Notes to Citizenship

1. The Encyclopédie defines the citizen as “celui qui est membre d’une société libre de plusieurs familles, qui partage les droits de cette société, et qui jouit de ses franchises.” (Translation: member of a free society of many families, who shares in the rights of this society and enjoys its immunities.) For the Encyclopédie, a citizen can only be male and families are the uncontested building blocks of society.

2. If a central element of citizenship consisted in participating in the business of ruling, as Aristotle and the republican tradition claimed, the corollary was that citizenship is impossible in a monarchy, where one can obly be a ‘subject’: having the obligation to obey the law of the realm and enjoying its protection, without the right to participate in its formulation. In other words, citizen and subject would be opposites. Against this dangerous idea, Hobbes had argued that “Whether a Common-wealth be Monarchicall, or Popular, the freedome is still the same” (Hobbes 1991, 149). According to Hobbes, whether we live in a monarchy or a republic, our obligation to obey the law is the same and our liberty “lyeth therefore only in those things, which in regulating [our]actions, the Soveraign hath praetermitted” (Hobbes 1991, 148).

3. As Rousseau famously wrote: “obedience to the law one has prescribed for oneself is freedom” (Rousseau, 1978, 56).

4. See, for instance, bk. I, chaps. vi and bk. III, chaps. xv of On the Social Contract.

5. Here I follow Jean-Fabien Spitz’s reading of this passage (Spitz 1995, 481–484). For a different interpretation, see Holmes, 1984.

6. There is an abundant critical literature on Marshall’s conception. See Giddens, 1982; Turner 1992, 34–47 and Lister 2005.

7. See the essays published in Kymlicka and Norman 2000. See also Spinner 1994; Parekh 2000; May, Modood and Squires 2004; Eisenberg and Spinner-Halev 2005.

8. New issues have emerged since the 1990s. First, there has been a growing interest in the relation between education, citizenship and social inequalities. Some theorists (Levinson 2012) argue that schools should contribute to social justice by empowering children and young people from marginalized groups. This leads to the promotion of social and political activism (see Maxwell 2023 for a critique). Second, there is an important debate about the appropriate contexts and methods of citizenship education. Positions on this issue vary with one’s conceptions of citizenship and of education. For instance, while some theorists emphasize the importance of developing democratic emotions through, for instance, the teaching of literature and the arts that, by stimulating the imagination, contribute to the development of empathy and enlarged thinking (Nussbaum 2010), others highlight the fact that the schools themselves must become a democratic context in which students learn to cooperate and act together (Dewey 1916; Levinson 2012). See Culp, Drerup and Yacek 2023 for an extensive overview of the field.

9. According to Brown Prener (2023), while denationalisation made an initial comeback in the wake of 9/11 and the “War on Terror”, the 2011 Syrian revolution and the ensuing radicalisation of thousands of Westerners who joined Islamic terrorist organisations to fight for the Caliphate accelerated its expansion. As the Islamic State of Iraq and the Levant (ISIL) faced increasing loss of territory and defeat, Western states expressed grave concern at the prospect of seeing “foreign fighter-citizens” return home. This fear has fed the constant expansion of denationalisation measures in many Western states (e.g. United Kingdom, Australia, Denmark, Austria, etc.).

10. The academic debate on the relation between multiculturalism and women’s rights was originally sparked by the publication in 1999 of Susan Okin’s provocative essay “Is multiculturalism bad for women?” (Okin 1999) and has been ongoing ever since. See, in particular: Shachar 2001, Okin 2005, Deveaux 2006, Song 2007, Phillips 2010 and 2016, Olufemi 2020. For a thoughtful study of the relation between religion, citizenship, and gender based on interviews with women of faith (Christian and Muslim) in Norway, Spain, and the UK, see Nyhagen and Halsaa 2016. See also Peucker 2018 on the wider issue of (muslim) religiosity and civic engagement in liberal democratic states.

11. There are variations between liberal nationalists. Miller’s conception of the public culture goes beyond the political realm to cover social norms (like honesty in filling tax returns) and may include certain cultural ideals (Miller 1995) while Kymlicka’s conception is comparatively thinner (Kymlick 2003). Still by attempting to put forward a thin conception of nationhood without entirely eliminating its cultural dimension, the liberal nationalist view can be said to undercut the familiar contrast between ‘civic’ and ‘cultural’ conceptions of the nation. This contrast is often illustrated by referring to the French and German traditions. See for instance: Brubaker 1992; Schnapper, 1994.

12. For Kymlicka’s euroscepticism, see Kymlicka 2001, 324–326. See also Miller 1995, 160–165. For the postnationalists, see Habermas 1996, 1998, 2001 a, b. The failure of the Treaty establishing a Constitution for Europe to gain ratification has not fundamentally changed Habermas’s views. See Habermas 2009 and 2012.

13. David Miller (2010) has tried to refute Abizadeh’s argument by purporting to show that immigration controls are not coercive, but rather preventive. See Abizadeh’s reply to this criticism in Abizadeh 2010. For more recent discussions of Abizadeh’s argument, see Lepoutre 2016 and Steinhoff 2020.

