Nonconceptual Mental Content

First published Tue Jan 21, 2003; substantive revision Wed Jul 17, 2024

The central idea behind the theory of nonconceptual mental content is that some mental states can represent the world even though the bearer of those mental states need not possess the concepts required to specify their content. This basic idea has been developed in different ways and applied to different categories of mental state. Not all of these developments and applications are consistent with each other, but each offers a challenge to the widely held view that the way a creature can represent the world is determined by its conceptual capacities.

1. Introduction

Although some of the themes in current discussions of nonconceptual content have surfaced at various times in recent philosophical thinking (within the philosophy of perception, see, e.g., Dretske 1969, 1981. Within philosophy of cognitive science, see, e.g., Stich 1978), the notion of nonconceptual content was explicitly introduced into analytical philosophy by Gareth Evans (Evans 1982). As part of his general discussion of the role of information-links in making possible demonstrative and other types of identification, Evans develops the idea that the information yielded by the perceptual systems (including somatic proprioception) is nonconceptual. This nonconceptual information, he argues, is initially unconscious but becomes conscious when it serves as input to a thinking, concept-applying, and reasoning system.

Evans is not always clear whether he understands nonconceptual content to be a personal level or a subpersonal level phenomenon. And, in fact, it seems that Evans’s conception of nonconceptual content is in at least one important way deeply antithetical to that currently discussed. Whereas much contemporary discussion of nonconceptual content is focused on the content of conscious perceptual states, it looks very much as if Evans understands perceptual states with nonconceptual content as being non-conscious until the subject’s conceptual abilities are brought to bear on them (Campbell 2005). Nonetheless, the general idea that there might be ways of representing the world independent of the thinker’s conceptual capacities has inspired other philosophers. An early, personal level application of the notion is Tim Crane’s paper on the waterfall illusion (Crane 1988a. An illustration of the waterfall illusion, also known as the motion aftereffect illusion, can be found here). Crane argues that the waterfall illusion presents an experience with a contradictory content that hence cannot have a conceptual content—since conceptual contents must be consistent. This claim has provoked some debate (Mellor 1988, Crane 1988b).

Early development of the notion of nonconceptual content came primarily from philosophers connected with the University of Oxford and working within a broadly Fregean tradition. Christopher Peacocke, in a series of papers and then in his book on concepts (Peacocke 1992), argued that the fineness of grain of perceptual experience outstrips the conceptual capacities of the perceiver (more on the fineness of grain argument in section 4.1). He offered a detailed theoretical framework for understanding the nonconceptual content of perceptual experience, which he termed scenario content. A rather different account of the nature of perceptual experience in nonconceptual terms was provided by Adrian Cussins (Cussins 1990), who suggested that we should understand the nonconceptual content of experience in essentially ability-based terms. Cussins argued that this personal level notion of nonconceptual content is naturally complemented at the subpersonal level by a connectionist cognitive architecture. Michael Martin applied the notion of nonconceptual content to the study of memory (Martin 1992). Recent applications of the notion of nonconceptual content have focused on the relation between perception and action (Hurley 1998) and the analysis of conscious experience (Tye 1995, 2000).

One thesis that might be held about nonconceptual content is that a thinker can represent the world nonconceptually without possessing any concepts at all. This was termed the Autonomy Thesis by Peacocke, who offers an argument against it in his (1992). This argument was challenged by José Luis Bermúdez (Bermúdez 1994) in favor of a notion of autonomous nonconceptual content that can be used to explain the behavior of nonlinguistic creatures. Peacocke was initially unconvinced by this line of argument (Peacocke 1994), but subsequently changed his mind (Peacocke 2002). Bermúdez further deployed the notion of autonomous nonconceptual content in exploring primitive nonlinguistic forms of self-consciousness (Bermúdez 1998). (More on the Autonomy Thesis in section 6.)

