justification for it, it would be more reasonable for her to withhold with respect to h. Clause (ii) then says that those beliefs of the subject are certain which are at the highest levels of justification for her. However, this still leaves open the following possibility: h is the most highly justified belief the subject has, but it is still not very highly justified (e.g., it may not even be sufficiently justified to count as knowledge).

Perhaps for this reason, Chisholm later offered a different definition of certainty:

p is certain for S =df For every q, believing p is more justified for S than withholding q, and believing p is at least as justified for S as is believing q. (1989, p. 12)

This definition still has the equivalent of clause (ii) above, and therefore requires the belief that is certain for the subject be the one that is most highly justified for her. But the second definition appears to be more successful in requiring that p be justified to a significant degree. Now, believing that p must not only be more justified for the subject than withholding p, it must also be more justified than withholding with respect to any other proposition. There are many propositions that we are capable of entertaining—e.g., the proposition that the number of people alive at this precise moment is even—where there is not the slightest reason for thinking them to be either true or false (though, of course, they must be one or the other). In fact, given the perfect lack of evidence with respect to propositions of this sort, Chisholm’s definition may set the standard for certainty too high, for it is hard to see how there could be any proposition one is more justified in believing than one is in withholding belief regarding, say, the parity of the number of people alive at this very moment.

It should be noted, however, that Chisholm’s definition works only by implicitly relying on what is a contingent feature of our epistemic situation. It so happens that we find ourselves in a position of total ignorance with respect to some propositions. But that need not have been the case. We could have ended up in a world where there is a moderate amount of evidence either for or against every proposition. If one of a subject’s beliefs then happened to have slightly more justification than any of the others, it would meet Chisholm’s definition of certainty, though it might still have what we would intuitively take to be a less than ideal level of justification.

There is one further problem with both of Chisholm’s definitions. Because they both relativize certainty to a particular subject, they make possible the following situation. Two subjects each believe that p, and in each case the belief is justified to degree n. For the first subject, the belief counts as certain because none of her other beliefs have a higher level of justification. But, for the second subject, the belief in question is not certain because she does have another belief that is slightly more justified. If certainty really is grounded in epistemic justification, though, this should not be possible. If a given justification makes a belief certain for one subject, it should do so for everyone.

There is another approach that Chisholm might take. According to particularism, his favored method in epistemology, we should use particular instances of knowledge and justification as our guide in formulating an epistemology (Chisholm 1973 and 1989, pp. 6–7). (By contrast, methodism begins with criteria for knowledge and justification and then attempts to ascertain whether, on these criteria, we actually have any knowledge or justified beliefs.) Adapting this approach to our present concern, the suggestion is that we formulate an account of certainty in light of paradigmatic instances of beliefs held with certainty. Thus, after giving the second definition above, Chisholm says that the concept of certainty is illustrated by propositions about what he calls “self-presenting” mental states and by some logical and metaphysical axioms (1989, p. 12).

Although this particularist approach probably is the way in which most philosophers think of certainty, it faces several difficulties. One is that the epistemology of the a priori is far from clear. Given that we do not, apparently, causally interact with necessary truths, it is hard to see how our minds can have access to them. A second difficulty has to do with knowledge of our own mental states—sometimes referred to as knowledge by acquaintance. According to the “speckled hen” problem, there are aspects of our mental states, such as the rich detail of one’s present visual experience, that we are not capable of knowing—e.g., if one is looking at a speckled hen, there will be a determinate number of speckles in one’s visual experience, which one will not be able to know just in virtue of having the experience (Ayer 1940, Chisholm 1989, Fumerton 2005). But those aspects we cannot know merely by being conscious of them are part of our conscious experience in just the same way as those aspects we are supposed to be able to know; the difficulty is specifying a principled difference between the two. Much more could be said about the first two problems, but they lie beyond the scope of this article. A third difficulty is that, at least prima facie, knowledge of one’s mental states seems to be of a fairly different kind from knowledge of necessary truths. It is not clear, at the outset, that we are warranted in taking them to be paradigmatic instances of a genuine epistemological kind.

2.4 Indefeasibility

According to a fourth conception of certainty, defended by Peter Klein, a belief “is absolutely certain just in case it is subjectively and objectively immune to doubt” (1992, p. 63; see also Miller 1978). He explicates this in the following way:

p is absolutely certain for S if and only if (1) p is warranted for S and (2) S is warranted in denying every proposition, g, such that if g is added to S’s beliefs, the warrant for p is reduced (even if only very slightly) and (3) there is no true proposition, d, such that if d is added to S’s true beliefs the warrant for p is reduced (even if only very slightly). (1992, p. 63)

Klein says that the second condition is what makes the belief subjectively immune to doubt, presumably because it is the beliefs and experiences that constitute S’s subjective perspective that render her warranted in denying all propositions that would reduce the warrant for p. However, S’s belief system might contain false beliefs that could warrant her in denying every g relevant to p—even, in some cases, where the g in question is itself true—and so her belief that p might meet condition (2) and yet still be false. Condition (3) is meant to prevent this situation; if p is false, the true belief that ~p can be added to S’s belief system, thereby reducing the warrant S has for p. In requiring both (2) and (3), then, the account focuses on beliefs where the subject’s subjective situation is in a sense properly aligned with an objective structure of reasons (for a similar view, see Pollock 1986).

