Collingwood’s Aesthetics

First published Tue Aug 21, 2007; substantive revision Tue Nov 30, 2021

R. G. Collingwood (1889–1943) was primarily a philosopher of history, a metaphysican and archaeologist, and considered his work in aesthetics—the principal work being his The Principles of Art (1938)—as secondary (for more about his general philosophy, see the entry on Robin George Collingwood). But the work in aesthetics has enjoyed a persistent readership that continues into the present. In the years after WWII he was probably the most widely read and influential aesthetician to have written in English since Addison, Hutcheson and Hume (not counting Ruskin as an aesthetician), and to this day continues to make his way into anthologies as a principal proponent of the expressive theory of art. In the field of the philosophy of history, Collingwood famously held the doctrine of ‘Re-enactment’: since the subject is human beings in action, the historian cannot achieve understanding by describing what happened from an external point of view, but must elicit in the reader’s own mind the thoughts that were taking place in the principal actors involved in historical events. Similarly, the aesthetic procedure is one whereby the artist and spectator jointly come to realize, to come to know, certain mental states (see Guyer 2018). Art is fundamentally expression. Collingwood saw two main obstacles to general understanding and acceptance of this: First, the word ‘art’ has surreptitiously acquired multiple meanings among ordinary folk which should be disentangled; second, a philosophical theory of the phenomenon of expression is needed to show that it is an essential part of the life of the mind, not just a special activity that poets go in for. (Collingwood actually published an earlier theory of art in Outlines of a Philosophy of Art, but came to regard that theory as mistaken, superseded by the one in Principles of Art; what follows, and all references, concern the latter only).

1. Art as Craft, Magic, Representation and Amusement

There are four concepts of human activity which are commonly called ‘art’, but which according to Collingwood, should be sharply distinguished from what he calls ‘art proper’. The implication is that those things are improperly so-called, that is, are commonly but wrongly called art. Since today the tendency in aesthetics is to insist that all things called ‘art’ are rightly so-called, it is important emphasize this fact; the Institutional Theory of Art, and the Theory of Mass Art, would no doubt be viewed by Collingwood as pernicious linguistic confusions. But in fact it is worse than this. Art proper is often found within the context of those other things; even particular works of art (proper) may at the same time be instances of those things. Furthermore, it is not as if ‘art’ once had the true meaning appertaining to art proper, and then got extended to these other things; the word has always been more or less subject to at least some of these confusions. The task, then, is to distinguish the concept from those of many other competing related human activities, and to claim that it alone deserves to be called art.

1.1 Art as Craft

The first of these things that is easily confused with art proper has the recommendation of having been espoused by Plato and Aristotle. This is the ‘technical’ theory of art, or the theory that art is craft (from the Greek word ‘technê’), by which we mean a fully worked out theory of crafts such as watchmaking, joinery, carpentry and so on. In fact, the theory of craft, along with the thesis that art is not craft, suffices to show that art proper is a distinct activity from the other three things, by showing that they are essentially crafts.

The term ‘craft’ refers to activities which typically exemplify the following six characteristics. None is individually necessary, but the less of them that an activity exemplifies, the less sense there is in calling it a craft: (1) The applicability of a distinction amongst actions as means and actions as ends; a baker, for example, whips the egg whites in course of mixing the batter, for the eventual end of baking a cake. (2) A distinction between planning and execution; a carpenter, for example, may draw up a plan for a table, and then in a separate action or set of actions construct a table. (3) In planning, ends precede means in that the latter are chosen for the sake of the former, but in execution the means precede the end. (4) We can distinguish between raw material and finished product. (5) A distinction can be drawn been form and matter. (6) Crafts stand in three sorts of hierarchy: (a) The raw material of one craft is the finished product of another; for example the sawmill produces plywood, which is in turn the raw material for builders. (b) One craft has as its end product the tools which are employed as means in another. (c) Some trades work in concert to bring about the finished product; for example, the manufacture of a computer may involve separable manufacture of the chip, the hard disc, the monitor and so on, so that the final assembly is ‘only the bringing together of these parts’.

The point is not that works of art never display any of these features; the point is that some works of art involve none of them, without its detracting from their status as art. Therefore the essence of art cannot have to do with any features correctly treated by a theory of craft. A pure case might be the poet for whom the poem simply comes to mind, unbidden, without its being written down or even said aloud. There is no distinction to be drawn between planning and execution in such a case, and none between actions as means and actions as ends. (If the poet had in mind something analogous to a blueprint for the poem, he would already have composed it.)

That takes care of (1)–(3), and (6) (a)–(c). What of (4)? It might be tempting to think of the words as the raw material, the poem as the finished product. But T. S. Eliot for example did not choose the words needed for The Wasteland and then proceed to arrange them into the poem. The poet can, however, be conceived as ‘converting emotions into poems’; but this is ‘a very different kind of thing’ from, say, the pasta maker’s conversion of flour into spaghetti. Collingwood simply leaves this point hanging, because it would require his own positive account of art as expression to explain it; that will come later. (He also neglects the possibility that the raw material of the poet is simply the language as a whole.)