The notion of nonconceptual content has also been utilized in specifying the representational contents of subpersonal states, such as those involved in the early stages of visual processing. Such states, it is suggested, have representational contents and yet it is unlikely that the subject undergoing those states has the concepts utilized in a theoretical description of the contents of those states. (More on the nonconceptual character of subpersonal states in section 4.2.) Additionally, the notion of nonconceptual content has been utilized in the explanation of the behavior of nonlinguistic creatures or those that do not employ concepts. Since, ex hypothesi, such organisms do not have conceptual capacities, if we are to attribute to them states with representational contents at all the only contents available to us are nonconceptual representational contents. (More on the explanation of the behavior of nonlinguistic creatures in section 4.3.)

The most extensive discussion of the notion of nonconceptual content has been in the philosophy of perception. Many have suggested that a correct specification of the representational contents of perception need not be limited to concepts possessed by the perceiver. In other words, a specification of the content of perception can be sensitive to how an organism perceptually represents its environment even though it utilizes concepts the organism need not possess. This claim is supported by a variety of different considerations, some of which concern the distinctive features of the phenomenology of perception and some which concern perception’s distinctive epistemic role. (See section 4.1 for the debate about the nonconceptual content of perception.)

Some have objected to Evans’s original characterization of the notion on the grounds that whether or not a correct specification of the representational content of some mental states is constrained by the concepts possessed by the subject speaks only to the conditions a subject must satisfy in order to undergo such states, rather than to the nature of the state’s representational content (e.g., Heck 2000). This has led to a distinction between two forms of nonconceptualism—“state”-nonconceptualism and “content”-nonconceptualism. The former is concerned with the conditions one must meet in order to undergo a state with a given content, i.e., whether or not one must possess the concepts involved in specifying that content, whereas the latter is concerned with the nature of a mental state’s content. Nonetheless, as we discuss below, there is good reason to suppose that the distinction collapses, and that the two forms of nonconceptualism are mutually-entailing. (See section 3 for the purported distinction between state and content nonconceptualism.)

2. Nonconceptual content: An initial characterization

The notion of nonconceptual content is fundamentally contrastive. In elucidating it we need to start with the notion of conceptual content. The paradigm case of a state with conceptual content is a propositional attitude such as a belief or desire. Having a propositional attitude involves standing in a certain relation to a content (a thought or a proposition). The content is what it is that is believed, desired, hoped for etc. Although propositional attitudes are ultimately directed at certain objects, properties and/or relations (which yield their truth-condition, and in terms of which their truth-value is to be determined), it is clear that only certain ways of characterizing those objects/properties/relations can serve to specify the content of the relevant propositional attitude. It would be incorrect, for example, to characterize the content of my current belief that my car is parked in the driveway by using the concepts of particle physics to describe the state of affairs that would make it true. This would be incorrect because it completely fails to capture how I think about the state of affairs of my car being in the driveway. The obvious question to ask, once this preliminary point is in play, is ‘What constraints are imposed upon specifications of the content of propositional attitudes by the requirement to respect the way the subject thinks about the truth-condition of the relevant attitude?’

Different theories of content will respond to this question in different ways, but the following is widely held to impose a minimal constraint upon any such response.

The conceptual constraint:
Specifications of the content of a sentence or propositional attitude should only employ concepts possessed by the utterer or thinker.

Certain theories of content and concepts directly entail the conceptual constraint. Within a broadly Fregean tradition, for example, the contents of propositional attitudes (and the meanings of sentences) are taken to consist of concepts—and it is hard to see how one can have a propositional attitude whose content is a complex of concepts without possessing each of them.[1]

But the conceptual constraint does not depend upon adopting any particular theory of content. Its plausibility stems, rather, from the conjunction of two thoughts.

  1. In specifying what a thinker believes, what a perceiver perceives or what a speaker is saying by uttering a certain sentence in a particular context one has to be as faithful as possible to how that thinker, perceiver or speaker apprehends the world.
  2. How a thinker, perceiver or speaker apprehends the world in having beliefs about it, perceiving it or speaking about it is a function of the concepts he possesses.