There are two major difficulties facing a view of this sort. First, it is not clear how one belief is supposed to reduce the warrant for another. Suppose that I correctly believe that I have a headache and that my belief is, in an intuitive sense, absolutely certain. The first condition of Klein’s account is satisfied: the belief is warranted in virtue of my experiencing the headache. But is the second condition also satisfied? That is, would I be warranted in denying, say, the proposition that I do not in fact have a headache? If this were to be a belief added to my belief system, I would of course have contradictory beliefs. Would that entail that the warrant for both beliefs should be diminished? If the answer is yes, then my belief that I have a headache is not absolutely certain. Moreover, it is hard to see how any belief could then be absolutely certain, given that we can always add to our belief systems the contradictory of any of our beliefs. If the answer is no, however, there should be some explanation for why the proposition that I do not have a headache can be denied. Presumably, the explanation would have something to do with my experiencing the headache. But then what explains the certainty of the belief is the fact that it is grounded in the experience; the belief’s being subjectively immune to doubt is merely a consequence of its certainty, and not the explanation for it. This would mean that the focus of the view has shifted from subjective immunity to doubt to some sort of special warrant. How there could be such a special warrant, though, would need an account. To see the point more clearly, notice that subjective immunity to doubt will be possible only in cases where the subject’s belief is (intuitively) absolutely certain. For any belief b that is less than certain, the following belief could be added to the subject’s belief system: the warrant for b could be misleading. That belief would reduce the subject’s warrant for b (even if only slightly) were it to be added to her belief system, but it is not a proposition the subject can deny without being absolutely certain that b is true. The upshot, then, is that subjective immunity to doubt is not well-suited to playing a role in an account of certainty. Instead, it looks as though our understanding of subjective immunity to doubt depends on a prior grasp of what certainty is.

The second difficulty has to do with condition (3), which is supposed to secure objective immunity to doubt. Although it is undeniable that a subject for whom condition (3) is satisfied would be in a desirable situation, it does not seem to be attributable to her in the right sort of way—and, especially, not in the way that we expect certainty to be attributable to the person who is certain. To see this, suppose that my warrant for the belief that p is only moderately good. Nevertheless, my guardian angel protects my belief by making sure that any proposition such that, if it were true, would (when added to my belief system) reduce my warrant for p, is false. That is, my guardian angel makes sure that all potential defeaters for my belief are removed. Suppose, for example, that I see from a great distance what looks like a hawk. My guardian angel immediately annihilates all non-hawk flying objects in the area; the potential defeater, that there are flying objects indistinguishable from a hawk in the vicinity, has thus been rendered false. Although this would make my belief that p objectively immune to doubt, insofar as (3) is satisfied, it does not seem as though it would carry my belief any closer to certainty. The fact that the warrant for my belief is only moderately good renders irrelevant the work my guardian angel does in the world outsid of my beliefs. (Nor would the situation be helped if we stipulated that condition (2) is also satisfied. Given that my belief system could contain many false beliefs that might warrant me in rejecting all potential defeaters, my belief might be both subjectively and objectively immune to doubt—and yet still have a relatively low degree of warrant.)

It may be that one of the four conceptions of certainty discussed above could be improved so as to answer all objections. But, until that happens, it is safe to say that there is at present no completely satisfactory conception of certainty.

3. Two dimensions of certainty

Typically, epistemologists are concerned with the conditions under which a subject may know or be certain that p at a particular moment. Interestingly, however, somewhat different issues arise for certainty over time. As this was a primary concern for Descartes, who tells us in the First Meditation that he wants to establish something “in the sciences that was stable and likely to last,” we can best see how those issues arise in the context of Descartes’s epistemology (PW 2, p. 12).

In the Second Set of Objections, Mersenne poses the following problem: although Descartes has argued that our ability to know anything depends on our first knowing that God exists and is not a deceiver, it seems clear that an atheist mathematician can have the same sort of mathematical knowledge as a theist. In response, Descartes allows that the atheist does have a clear awareness (cognitio) of simple mathematical truths, but he denies that this clear awareness is “true knowledge [scientia]” (PW 2, p. 101). At first glance, it seems that Descartes draws the distinction between cognitio and scientia precisely so he can deny certainty to the atheist mathematician. But there is good reason to think that this is not what he has in mind.