Finally, the distinction between form and matter as it applies to art is not the sort required by (5). That distinction requires that the self-same matter be capable of having different forms placed upon it; if we cannot identify the matter in the first place, then the distinction cannot get a grip.

It bears repeating that the claim is not that no works of art have any craft-like features; it simply that any definition of art in terms of those features would exclude some unimpeachable works of art (29). Or rather, success in being craft is strictly immaterial to its being art; no craft-features make an object into a work of art. Collingwood is well aware that for example an opera requires a great deal of planning, technique, raw materials, and so on. And because of this, he is well aware that the craft-theory is widely if implicitly held, and devotes a lively excursus to its modern manifestation, namely ‘Art as a Psychological Stimulus’. This is the account of art whereby it is the craft (or ‘technique’) of manipulating certain objects (paint, sound, words and on) so as to bring about psychological states in the audience, which in turn are known, or least knowable, in advance. But this is to assimilate works of art to mere means; Collingwood is quite serious in his denial of this. The artist is not ‘a purveyor of drugs’ (34).

1.2 Art as Representation

Although as we will see in a moment Collingwood holds that there is more to it than this, representation is, in the first instance, the relation that a portrait bears to its sitter. It is plainly a matter of skill, of technique, since one can envisage a successful outcome before undertaking it. So art cannot be representation (or ‘mimesis’, in any straightforward sense). But the theory that it is is so venerable and influential that it demands separate attention. (Not, however, because of Plato and Aristotle; Collingwood holds that despite popular opinion, they did not hold it!).

Collingwood advances a very liberal notion of representation, such that a great deal more artefacts than one would initially think could rightly qualify as representative. For the standard for fidelity is not resemblance, but that the feeling evoked by the artefact resembles that evoked by the original. Representation comes in three, overlapping degrees. The first is that of the ordinary photograph, or paintings and the like which attempt that sort of literalness. The second is that whereby the painter – he mentions van Gogh – ‘leaves out some things that he sees, modifies others, and introduces some which he not does see in his sitter at all’ (53–4). At the extreme, he may paint mere patterns, for example, of a dance, leaving out the dancers. The third is ‘emotional representation’, which represents the inner aspect of emotion, but which is nevertheless distinct from expression. Some types of music, on this view, represent the mind undergoing its experiences, such the feeling of ‘lying in deep grass on a summer’s day watching clouds drift across the sky’ (56). Collingwood does not say what the exact difference is between representation and expression, but I assume that it depends first of all on whether or not the artist has a clear conception of what he is trying to represent; if he does, then his activity is craft, not art proper. As we will see below, this is not implausible because the artist, at least according to Collingwood, does not literally know the expressive content of his artwork in advance of expressing it. It would be in keeping with Collingwood’s approach to add that the expressed content is individual, whereas represented contents are always general; perceptually quite different works can represent exactly the same thing.

1.3 Art as Magic

Collingwood takes pains to analyze the notion of magic because properly understood, magic is much more closely intertwined with art proper than one would have thought; nevertheless, it too falls prey to the master argument: it is a kind of craft, and art is not craft.

Magic is not, contra the prevailing anthropology of the time, mere bad science—‘superstitious’ false beliefs like that of not walking under ladders because of the evil that will surely follow. Nor is it explicable as Freudian neurosis, which assumes that every society employing magical practices is to that extent sick. Magic is the ritualized representation of useful emotion, not for the sake of catharsis, but for the practical value of the emotion. The war-dance, for example, instills courage by dint of drums and spears, and frightens the enemy should he catch a glimpse. Of course false beliefs may play a role, which the theory of magic-as-bad-science seizes upon; the rain dancer may think he increases the probability of rain. But that is a ‘perversion’ of magic; the true magical effect is the reinforcement of hope and hard work that a drought puts to the test. The Freudian theory regards the representation as omnipotent wish-fulfilment and therefore fails to account for this latter effect, which indeed Collingwood supposes to be vital to any healthy society. Happily, our society, or our societies, are replete with magical phenomena. Religion, patriotism, sport, social customs such as dinner parties, weddings, funerals, dances, and so on all involve in one way or another ritualized actions that are undertaken at least partly for magical reasons. (Of course magical phenomena are probably on the wane.)

Art proper is often bound up with magical ‘art’, and indeed it is common amongst critics to confuse them. Religious art—say a twelfth-century crucifix—may be aesthetically fine as well as induce a pious awe in the mind of the believer. But the fact that a suitably kitschy product may also serve the latter purpose shows that the magical effect can be aimed at independently from the aesthetic (admittedly, Collingwood underestimates the problem of disentangling these purportedly different responses—for some people, only an aesthetically fine thing can generate strong pious emotions; perhaps Collingwood can allow that some art proper may be instrumentally necessary for the achievement of magical ends). Frequently, the particular form of this mistake is to think that an attitude towards the subject-matter embodied in a work is rightly taken as the object of purely aesthetic criticism. Thus it is common to hear for example of a play praised for taking a salutary view of sexual politics and would therefore encourage the sexes to get on better; to say so is to say that the play is very good at what Collingwood is calling ‘magic’, but is neither here nor there as regards its status as art.