This way of motivating the conceptual constraint has been explicitly put forward by several authors who argue forcibly for the second thesis (see, for example, Peacocke 1983, McDowell 1994a, Brewer 1999, and Noë 1999). Theorists of nonconceptual content, in contrast, accept the first constraint without the second. They hold that specifications of content must respect the way a thinker, perceiver or speaker apprehends the world and because of this they cannot be circumscribed by the concepts possessed by the thinker, perceiver or speaker. Theorists of nonconceptual content postulate the existence of ways of representing the world (and hence the existence of a type of content) that outstrip the concepts possessed by the thinker.

The conceptual constraint can be lifted in two different ways. It can be lifted globally by simply denying that any content specifications need confine themselves to the concepts possessed by the utterer/thinker. The currently popular identification of propositions with functions from possible worlds to truth values involves a global lifting of the conceptual constraint. Possible world semantics is intended to apply to all propositional attitudes and it is obvious that few believers who are not also professional philosophers will have any grip at all on the central theoretical concepts of possible worlds semantics. All content comes out as nonconceptual content in this sense (Stalnaker 1998).[2] In terms of the two motivations identified earlier for the conceptual constraint, this approach to specifying content appears to repudiate the first. It holds that specifications of content need not be sensitive to how the speaker or thinker apprehends the world, at least if one thinks that such sensitivity requires a degree of aspectuality that possible worlds semantics explicitly rejects.[3]

It is more interesting to think about what might happen if we retain the first motivation, but question the second, looking for ways in which thinkers/perceivers/speakers represent the world that are not a function of the concepts they possess. There are three different representational domains for which such a local lifting of the conceptual constraint may be plausible:

  1. Perceptual states (see further 4.1 below)
  2. Representational states at the subpersonal or subdoxastic level (see further 4.2 below)
  3. Representational states of non-human animals and human infants who do not seem to be concept possessors (see further 4.3 below)

Of course, the plausibility of a local lifting of the conceptual constraint will be a function of how concepts are understood. In the following we make two assumptions about concepts. These assumptions do not fix a single notion of concept, but they do however determine the logical space within which accounts can be developed of the correlative notions of conceptual and nonconceptual content.

The first assumption is that concepts are semantic entities rather than psychological entities. Concepts are constituents of contents. Attitudes towards contents are psychological occurrences, but the contents themselves are not psychological entities. They, and the concepts they contain, are abstract entities.[4] The second assumption is that, although concepts are abstract entities, mastering a concept is a psychological achievement. We need a cognitive account of what it is to master a concept, even though concepts are not psychological entities.

3. An important distinction: State vs. content nonconceptualism

Heck (2000) introduces an alternative conception of the debate over nonconceptual content. This conception arises from an ambiguity he finds in Evans (1982) and other proponents of nonconceptual content. He notes that these proponents appeal to the thesis that while the beliefs a person can have depend on the concepts she possesses, the perceptual states she can have do not. However, this thesis does not immediately establish a conclusion about the contents of perception. It establishes only a conclusion about the conditions a subject must satisfy to be in a perceptual state with some content. Prima facie, this conclusion appears to be compatible with the claim that perceptual states and belief states have the same type of content.

Heck distinguishes two different ways of drawing the conceptual/nonconceptual distinction. According to the content view, there is a fundamental difference between the type of content that perceptual experiences can have and the type of content that beliefs and other propositional attitudes can have. According to the state view, in contrast, there need not be more than one type of content. Perceptual experiences and propositional attitudes could have contents of the same type (in both cases content could be given in terms of sets of possible worlds, for example). What distinguishes perceptions from propositional attitudes on the state view is that the latter are concept-dependent while the former are concept-independent. A state-type is concept-dependent just if it is content-bearing and it is impossible for a thinking and perceiving subject to be in a token state of that type without possessing the concepts required to specify the content of that token state. In contrast, a subject can be in states of a concept-independent state-type even if she lacks all or some of the concepts required for an accurate specification of the relevant contents.[5]

Several reasons have been proposed for considering state, rather than content, nonconceptualism as of primary importance in the nonconceptual debate. First, as many have noted (Byrne 2003, 2005, Speaks 2005, Crowther 2006, Heck 2007), keeping the state/content distinction in mind suggests that much of the recent debate purportedly aiming at the content of perception in fact only concerns state-nonconceptualism. Arguments for the nonconceptual content of perception usually proceed via demonstration of the concept-independence of perception. However, this is a characteristic of state-nonconceptualism; it does not seem to entail content-nonconceptualism directly. In section 4.1, after reviewing the arguments that have been proposed for the nonconceptual content of perception, we will return to this concern.