To see this, notice that, if Descartes does not allow the atheist to be able to acquire knowledge through clear and distinct perception, he will fall into the so-called Cartesian Circle. This problem, first identified by Arnauld in the Fourth Set of Objections, arises if Descartes holds both of the following claims: (i) I can know that my clear and distinct perceptions are true only if I first know that a non-deceiving God exists, and (ii) I can know that a non-deceiving God exists only if I first know that my clear and distinct perceptions are true. Because knowing one thing is a precondition for knowing the other, and vice versa, I cannot know either of them. In fact, however, it does not look as though Descartes does fall into the circle. Although it is pretty clear that he is committed to (1)—in the Third Meditation, he says that, “if I do not know [whether there is a non-deceiving God], it seems that I can never be quite certain about anything else” (PW 2, p. 25)—there is no reason to take him to be committed to (ii). Descartes is willing to permit the meditator to use clear and distinct perceptions before knowing that they are generally true. The clearest example, of course, is the cogito; the meditator first comes to know that he exists as a thinking thing and only later comes to know that his knowledge of the cogito is grounded in its clarity and distinctness. The same, then, can be said for the meditator’s knowledge—grounded in some clearly and distinctly perceived causal principles—that God exists. In using those principles, the meditator does not first need to have the general knowledge that clear and distinct perceptions are true (see Van Cleve 1979).

Still, some philosophers might object that the meditator has no business using principles that he does not know to be true. Descartes would not be sympathetic to this objection. As he says in his conversation with Burman, so long as the meditator is using the causal principles, “he is actually paying attention to them. And for as long as he does pay attention to them, he is certain that he is not being deceived, and he is compelled to give his assent to them” (PW 3, p. 334; see also PW 2, pp. 25, 48; see also Cottingham 1986, p. 67). So, the doubt that Descartes raises with respect to clear and distinct perceptions does not extend to the moments at which one is actually enjoying them. Rather, it is a doubt that, in general, clear and distinct perception may not be a reliable source of beliefs (Kenny 1968, p. 194). When Descartes introduces the evil demon hypothesis in the First Meditation, it is meant to encapsulate his ignorance of his own origin—and, in particular, ignorance of the construction of his own mind. Without knowing that a non-deceiving God exists, it is possible for the meditator that his mind works in such a way that it falls into error even when it is contemplating the simplest questions. This doubt is chased away when he actually does contemplate such a question, but it can easily return at a later time when his thoughts are turned elsewhere. This is the sense in which the atheist mathematician’s cognitio, or clear awareness, is imperfect. Although it is certain at the time the atheist has the perception, it can always be rendered doubtful at another time. The theist has no advantage over the atheist at the time each enjoys a clear and distinct perception. Rather, the theist’s advantage lies in the fact that, armed with the certainty that a non-deceiving God exists, she will always remain free from doubt (Descartes PW 2, p. 48; see also Kenny 1968, p. 193; Reed 2012). Consequently, she will be able to construct her scientific theories without ever falling prey to worries about whether her work has value, and—perhaps even more importantly—she will be in a position to definitively put an end to theoretical disagreements with others. (The Stoics make a similar distinction; see Cicero On Academic Scepticism, p. 84.)

Given this account of Descartes’s epistemology, we can now see that both cognitio and scientia are varieties of, not only knowledge, but certainty as well. This is an important point to note, for it means that certainty cannot be straightforwardly characterized in terms of indubitability. For a belief known with certainty to be immune to doubt—not merely at a moment but absolutely—it must be embedded in a coherent system of beliefs, all of which are known with certainty (for a similar account of Descartes’s epistemology, see Sosa 1997, though Sosa takes cognitio to be a lower grade of knowledge than scientia; also, see Loeb 1992 on the importance of stability for Descartes’s epistemology). Scientia, or systematic certainty, represents an admirable, but probably unattainable, goal. If humans are capable of certainty at all, it is surely of the sort that is capable of mixing with doubts.

4. Applications of certainty

Edward Craig (1990) has argued that we can better understand the concept of knowledge by examining the purpose or purposes it serves. In a similar way, perhaps, the concept of certainty can be rendered clearer by looking at the ways in which philosophers have tried to put certainty to use. Most fundamentally, certainties provide us with inputs to inference that are stable and secure. If they are immune to doubt, they can put an end to the demand for reasons that feature in the Pyrrhonist’s argument for general skepticism (see Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Scepticism; Sosa 1997; Sienkiewicz 2019). If they have probability 1, they can simplify reasoning by allowing the reasoner to treat them as simply given, without having to attend to the risk of error for each individual premise or the accumulation of error as uncertain premises are combined. If they are indefeasible, they can allow us to reject any potential counterevidence as misleading.