1.4 Art as Amusement

The aim of amusement art is to stimulate an emotion by ‘make believe’ means, and to discharge it. If the emotion is intended to remain undischarged—if the aim is that the audience should leave the theatre indignant at global warming for example—then the work is one of magic; if the emotions it evokes are intended to be ‘earthed’, the work is one of amusement. Most of literature and drama are actually amusement—not only for example Thackeray but most of Shakespeare are included. But remember that amusement and art proper can co-exist, i.e., in the same work (in Shakespeare’s case, the same work is often actually a bundle of works, some magical, some amusement, and some, at least in favourable cases, of art proper). Collingwood stresses—in 1938—the rise of decadent amusement works, especially pornography but also for example the case of literature or film appealing to our love of imaginatively dwelling amongst the upper classes. And he warns of a danger they present to our society (or rather of the danger of the conditions that give rise to an ever growing demand for them); that is what Plato meant to proscribe in his famous banishment of the ‘artist’ from his republic, and Collingwood sees Plato as having foretold the eventual doom of Greco-Roman civilisation. Now all this is by the way; amusement is craft, not art. But the points he raises in this connection are important to his main subject, because a certain tradition wrongly identifies the success-conditions of arts of amusement as the standard of taste for art proper. Hume, for example, wrote as if the criterion for success in a work of art is the excitation of pleasure in suitably refined individuals. But pleasure has a name; the ‘artist’ who busies himself with arousing that particular emotion is merely a craftsman.

2. Art as Expression

If art proper is not the stimulation of preconceived emotion, and not the representation of it either, then what precisely does it mean to say that, nevertheless, art is the expression of emotion? The key is to remember that art is not craft—Collingwood assumes that the reader will accept this, once it is pointed out—and hence the distinction between means and ends does not, strictly speaking, apply. Nor does the distinction between planning and execution. Instead, Collingwood writes in a passage that is often quoted, when a person expresses an emotion, he is

conscious of … a perturbation or excitement which he feels going on within him, but of whose nature he is ignorant. While in this state, all he can say about his emotion is: ‘I feel … I don’t know what I feel.’ From this helpless and oppressed condition he extricates himself by doing something which we call expressing himself. This is an activity which has something to do with the thing we call language: he expresses himself by speaking. It also something to do with consciousness: the emotion expressed is an emotion of whose nature the person who feels it is no longer unconscious. It also has something to do with the way in which he feels the emotion. As unexpressed, he feels it in what we called a helpless and oppressed way; as expressed, he feels in a way from which this sense of oppression has vanished. His mind is somehow lightened and eased (109–10).

The following three points emerge from this. 1. To express is to become conscious of an emotion: that is why the distinction between plan and execution cannot be applied. 2. Expression individualises; rather than describing the emotion in words whose signification is in principle general, the expression is a intrinsic feature of the utterance, of the ‘utterance itself’ (although he does not credit him, this is an evident example where Collingwood follows Croce). Thus we cannot speak of the emotion embodied in a work of art as if it were the content which the art provides the form. 3. The ‘lightening’ of which Collingwood speaks is not that of catharsis, which provides an outlet for the emotion and may take place without its agents being conscious of it at all. It is the achievement of clarity, of focus of mind, which may indeed intensify what is felt rather than attenuate it (though typically it does not).

This last point suggests that there is such a thing as an ‘aesthetic emotion’, but it ‘is not a specific kind of emotion pre-existing to the expression of it’ (117). Instead, it is an ‘emotional colouring which attends the expression of any emotion whatever’ (ibid.) Expression, in this sense, must be sharply distinguished from the betrayal of emotion; one’s tears may be said to ‘express’ one’s sadness, or stamping one’s feet ones anger, but these can occur without the making lucid and intelligible of the emotion that is requisite for expression in Collingwood’s sense. Betrayal can even occur that is wholly unconscious; one can blush without noticing it. The relation between expressive object and emotion is that of embodiment or realization, not of inference.

3. Art as Imaginative Creation

To conceive art as the craft of emotional stimulation or arousal—whether for the sake of amusement or magic—is to regard the material work of art as the intended means towards a preconceived end. The falsity of that conception—assuming that art is essentially the expression of emotion—shows that the work of art as not an artifact at all (so artworks are not artifacts; Collingwood was aware that language sometimes suggests theoretical mistakes). Instead, the artistic process is a specialized type of making that Collingwood calls creation: to create something is to make it non-technically, but ‘consciously and voluntarily’ (128), and hence intentionally. The creator ‘need not be acting in order to achieve any ulterior end; he not be following a preconceived plan; and he is certainly not transforming anything that can be properly be called a raw material’ (129).