A second reason offered for discussing nonconceptualism at the level of state type rather than at the level of content is that it allows for a meaningful debate about nonconceptualism even if one holds that all content is nonconceptual. Stalnaker (1984, 1998), for example, argues that all content should be understood in terms of sets of possible worlds. If that is the case, then the difference between the propositional attitudes and perception should be elucidated in terms extrinsic to the type of content involved in these states. This can be achieved if we think that the propositional attitudes, but not perceptual states, are concept-dependent; that is, if we think that having propositional attitudes but not perceptual states requires the subject of those attitudes to possess certain concepts. This reasoning holds equally well if one thinks that all content is conceptual. In such a case, one is forced to explain the difference between different types of content involving states in terms extrinsic to the nature of their contents; the state-view is one way of explaining this distinction, by appeal to the capacities required of a subject if she is to undergo such states.

An additional reason that the “state” view might be found appealing is that it allows for the commonsensical notion that the contents of perception can be taken at face value to produce beliefs that have the same content. If, on the other hand, one holds that the content of perception is of a fundamentally different kind than that of belief, it is less easy to see how one can respect the intuition that one believes the same thing that one perceives (Byrne 2005, Speaks 2005). Furthermore, it has been argued that perception can play a justificatory role in the production of perceptual beliefs only if belief and perception involve the same kind of content (McDowell 1994a, 2006, Brewer 1999, 2005). This claim has been disputed (e.g., Heck 2000, Peacocke 2001a, Lerman 2010, Cahen 2019. For more on the justificatory role of perception see section 4.1).

The “state” view attempts to make the conceptual/nonconceptual distinction a distinction between types of states, those that are concept-dependent and those that are concept-independent. Bermúdez (2007) argues that such a distinction is implausible when considered independently of the distinction drawn by the “content” view. The difficulty he identifies with the “state” view is that it is unclear what basis there might be for a distinction between concept-dependent and concept-independent state types other than the distinctive contents of these states. That is, the “state” view owes us some account of why some states, such as the propositional attitudes, are concept-dependent, whereas other states, such as perceptual states, are concept-independent. It seems that a natural explanation for why perceptual states, but not propositional attitudes, are concept-independent is that perceptual states differ from propositional attitudes in the type of contents that are involved (which determines, for example, the particular inferential relations in which they can stand). This explanation is not available if we hold that perception and the propositional attitudes have contents of the same type.

It is open to the “state” view theorist to attempt to explain the “state” view distinction in terms of the functional roles of the different state types. She might argue for the distinction by pointing out that the functional role of belief depends on an organism’s conceptual capacities and the functional role of perception does not depend on its conceptual capacities (since, arguably, an organism’s perceptual discriminations can outstrip its conceptual capacities). However, there is a sense in which this would be a mere restatement of the problem rather than a solution to it, since we still need some account of the concept-(in)dependence of these functional roles. Again, an appeal to the different kinds of contents involved in these different states seems to be a straightforward explanation. The “state” view theorist might also attempt to explain the “state” view distinction by appeal to the phenomenological differences between the propositional attitudes and perception. However, this too seems problematic, since it is unclear why the lack of phenomenology should make a belief concept-dependent or why the phenomenology of perception should make it concept-independent (Bermúdez 2007).