Some philosophers have argued that certainty is the norm of assertion: one can assert that p just in case one is certain that p (Stanley 2008; Peterson 2019; Beddor 2020b). The norm is often defended by adapting Moore’s paradox to certainty (Moore 1942). According to the original form of the paradox, there is something infelicitous about assertions like, “It’s raining, but I don’t believe it is.” Defenders of the certainty norm of assertion argue that assertions like, “Dogs bark, but I’m not certain that they do,” are just as odd (Stanley 2008, p. 47). The explanation of this infelicity is then provided by the fact that certainty is the norm of assertion. When the speaker asserts, “Dogs bark,” but then goes on to deny being certain of that claim, she has undermined her own assertion, contradicting in practice what she has just said.

Williamson (2000) and Turri (2016) reject the certainty norm of assertion. Although a certainty version of Moore’s paradox does sound infelicitous, it doesn’t sound quite so bad as a knowledge version. Moreover, the oddity of the certainty version can be explained by the fact that there is generally “a reluctance to allow the contextually set standards for knowledge and certainty to diverge” (Williamson 2000, p. 254). That is, the standards for what counts as knowledge and as certainty typically match one another. Nevertheless, in some contexts we can pull them apart. When that happens, Williamson suggests that we assess assertions in accordance with the knowledge norm. Turri (2016) reports empirical results confirming that this is in fact the way ordinary speakers assess assertions.

Some philosophers have also argued that certainty is the norm of practical reasoning: one can rely on p in relevant practical reasoning just in case one is certain that p (Beddor 2020a). The argument for the certainty norm depends on two premises. First, if one is genuinely relying on the premise that p, one is psychologically certain that p. If one has a lower credence with respect to whether p, one is not in fact relying on p but instead on the proposition that it is likely that p. Second, the epistemic norm for psychological certainty is epistemic certainty. To be psychologically certain with respect to a proposition for which one does not have epistemic certainty is to violate Hume’s dictum that “A wise man...proportions his belief to the evidence” (Hume 1748 [2007]).

Although the second premise of the argument seems reasonable enough, the first premise is overly rigorous. In many cases, the chance of a premise being false is negligible, though not quite zero. We might well rely on it simply because it isn’t worth the effort to formulate a more precise premise. For example, in choosing a path to walk home on a day when I am in no particular hurry, I might rely on the thought that the path I’m on is as good as any other--and I don’t bother to calculate the possibility that I’m wrong. Even in cases where I am, in fact, trying to be more careful, I’ll often have to rely on an uncertain belief at some point. Suppose I’m trying to decide whether to rely on the proposition that p but come to see that it is uncertain. So, I pull back to the claim that it is likely that p. But I may not be certain that it’s likely that p. If so, I can either pull back even further--to the proposition that it is likely that it is likely that p--or I can simply rely, albeit tentatively, on the proposition that p. In almost every case, the latter is the more natural course of action to take.

A common objection to both the claim that certainty is the norm of assertion and the claim that certainty is the norm of practical action is that certainty is scarce (see Unger 1975). If so, this will mean that we rarely make proper assertions or behave in a practically rational way. Defenders of these norms typically respond by offering a contextualist account of certainty (Stanley 2008, p. 54; Beddor 2020a, p. 722). On such a view, the epistemic standards governing attributions of certainty can vary from one context to another. (Variations in conversational context will yield a contextualist view of the sort DeRose 1995 defends for knowledge attributions; variations in practical context will yield a subjective-sensitive or interest-relative view like those Hawthorne 2004 and Stanley 2005 defend with respect to knowledge.) So, what is certain in one context may fail to be in another, if the relevant standards have risen in the latter context. Although some contexts will have relatively stringent standards for what counts as certain, others may have standards that are relatively lax. In the latter contexts, then, attaining certainty shouldn’t be overly challenging.

The debate regarding contextualism is too enormous to enter into here. Still, it is worth asking whether certainty that is protected by the contextualist strategy really should count as genuine certainty. After all, the idea was that a belief one knew with certainty to be correct was one that made one immune from doubt full stop, and not just immune from doubt in the present circumstances. It was supposed to be a belief that one could rely on without hesitation in drawing inferences, evaluating new evidence, and answering questions and challenges from others. Contextually protected certainty is capable of nothing quite so stable and secure. In fact, it looks more like the epistemic version of moral certainty--good enough for most purposes, but not as good as it might be (see Matthen 2014 and Locke 2015 for views that more explicitly eschew the label of “epistemic certainty” in fleshing out this kind of epistemic status).

Philosophers who defend fallibilism about knowledge will be untroubled by this outcome (see Hetherington 2001; Reed 2013; Brown 2018). Others may lament the fading of certainty as an epistemic ideal while arguing that its abandonment is nevertheless better than going down to epistemic defeat (Pasnau 2017). A hardy few may continue to press ahead, like Descartes, in the attempt to “scale the heights of human knowledge” (PW 1, p. 11; Klein 1981).


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