Now take for example a lecture given on a scientific topic. There are, in Collingwood’s view, actually at least two things: The lecture as a created thing, and the lecture as a particular sound-event. The former may be complete in advance of, or indeed without ever, being uttered or written down: the actual speech-event, as a sequence of noise, enables a suitably equipped listener to reconstruct the created thing is his own mind, therefore to grasp its scientific content, but is inessential to it. And so it is with works of art. A tune, for example, needn’t be sung, played or written down in order to exist. Thus Collingwood:

I have already said that a thing which ‘exists in a person’s head’ and nowhere else is alternatively called an imaginary thing. The actual making of the tune is therefore alternatively called the making of an imaginary tune. This is a case of creation … Hence the making a tune is an instance of imaginative creation. The same applies to the making of a poem, or a picture, or any other work of art. (134)

Collingwood is not supposing that every work of art could in point of fact exist only people’s minds; of music, for example, he writes ‘[P]erhaps no one can do that [possess himself of the music] unless he does hear the noises’ (140; of course there are some prima facie counterexamples to this; later Beethoven, for example). The human imagination is typically too weak; in most cases we have to depend on the ‘bodily’ work of art for sensory helps. But in principle, the ‘total imaginative experience’ that constitutes the proper work of art must be conceived as only contingently related to the bodily work.

What precisely is the motivation for this move, the conception of the work of art as imagined or ideal object? Leave aside the special cases of music and poetry, which Richard Wollheim notes have the special feature that they can be written down (see Wollheim 1972). Why not conceive painting, for example, as the creation of certain painted objects? This would be consistent with the thesis that painting is a not craft. The answer given by Collingwood is clear, but leads to trouble when we consider the question of interpretation. An experience of a painting involves a great deal that no one would say is ‘in the painting’, which is, after all, a nearly flat canvas with paint on it. Not only do we see things that are not really present, but for example we have impressions of space and mass, perhaps by means of what Berenson called ‘ideated sensations’—those which involve imaginary motor or kinaesthetic sensations. These phenomena are not literally features of the canvas, but they are in some sense features of the work. So Collingwood, in brief, includes within the work of art proper all that would normally be ascribed to the (correct) interpretation—the (correct) experience—of the artwork. But there is no reason to accept this, any more we should include all the relational facts—sowing, fertilization, watering and so on—that contribute to a growing plant to the plant itself. On contrary, the position makes it impossible for two spectators to disagree on the interpretation of a work. Irrespective of the concern with the privacy of the experience, if they attribute different properties to the object—that is, they find different properties in their respective total imaginative experiences—they are simply concerned with different objects, and their verdicts are compatible. We could set the artist’s own experience as a criterion of understanding the work, but that would make his death significant in way that we do not actually recognize, and would run against the grain of Collingwood’s antipathy to aesthetic individualism and the ‘cult of genius’, discussed below. As a matter of speculation, Collingwood perhaps thought that aesthetically relevant properties—expressive properties—have to be intrinsic properties of the work of art; in that case, perhaps his conclusion does follow. But it is much more satisfactory to hold that what we are arguing over when we disagree over the expressive properties of a work of art is the same object.

4. A Theory of Expressive Imagination

Not a great deal hangs on that thesis, at any rate. A great deal more hangs on the thesis that art essentially exercises the expressive imagination. The difference between the imagined lecture and the tune is that the content of the lecture is verbal and cognitive, and brings those departments of mind into play; whilst the tune, among other things, brings the emotional department of the mind much more vividly into play. The substance of Collingwood’s view is largely dependent on his account of this distinction.

At the most basic level Collingwood distinguishes thinking from feeling. The objects of each, respectively, are thoughts and ‘sensa’: ‘sensa’ is Collingwood’s name for all the data of the senses—of touch, smell, sight, and so on. Thoughts can be true or false, justified or not, where sensa have no such duality: they are felt or not felt, but cannot contradict each other. There is sense in which sensa can be said to be real or unreal, true or false (for example in hallucination), but this not an intrinsic feature of sensa themselves; that distinction applies only to thoughts involving them. A first point that is directly relevant to the theory of expression is that probably all sensa have an emotional ‘charge’. Thus for example every colour carries with it a certain emotional quality. Not that they are invariably experienced with their particular emotional charge; the charge is more like a disposition to be experienced a certain way, under certain circumstances. Children or artists are more likely to experience them; educated adult Europeans, Collingwood says, tend to have rather ‘sterilized’ experience.

Sensa are occurrent phenomena, and therefore fleeting (222): If I hear the bell striking the hour of four, the experience comprises many passing sensa, each no sooner generated than gone. But if I am to be aware of them as a process extended in time with particular morphology, I must retain the sound of the bell, along with the silences in between. The objects that I so retain cannot be the sensa themselves. Instead, the faculty of ‘conscious attention’ generates ‘ideas’ corresponding to the sensa, and which are retained. Sensa alone—or sense data, or impressions—are never sufficient for consciousness. Collingwood cites Kant approvingly in the connection; noting that we have always to ‘fill in’ occurrent perception to generate a complete world of 3-D objects, he writes:

Moreover (this is a point Kant has made), it is only so far as I imagine them that I am aware of the matchbook as a solid body at all. A person who could really see, but could not imagine, would see not a solid world of bodies of bodies, but merely (as Berkeley has it) ‘various colours variously disposed’. Thus, as Kant says, imagination is an ‘indispensable function’ for our knowledge of the world around us. (192)