In a recent article, Toribio (2008) places further pressure on the plausibility of the state/content distinction. She argues that arguments couched in “state” terms—appealing to the conditions the subject must satisfy in order to undergo states with certain representational contents—do entail conclusions about the contents of those states. The entailment is established by noting the first motivation for the conceptual constraint, mentioned above (section 2), regarding the proper specification of content. When specifying the representational content of some mental state one has to be as faithful as possible to how the creature undergoing that state apprehends the world. Yet, how the creature apprehends the world, she argues, depends on what cognitive capacities it has. Thus, a creature that lacks conceptual capacities cannot be properly attributed states with conceptual contents. Arguments to the effect that perception is state-nonconceptual—that a creature can undergo perceptual states without having the concepts utilized in specifying the content of those states—thus also amount to arguments that the content of those states are nonconceptual. See Van Cleve (2012) and Schmidt (2015) for further arguments supporting the interdependence of the state and content views of nonconceptualism. For responses to these arguments against the state/content distinction, see Duhau (2014)

4. Applying the notion of nonconceptual content

Theorists of nonconceptual content have primarily deployed the notion in the service of three different explanatory projects: (a) the project of characterizing the content of perceptual experience, (b) the project of characterizing the content of subpersonal representational states, and (c) the project of explaining the behavior of certain non-human animals and of pre-conceptual human infants.

4.1 Perceptual experience and nonconceptual content

We can think about the content of perception in conceptual terms. When someone has a visual experience, for example, it will seem to that person as if something is seen. One way of specifying the way things appear to the subject is in terms of the perceptual belief the subject would form on the basis of perception had he taken his perception at face value. Such a way of specifying the representational content of perception gives us the propositional content of perception. Theorists of nonconceptual content have canvassed several types of reasons for thinking that this propositional content does not exhaust the representational content of perception (see the entry on the contents of perception).[6]

First, it has been argued that the contents of perception exhibit certain features that cannot be exhibited by the contents of the propositional attitudes. In particular, perception is capable of representing impossible or contradictory states of affairs, as is the case when viewing certain Escher drawings and when undergoing various perceptual illusions. In contrast, it is argued that conceptual content must be consistent—one cannot have a belief with a contradictory content. Thus, Crane argues that reflecting on the waterfall illusion shows that the contents of perception cannot be conceptual (Crane 1988a). Since one cannot undergo a state with contradictory conceptual contents, and yet the waterfall illusion is a perceptual state with contradictory content—the object perceived seems to be both moving and not moving—it cannot be the case that perception involves conceptual contents (for more on this argument see, e.g., Mellor 1988, Crane 1988b, Crane 1992, and Gunther 2001).

Second, it has been argued that the content of perception is analog in nature, unlike the conceptual content of propositional attitudes which is more plausibly seen as digital. The distinction between analog and digital representations has (for our purposes) been most perspicuously put by Fred Dretske (1981, Ch.6). Let us take a particular fact or state of affairs, say the fact or state of affairs that some object s has property F. A representation carries the information that s is F in digital form if and only if it carries no further information about s other than that it is F (and whatever further facts about it are entailed by the fact that it is F). But whenever a representation carries the information that s is F in analog form it always carries additional information about s. Nonconceptualists argue that, while propositional attitudes represent the world in digital form, perceptual states represent the world in analog form. Beck (2012) argues that analog magnitude states are nonconceptual because they lack the recombinability necessary for concepts (as articulated, for example, in Evans’s Generality Constraint).[7]

Third, it has been suggested that the content of perception is unit-free (Peacocke 1986). If I perceptually represent an object as being a certain distance from me, I do not usually represent that distance in terms of a particular unit (in inches, say, as opposed to centimeters), even though what I represent is a perfectly determinate distance. I simply represent it as being that distance, where the content of my perception specifies the distance. Peacocke (1986, 1989) argues extensively against the possibility of accommodating such unit-free representations in purely propositional terms.

Fourth, nonconceptualists argue that the content of perception is more fine-grained than the content of propositional attitudes. This argument can be traced back to Evans, who asks, rhetorically, “Do we really understand the proposal that we have as many color concepts as there are shades of color that we can sensibly discriminate?” (Evans 1982, p. 229). Arguably, I can perceptually discriminate many more colors and shapes than I currently have concepts for. Although I may be capable of discriminating between two color chips of very similar shades of red, red27 and red29, not being an expert on colors I will not have the concepts red27 and red29. With my limited conceptual repertoire, I will correctly judge both color chips to be red. However, I will so judge on the basis of experiences whose contents are much more specific and fine grained in a way that cannot be captured by my conceptual capacities. (The same is true, mutatis mutandis, of shape concepts.) My ability to perceive and discriminate the determinate shades and shapes that I do outstrips my conceptual capacities. As such, my experiences do not seem to depend on my conceptual repertoire. Thus, in specifying the content of perception, its accuracy conditions, we need not limit ourselves to the concepts available to the subject—hence, perceptual content is nonconceptual (e.g., Peacocke 1992, Heck 2000, Tye 1995, 2006. DeBellis 1995, and Luntley 2003, argue on similar lines for the nonconceptual content of music perception).