14. In “Law of Peoples”, Rawls considers that a nation’s prosperity is determined less by exogenous factors than by endogenous factors (e.g. a nation’s political culture; the religious, philosophical, and moral traditions supporting its basic structure; the moral qualities of its citizens, etc.) (Rawls 1999, 109). He has been strongly criticized for this by authors like Charles Beitz (1979), Thomas Pogge (2002), and Seyla Benhabib (2004).

15. However, this should not make us complacent about the deep injustices upon which the state system is built and that it reproduces. As C. Lu writes, reflecting on the situation of Indigenous peoples, “reliance on states as agents of global justice can obscure the extent to which the expansion and entrenchment of a state-centric international society has generated a structural legacy of injustice and alienation for those who continue to experience subjection to the state and the international system as a colonizing project” (Lu 2019, 253).

16. See Carens 1987, 2013. Bader (1995, 217–21) formulates a sociological critique of Walzer’s argument focusing on the gap between his conception of the political community and the modern state.

17. Ferracioli highlights a problem for liberal accounts of the state’s right to exclude: the issue of discriminatory forms of exclusion (i.e. excluding some immigrants for reasons that are impermissible from a liberal perspective, for instance because of their race or religion). See her discussion of Miller’s and Wellman’s positions, as well as her own proposal, in Feraccioli 2022.

18. This consensus over the fact that wealthy liberal states are not presently doing their fair share should not obscure what remains a fundamental difference between theorists like Tan and Brock, on the one hand, and Miller and Wellman, on the other: the issue of whether it is legitimate to give more weight to the interests of compatriots rather than to count the interests of all persons equally. On this issue, see Brock 2020.

19. For an early statement, see Soysal 1994. See also Bosniak 2006 and Song 2009.

20. But see Ottonelli and Torresi (2014) arguing that if the objective is to provide temporary migrants with “a form of political voice that fits their life plans”(580), it may be more important to secure their effective right to join trade unions and migrant organisations instead of voting rights (though the two are not mutually exclusive). See also Eisenberg 2015, warning against potential tensions between extending local voting rights to long-term migrants and securing the right of national minorities to exercise self-rule in municipalities where they are the majority.

21. One may distinguish between “cash-for-passports” programs under which an individual can obtain citizenship in return for a substantial sum of money (e.g. in the case of the Maltese program: €650,000) and more traditonal programs under which “multimillionaires can receive an admission visa through a designated business-investment stream, but would then have to more or less comply with standard residency and naturalisation requirements” (Shachar and Hirschl 2014, 246). Shachar and Hirschl’s analysis also covers those individuals who are offered a fast-track to residency and citizenship because of their exceptional skills and achievements. They call this ensemble of phenomena “olympic citizenship” and offer a nuanced discussion of the normative issues that each sub-category raises.

22. Note that theorists have also been interested in discussing the increasing global acceptance of dual citizenship in the last 50 years from a normative perspective and in terms of its impact on conceptions of citizenship. See e.g. Spiro 2016, Bauböck and Haller 2021, Irving 2022.

23. Following Tan (2017), one may distinguish between three main conceptions of cosmopolitan (i.e. transnational or global) citizenship: First, citizenship under a world state; second, a “functional” or “democratic” conception focusing on the individual’s capacity “to participate in global decision-making through new transnational institutions, empowered international organizations”, etc.; third, a normative conception, spelling out the moral perspective that an individual “should adopt when considering her moral obligations and duties of justice to others” (Tan 2017, 695–696). Here I focus on the second conception since the first finds very little support in current debates while the third has no direct institutional implications (see Tan 2017, 695; 705–710).

24. For a more optimistic assessment and normative defence of English as a global lingua franca, see Van Parijs 2011.

25. For a more positive assessment, see Bohman 2004 and 2007.

26. For a critical discussion of Tully’s conception of civic citizenship, see Dunn and Owen 2014; Leydet 2023. For an attempt to develop “the potential of the concept of civic freedom for approaches to global governance”, see Wiener 2023.

27. “[T]he more the people are aware of each other’s opinions, the stronger the incentive for those who govern to take those opinions into account. When a number of individuals find themselves expressing similar views, each realizes that he is not alone in holding a particular opinion. People who express the same opinion become aware of the similarity of their views, and this gives them capacities for action that would not have been available had they kept that opinion to themselves. The less isolated people feel, the more they realize their potential strength, and the more capable they are to organize themselves and exercise pressure on the government. Awareness of a similarity of views may not always result in organization and action, but it is usually a necessary condition. … [O]ne of the distinguishing features of representative government is the possibility for the governed themselves to become aware of each other’s views at any time, independent of the authorities.”

28. Donaldson and Kymlicka are committed to a social conception of membership, which grounds membership in the existence of “ dense webs of trust, communication and cooperation with others”(Donaldson, Kymlicka 2016, 170). Domestic animals, brought by humans into significant webs of relations with them, are members of the society. Since citizenship should map onto membership in the society, domestic animals within the boundaries of a particular society ought to be recognized also as citizens. Since wild animals live outside of human society, they are not included in the argument.

29. Hooley (2018), who supports the position that we should consider domesticated animals as fellow citizens, criticizes Donaldson and Kymlicka’s account for putting too much emphasis on political agency as a criteria for citizenship (which animals fail to meet) and argues that social membership is where the emphasis should be put. In a recent article, Kymlicka (2022) seems to be moving in a similar direction.

Copyright © 2023 by
Dominique Leydet <>

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