When one is conscious of a feeling of anger, one is aware of it as one’s own. By becoming conscious of it—therefore not of the sensation of anger but the anger transformed by consciousness—what we feel ‘is correspondingly changed’ (207); the ‘effect of this experience … is make them less violent’ (209). And another word for this is imagination. ‘We become able to perpetuate feeling … at will’ (209). ‘Imagination is thus the new form which feeling takes when transformed by the activity of consciousness’ (215). With this level of consciousness comes the beginning of self-consciousness; ‘it is assertion of ourselves as the owners of our feeling’ (222; feeling that is ‘as modified by consciousness’). But imagination, since it deals not with sensa but with their ideated analogues, is a type of thought, and with the introduction of thought comes the possibility of error. Thus if the basic action of the consciousness is to think ‘This is how I feel’, its denial is ‘This is not how I feel’ (216). The possibility of such disowned feeling is the possibility of false, or corrupt consciousness (217).

Thought is established by the intellect, but there are two, separable roles of thought called ‘primary’ and ‘secondary’. Its primary role is to ‘apprehend or construct relations’ (216) amongst ideas, as just described (in fact Collingwood thinks in such relations the relata are fused in a new idea comprising a ‘peculiar colouring or modification of the old’ (223)). The secondary role is to apprehend or construct ‘relations between acts of primary intellection’; by this Collingwood means conceptions of the past, future, the possible etc., and presumably all that content of human thought which can not be accounted for in terms of the imagination.

5. Language

That Collingwood has a theory of language might seem tangential to his theory of art, but in fact it is integral to it. For Collingwood’s approach to it comes not from the theory of reference and truth as in Frege or Russell, but from the point of view which regards language as fundamentally or in the first instance expressive behaviour. Concepts of referential semantics—as a ‘symbolism’ in Collingwood’s terminology—become applicable only later, with a certain degree of sophistication is attained. ‘In its original or native state, language in imaginative or expressive … It is imaginative activity whose function is to express emotion.’ (225). Of course ‘imaginative’ must be understood in the broader sense just described, denoting all consciousness of ideated analogues of sensation or feeling. From this angle, we can speak of the ‘totality of our motor activities’ as a ‘parent organism’ (247), from which every type of ‘language (speech, gesture, and so forth)’ is an ‘offshoot’ (246).

At the most fundamental level, at the ‘psychic’ level as Collingwood calls it, various sorts of bodily activity are said to psychically express an underlying emotional charge on a sensum; cringing or flinching express fear, for example. At this stage consciousness of the imagination is not involved—only sensa; this level is shared with animals, and is ‘completely uncontrollable’ (234). With the consciousness of ideas comes ‘emotions of consciousness’, which require language for their expression. A cry from a child, for example, may be either psychic or imaginative, depending whether it is involuntary or voluntary. If it is voluntary, it is the work of the conscious imagination, and thus in the most rudimentary sense linguistic.

It is essential to Collingwood’s view that there are not, paradoxical as it sounds, any unexpressed emotions. A psychical emotion, on one hand, simply has its being in its expression; an emotion of fear must show up somewhere, whether by cringing, shying or flinching, an increase in pulse or blood pressure, a tightness of the chest, or something else bodily or physiological. On the other hand, if someone tries but fails to express an emotion, the emotion at most remains ‘shut up’ in the psychic level; in order to be conscious of the emotion, ‘the same consciousness which generates these emotions converts them from impressions into ideas generates also and simultaneously their appropriate linguistic expression.’(238). There is no other way to be conscious of an emotion; to express an emotion is to be conscious of it.

Collingwood’s remarks about the relation between speaker and hearer are of special interest not just to aestheticians but to philosophers of mind interested in knowledge of other minds. A voluntary cry is underpinned by a self-conscious imaginative act; and however rudimentary it is, self-consciousness is at once the consciousness of others. ‘[A]s persons’, writes Collingwood, ‘they construct a new set of relations between themselves, arising out their consciousness of themselves and one another; these are linguistic relations.’ (248).

The relation of the listener and speaker to an expressive act is totally symmetric:

The hearer, therefore, conscious that he is being addressed by another person like himself … takes what he hears exactly as if it were speech of his own: he speaks to himself with the words that he hears addressed to him, and thus constructs in himself the idea which those words express. At the same time, being conscious of the speaker as a person other than himself, he attributes that idea to this other person. Understanding what some one says to you is thus attributing to him the idea which his words arouse in yourself; and this implies treating them as words of your own. (250).

Remember, again, that we are talking of the expressive dimension of language, not the referential dimension (about which more in a moment). To understand another person’s emotions is precisely to adopt the person’s expressive language as one’s own, imaginatively experiencing the ideas as if they were one’s own (that is, as if they expressed one’s own emotion; of course the ideas, as analogues of sensation, are necessarily one’s own). This aspect of Collingwood, of the necessary publicity of language and meaning, can be stressed as a potential way out of the threat of the seeming privacy of the work of art as mentioned above, in connection with p. 134 of the Principles.