Of these, the argument from the fine-grained nature of perception has generated the most discussion. Opponents of the idea that perceptual content might be nonconceptual argue that the fineness of grain of perceptual experience can in fact be accommodated at the conceptual level. John McDowell, for example, suggests that the considerations Evans raises have force only if we limit the types of concepts expected to figure in the content of perception to such general concepts as red27, red29, etc., but, he argues, there is no reason to suppose that the conceptual content of perception needs to be limited in this way. Rather, the conceptual content of perceptual experiences is given by demonstrative concepts, such as that shade (McDowell 1994a).[8] He claims that our conceptual capacities are capable of representing colors with the same fineness of grain with which they are perceptually represented. The information loss in the transition from perception to perceptual belief is not a sign that there are two different types of content in play, but should rather be understood as a transition from a more determinate type of conceptual content (e.g., that is colored thus) to a less determinate type of conceptual content (e.g., that is red).

Several objections have been raised against attempts to account for the contents of perception in terms of demonstrative concepts. First, for a capacity operative in perception to count as a genuine conceptual capacity it must be possible for that same capacity to be employed in thought. As such, it must be the case that such demonstrative concepts as are arguably involved in the content of perception are retained long enough for the possibility of their remobilization—they cannot be reserved only for the particular instance in which the sample is perceived. Although the appearance of the demonstrative concept expressible by the phrase ‘… is colored thus’ can exploit the presence of the red27 color chip and account for the person’s fine-grained experience of the chip, the demonstrative concept’s applicability cannot be limited to the presence of this sample. As McDowell says, the capacity for employing demonstrative concepts in perception is a recognitional capacity (McDowell 1994a p. 57, Brewer 1999 also holds that a conceptual capacity must be available in the absence of the sample to which it was initially applied). Kelly (2001a) calls this constraint ‘the re-identification condition’ on concept possession.

However, the objection goes, it is evident that our capacities for perceptual discrimination far outstrip our capacities for recognition. Regardless of how short the interval between two presentations of a specific shade it is reasonable to suppose that an organism is capable of perceiving the shade in all its fineness of grain without being capable of recognizing it as the shade presented earlier. There simply does not seem to be a dependence between our fine grained perceptual capacities and our memory capacities. But since the recognitional demonstrative concepts the conceptualist appeals to do depend on such memory capacities (according to the re-identification condition), it cannot be the case that our having such demonstrative concepts is necessary for our enjoying fine grained perceptual discriminations. (For discussion of empirical support for the claim that memory is coarser grained than our capacities for perceptual discrimination, see Raffman 1995. See also Kelly 2001a, Peacocke 2001a, 2001b, Tye 2006, Wright 2003, Dokic and Pacherie 2001 for arguments on similar grounds).

One response to this objection would be to revise (Brewer 2005) the re-identification constraint on the possession of demonstrative concepts, or perhaps retract it altogether (Chuard 2006 explores various versions of the re-identification condition and argues that none are necessary for the possession of demonstrative concepts). Kelly (2001a), and Dokic and Pacherie (2001), however, argue that the re-identification condition is essential to concept possession.