There is however one evident mistake in Collingwood’s presentation. Sensa are, as we’ve seen, fleeting. But no idea ‘can be formed as such in consciousness except by a mind whose sense-emotional experience contains the corresponding impression … at that very moment.’ (251). This cannot be right. To understand Othello, we don’t have to actually have an impression of jealousy; we only need to have the idea. In fact, by what we said in section IV, there are no impressions (sensa) of jealousy at all; jealousy is an emotion of consciousness. The solution, which as far as I can see is consistent with everything else Collingwood says, is simply to erase the requirement that the listener must undergo anything at the psychical level, the level of sensa, coevally with expression (we leave open the question of whether it must have happened to one in the past).

Earlier, we said that thought involving relations is the domain of thought in its ‘secondary’ role, the realm of intellect. Thoughts delivered by the imagination are ‘seamless’:

Thus what I imagine, however complex it may be, is imagined as a single whole, where relation between the part are present simply as qualities of the whole.

‘Analytical thought’—intellect, thought in its secondary role—may begin with the same experience, but instead of being ‘an indivisible unity it becomes a manifold, a network of things with relations between them’ (253). Collingwood also characterises the intellect as the domain of concepts, and of generalisation (273, 281).

Now one might be tempted to suppose that thoughts as grasped by the intellect are roughly the same as propositions, in the sense intended by analytical philosophers. But Collingwood holds that the proposition is ‘a fictitious entity’ (266), and devotes a long passage to excoriating that tendency in philosophy. Every actual episode of thought is performed with its own particular degree and character of emotion; there is no such thing as the thought shorn of its emotional husk. All mental activity has some emotional character, including intellectual activity. The cry of ‘Eureka’ said to have accompanied Archimedes’ discovery of a principle of hydrostatics is but an extreme example. Thus language is expressive of emotion even in its scientific use. This applies even to mathematical symbols and technical symbols. Insofar as they are used, they automatically acquire the expressive character of the underlying thoughts. Thus Collingwood says: ‘Symbolism is thus intellectual language; language, because it expresses emotions; intellectualized, because adapted to the expression of intellectual emotions’ (269). In ‘poeticizing’ such language, Collingwood does not intend to demean it; presumably the aim is to do justice to the rarefied air of pure intellect:

The progressive intellectualization of language, its progressive conversion by the word of grammar and logic into a scientific symbolism, thus represents not a progressive drying-up of emotions, but its progressive articulation and specialization. We are not getting away from an emotional atmosphere into a dry, rational atmosphere; we are acquiring new emotions and new means of expressing them. (269)

Nevertheless, Collingwood’s account of language, needless to say, is radical; he is quite serious in his denial of the possibility of what earlier I called a theory of the purely referential dimension of language, which generalizes about truth-conditions of sentences in abstraction from their use:

… we are concerned with a modification of language, not a theory of it. Its assumptions are neither certainly nor probably, nor ever possibly, true. They are, in fact, not assumptions, but proposals; and what they propose is the conversion of language into something which, if it could be realized, would not be language at all. (262)

6. Practical Consequences: Art and Artists

With his theory of language in place, Collingwood takes the theory of art to be complete. At the end of section III we said that Collingwood defines Art as imaginative expression, assuming that readers will agree once they have the mistakes of the technical or craft theory pointed out for them. He then poses a particular theory of mind in which imagination and expression are built into the structural fabric of the mind, so that every intentional mental act is in some sense an act of an expressive imagination. That includes linguistic acts. In fact, properly understood, language encompasses all expressive acts whatsoever, and every linguistic act is one way or another an expressive act. Language and art become interchangeable (274). ‘Every utterance’, Collingwood says, ‘and every gesture that each one of us makes is a work of art’ (285). Collingwood next turns to ‘practical’ questions, of which we will consider two: the relation of art to artists, and relation between the artist and the community. In answering them, we will consider some questions naturally arising from the preceding.

If all activity is in that sense ‘artistic’, then it is natural to wonder whether the theory has anything to tell us about art, that is, the peculiar business of the painter, the poet, the musician and the like. Of course, most activity is undertaken with a some purpose in mind or other, in which case it is craft, however hum-drum the theory of it might be. For example, I just ate an orange which I took from a bowl; the theory of what I did could be written down in a practical guide to eating oranges. But surely I was conscious of eating the orange; by Collingwood’s theory, then, was I not expressing something? In that case, by the same theory, just by being conscious, was I not engaged in art? And is that not absurd?

Collingwood says nothing in direct reply to this worry, but I think it obvious that the reply would be this. In so far as I was conscious of the orange, it is true that I was involved in expression. But this conscious experience was un-sustained, fleeting, and lacking in depth (307). Furthermore, it took place in a mind that was busy with other things, and which was dominated by an overarching purpose, namely to eat the orange, whose sub-tasks include selecting it, peeling it, putting a section in my mouth, trying not spill too much juice, and so on; all this would be written down in my practical guide to eating oranges. Life, then, is full of ‘artworks’, but they are mostly shallow, unworthy of comment. However, there are times when consciousness settles on something, such that the mental activity does approach the character of art, in the proper sense of the word. Sitting in a park, for example, we might dwell on the look of an oak tree, or suddenly think of an original stanza of poetry, or a snatch of melody. These are instances of imaginative expression, and are closer to what we should ordinarily call a work of art. But they are likely to be lost, unless some record of the experience is made. The ‘artist’, then, is one who has these experiences of consciousness more deeply than the average person, and who has mastered the practice of preserving them.

But the act of ‘preserving them’ has to be understood in a special sense. ‘There is no question’, says Collingwood, “of ‘externalizing’ an inward experience which is complete in itself and by itself” (304). Collingwood is denying that a painter could in point of fact dispense with the medium, even if in principle he could (in sense of ‘could in principle’ in which a man might run a hundred miles per hour). Instead, although ‘you see something in your subject, of course, before you begin to paint it’ (303), the ‘experience develops itself and defines itself in your mind as you paint’ (ibid.). The work of art develops by means of positive feedback between painting and experience. What develops is the ‘total imaginative experience’ that Collingwood identifies as the work of art, strictly speaking (304). Again, the work of art proper is not to be identified with the ‘bodily work’—the painted canvas, the sculpted bust—but with the experience of it. What is true that in point of fact the imaginative experiences requires the bodily work; the human imagination is not able to hold within it anything approaching the richness made available by the plastic arts. In particular, the ‘outward element’—the bodily work—provides the sensuous content or impressions out of which the conscious imagination generates ideas, constituting the ‘total imaginative experience’ (see Davies 2008 for more on this issue).

7. Practical Consequences: The Artist and the Community

‘Theoretically’, Collingwood says, ‘the artist is a person who comes to know himself, to know his own emotion’ (291). Despite this, however, Collingwood is anxious to show this does not entail aesthetic solipsism, as if the artist need not ever concern himself with others. Quite the opposite: necessarily the artistic achievement is collaborative, involving the audience and other artists.

Collingwood begins his account of the relation between artist and spectator by saying that a spectator understands a given work just insofar as his imaginative experience is identical with that had by the artist in creating it. This can never be known with certainty, but so it is with all understanding of language (remember that ‘language’ in Collingwood’s usage means all expressive behaviour). It is also piecemeal: ‘Understanding … is a complex business, consisting of many phases, each complete in itself but each leading on to the next’ (311). Collingwood does speak of identity of understanding, but really his real account is more fluid. First, he accepts that any utterance is endlessly interpretable; there no such thing as ‘the’ meaning of a work (ibid.). Second, the audience’s role is collaborative, in the sense that the artist is concerned to express emotions that are mutually held; failure in this may rightly cause the artist to doubt whether he expressed anything, and suffers instead from a ‘corruption of consciousness’ as explained earlier. The audience, then, actively participates in re-creating the imaginative experience. This second point flows from his conception of art as a language:

The child learning his mother tongue, as we have seen, learns simultaneously to be a speaker and to be a listener; he listens to others speaking, and speaks to others listening. It is the same with artists. They become poets or painters or musicians not by some process of development from within, as they grow beards; but by living in a society where these languages are current. Like other speakers, they speak to those who understand. (317)[1]

Collingwood further dilutes the air of aesthetic solipsism by observing that the artist never works alone; on the one hand the artist freely borrows from what has already been achieved, and on the other, at least in the performing arts, the players have their own essential role. A work of art is collaborative, not simply the creation of an individual; the ‘cult of individual genius’ is totally misplaced and indeed pernicious.

8. Problems

Collingwood’s theory is generally lumped together with that of Benedetto Croce as an expressive and idealist theory. There are of course differences, but the established picture is not inaccurate. And together with Croce’s theory, Collingwood’s has a fatal defect (without questioning the starting-point, that the essence of art to be expressive): In identifying the artwork with what we would normally think of as the experience of the artwork, he makes nonsense of the idea that the spectator interprets the artwork, and can do so more or less accurately; that different people can argue about the self-same work of art. It has become a truism that the artist is no better placed than the audience to interpret a work rightly, a truism that Collingwood, with his fulminations again aesthetic individualism, would agree. But then the various imaginative experiences have nothing to conform to, if artwork and experience and hence artwork and interpretation cannot be separated. That would be fatal to the theory; however, it is not clear that anything substantial would be lost, if Collingwood were simply to identify the work of art with the ‘bodily work’, thereby re-establishing room for interpretation to operate. This would seem to sit better with his idea that art is on a level with language, where language is a public phenomenon.

An apparent further defect in Collingwood’s case in particular is his account of language. It is full of admirable insights, but it is probably misconceived from back to front. The insistence that language is always expressive is dogmatic, and leads Collingwood to deny that there is any categorical distinction between poetry and scientific writing, which many may take as a reductio ad absurdum (298). And more seriously so far as his philosophy of art is concerned, one might wonder about his account of consciousness as tied to language. According to it—the theory of imagination—merely to attend to something is thereby to express it, and furthermore is to do something linguistic. Even if we allow Collingwood his generalised notion of language as appertaining to gesture and so on, surely there has to be a separation between consciousness or attention and expression. As C. J. Ducasse pointed out, it seems that when we look at a vase full of flowers, do we not create a “work of art” unless we draw or paint it (Ducasse 1929, 52–54).