Two potential challenges to the appeal to demonstrative concepts have been highlighted. The first can be termed the priority argument. It holds that we cannot take demonstrative concepts as explanatorily basic. The demonstrative concepts I possess are a function of my demonstrative capacities and part of what explains my having a given demonstrative capacity is my having certain associated experiences; the experience must be prior to the possession of the demonstrative concept if the former is to explain the latter (Heck 2000). Various formulations of this argument have been developed (see Ayers 2002, Hopp 2009, Roskies 2008, 2010, and Levine 2010). For example, Levine (2010) argues that “[w]hen you see a color and think ‘that color’, the seeing is prior to the demonstrating, or else you really don’t know what you’re demonstrating… But if the seeing, the perceptual experience, is prior to the demonstrating, then the demonstrating can’t be what captures, or brings into existence, the content of that experience” (p. 191). Brewer has provided a response to this kind of objection, following a suggestion rejected by Heck (2000), on the grounds that the form of explanation that we should look for is not a causal explanation, which would indeed require the priority of the experience, but a constitutive one. Thus he says that “On the conceptualist view, experience of a colour sample, R, just is a matter of entertaining a content in which the demonstrative concept ‘thatR shade’ figures as a constituent” (Brewer 2005, p. 221, see also Brewer 2002).

A second challenge comes from the so-called argument from non-veridical experience (Heck 2000). Suppose that a subject has a non-veridical experience as of a shade of color that does not exist in nature and that has never previous appeared in her experience. Then the subject cannot have an appropriate demonstrative concept, as there is nothing to fix the reference of that concept. For a response to this argument see Bengson, Grube, and Korman 2011.

Recently, Settegast (2023) has suggested a novel response to the fineness of grain challenge and a defense of McDowell’s demonstrative strategy. Underlying his reply is a hylomorphic interpretation of McDowell’s conceptualism, according to which perception and thought are distinguished not in terms of their contents, but in terms of their ‘mode of givenness.’ While in thought and judgment Fregean senses are presented to the subject linguistically, in experience, it is the sensory character of experience that serves as the carrier of the same Fregean senses.

Before moving to other arguments that have been advanced on behalf of nonconceptualism it is worth remarking that the conceptualist appeal to demonstrative concepts in response to the fineness of grain argument is a response to a challenge to their position, rather than an argument for conceptualism. The point of the fineness of grain argument is to put pressure on the possibility of a subject possessing all the concepts required for a correct specification of the contents of perception. If the subject cannot have these concepts and yet is capable of undergoing the perception, then it follows that the content of perception is nonconceptual. However, showing that the subject does have these concepts is not yet an argument for the conceptualist position. For the conceptualist claim to follow, they must show not that the content of perception is in fact conceptualizable by the subject undergoing the experience in all of its fine grain, as the availability of demonstrative concepts suggests, but rather that the subject cannot undergo the experience without possessing these concepts. Thus even if the conceptualists manage to show that subjects do possess all the concepts involved in the correct specification of the content of perception, it still does not show that the content of perception is conceptual, it only undercuts the motivation the nonconceptualist can obtain from the fineness of grain argument (Coliva 2003, Bermúdez 2007).

A fifth argument, related to the priority argument against the appeal to demonstrative concepts above, pertains to the possibility of concept acquisition or learning. Presumably what explains our coming to possess the observational concepts that we do is our undergoing appropriately related perceptual experiences (see, e.g., Peacocke 1992, 2001a, Ayers 2004). If this is so, it cannot be the case, on pain of circularity, that undergoing a particular perceptual experience depends on possessing the very concepts the acquisition of which the experience explain. Roskies (2008) argues that if we reject the claim that perception with nonconceptual content plays an essential role in concept acquisition, we cannot account for our acquisition of observational concepts without being committed to an unacceptable form of nativism. (See also Forman 2006 for a different argument purporting to show the necessity of perception with nonconceptual content to concept learning.)