Finally, it is hard to swallow whole Collingwood’s distinction between art and craft. The consequences are too severe. For example, Collingwood, rigorously applying the distinction, says that insofar as his activity is art in the proper sense, an artist, since he has no idea what he is to express until he expresses it, cannot set out to write, say, a tragedy (116).[2] There is something right in the idea that that the artist cannot ‘plan and execute’ an inspiration. But the distinction Collingwood is after is surely not so cut and dried as that. He needs at any rate a more selective weapon to attack his bugbear of amusement art.


Primary Literature

For a more complete bibliography of Collingwood’s writings, see the Bibliography in the entry on Collingwood.

  • Collingwood, R. G., 1938, The Principles of Art, London: Oxford University Press.
  • Collingwood, R. G., 1925, Outline of a Philosophy of Art, London: Oxford University Press.
  • Croce, B., 1922, Aesthetic: As science of expression and general lingustic, D. Ainslie (trans.) Revised edition. New York: Macmillan.

Secondary Literature

  • Allen, R., 1993, “Mounce and Collingwood on Art and Craft”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 33(2): 173–176.
  • Anderson, D. R. and C. Hausman, 1992, “The Role of Aesthetic Emotion in R G Collingwood’s Conception of Creative Activity”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 50(4): 299–305.
  • Burgin, G., 2015, “Danto’s error”, Philosophy in the Contemporary World, 22(1): 37–49.
  • Davidson, D., 2001, Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Davies, D., 2008, “Collingwood’s ‘Performance’ Theory Of Art”, The British Journal of Aesthetics, 48(2): 162–174.
  • Dilworth, J., 1998, “Is Ridley Charitable to Collingwood?”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 56(4): 393–396.
  • –––, 2004, “Artistic Expression as Interpretation”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 44(1): 10–28.
  • Dönmez, D., 2015, “Collingwood and Art Proper: From Idealism to Consistency”, Estetika: The Central European Journal of Aesthetics, 52(2): 152–164.
  • Ducasse, C. J., 1929, The Philosophy of Art, New York: Dial.
  • Grant, J., 1987, “On Reading Collingwood's Principles of Art”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 46(2): 239–248.
  • Guyer, P., 2018, “Re-enactment, Reconstruction and the Freedom of the Imagination: Collingwood on History and Art”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 26(4): 738–758.
  • Hausman, C., 1998, “Aaron Ridley’s Defence of Collingwood Pursued”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 56(4): 391–393.
  • Hopkins, R., 2017, “Imaginative Understanding, Affective Profiles, and the Expression of Emotion in Art”, Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 75(4): 363–374.
  • Hospers, J., 1954, “The Concept of Artistic Expression”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 55: 313–44.
  • Kemp, G., 2003, “The Croce-Collingwood Theory as Theory”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 61(2): 171–193.
  • –––, 2012, “Art as Expression: Croce and Collingwood”, in A. Giovanelli (ed.), Aesthetics, The Key Thinkers, London: Continuum.
  • Kobayashi, C., 2008, “British Idealist Aesthetics, Collingwood, Wollheim, and the Origin of Analytic Aesthetics”, Baltic International Yearbook of Cognition, Logic and Communications (Volume 4), Riga: University of Latvia.
  • Lord, T., 2011, “Anti-realism in R.G. Collingwood’s Theory of Art as Imagination”, Idealistic Studies, 41(1–2): 45–54.
  • Witsher, N., 2018, “Feeling, Emotion and Imagination: In Defence of Collingwood’s Expression Theory of Art”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 26(4): 759–781.
  • Ridley, A., 1997, “Not Ideal: Collingwood’s Expression Theory”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 55(3): 263–272.
  • –––, 1998a, R.G. Collingwood: A Philosophy of Art, London: Phoenix.
  • –––, 1998b, “Collingwood’s Commitments: A Reply to Hausman and Dilworth”, The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 56(4): 396–398.
  • –––, 2002, “Congratulations, it’s a Tragedy: Collingwood’s Remarks on Genre”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 42(1): 52–63.
  • Wertz, S., 1995, “The Role of Practice in Collingwood’s Theory of Art”, Southwest Philosophy Review: The Journal of The Southwestern Philosophical Society, 11(1): 143–150.
  • Winchester, I., 2004, “Collingwood’s Notion of a Work of Art”, Collingwood and British Idealism Studies, 10: 62–70.
  • Wittgenstein, L., 1953, Philosophical Investigations, R. Rhees (ed.), G. E. M. Anscombe (trans.), Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Wollheim, R., 1972, “On on Alleged Inconsistency in Collingwood’s Aesthetics”, in Critical Essays on the Philosophy of R.G. Collingwood, M. Krausz (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1980, Art and Its Objects, 2nd edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

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