A sixth argument for the nonconceptual content of perception derives from Kelly (2001b). He argues that the central reason perception must be nonconceptual is that the experience of a property depends on the situation in which it is perceived and depends on the object which it characterizes in a way that demonstrative concepts do not. An example of the first sort of dependency is given by the phenomenon of color constancy. In this case we can see two samples of the same color property illuminated differently (e.g., when looking at a wall that is partially exposed to the sun) and experience both to be of the same color but because of the different illumination we experience them differently (one is better illuminated than the other). The problem is that since the color is the same regardless of the illumination, demonstrative concepts such as that color cannot be sufficient to capture the experiential difference between the differently illuminated samples; though the experiences differ, the contribution of the demonstrative concept that color to the content of the experience is the same, given that the property perceived, that color in both demonstrations, is the same. Demonstrative concepts, Kelly argues, refer to situation independent features of the world (e.g., the actual color of the wall) and thus are not capable of capturing the situation dependence of perceptual content. The argument from the situation dependence of perceptual content has been subject to several criticisms on behalf of the conceptualist. One such criticism (Peacocke 2001b) is that, contrary to Kelly, it seems reasonable that the difference in experience can be captured by concepts regarding the illumination of the different samples (see also Ablondi 2002).

Finally, there is the argument from infant/animal cognition, which Peacocke now considers the most important motivation for thinking that perception has nonconceptual content (Peacocke 2001a, 2001b, referring to Evans 1982, Dretske 1995, Bermúdez 1994, 1998). Considerations of phylogenetic and ontogenetic continuities in nature suggest that animals and infants can have experiences very similar to our own. They too perceptually represent the brown tree amidst the lush green grass. However, since they lack concepts appropriate for a correct specification of the contents of their perception, their perceptual representation of this state of affairs must be nonconceptual. If we share these perceptual capacities with such animals and human infants then it is reasonable to suggest that the content of our experiences is also, at least in part, nonconceptual (see also Schellenberg 2013, 2018). Of course, it may be the case that our experience is richer than that of animals and that we are capable of many more perceptual discriminations than they are capable of, but to the extent that we share our perceptual representations with such animals, the content of our perceptual representations should be equally nonconceptual. (See more on this in section 4.3)

A crucial aspect of the debate is whether theorists of nonconceptual content can account for the rational role of perceptual states in belief formation. Although much of the discussion of whether perceptual content can be nonconceptual has focused on precisely how the manifest differences between perceptions and beliefs should be described (see, e.g., Kelly 2001b, Sedivy 1996, 2006), the important issue is whether those differences can be captured at the level of content in a way that explains how perceptions can justify beliefs. McDowell’s central claim is that there can be appropriate rational relations between perceptions and beliefs only if perceptions have conceptual contents, on the grounds that such rational relations can hold only between conceptual states (McDowell 1994a, 2006). Byrne (2020) relies on similar reasoning in arguing that perception must be conceptual. This is a powerful challenge to defenders of nonconceptual content. It is far from clear, however, that they do not have the resources to meet it. This is an issue that has been much discussed in the philosophy of perception (most recently in Lerman 2010 and Cahen 2019).

Millar (1991), for example, offers a sophisticated account of how the representational content of perceptions can justify beliefs formed on the basis of those perceptions, even though the relevant contents are not conceptually individuated. One obvious strategy for the defender of nonconceptual content would be to argue that a nonconceptual content can stand in logical or evidential relations (such as the relation of being consistent with, or making more probable) to another state even though it is not conceptually articulated (see, e.g., Heck 2000, Vision 2009). Alternatively, a nonconceptualist, following Raleigh (2007), might push back against the thesis that justification has to be inferential in nature. One way of developing that strategy is proposed by Peacocke (2001a, 2004a, 2004b) who argues that the rational role of a nonconceptual way of representing some X is guaranteed when the observational concept X is partially individuated by its relation to such a way of nonconceptually representing X. So, a subject may rationally judge that is a square when taking her experience at face value not only because her perception involves a nonconceptual way of representing a square but for that reason, since such a nonconceptual way of representing squares is part of the individuation conditions of the concept square. Furthermore, the subject is capable of reflecting on her reasons for so judging by asking herself whether the way things (nonconceptually) look to her is reason for her to make the judgment that she does. Brewer (2005) argues against such proposals on the grounds that they do not manage to account for the subject’s appreciation of her perception as a reason for a given judgment without being committed to a form of foundationalism with its various difficulties. If, however, perception does involve conceptual content, then according to Brewer, we can account for the subject’s appreciation of her perception as a reason for a given judgment straightforwardly, since the subject’s having a perception with conceptual content already requires that she grasps the rational relations perception with such a content stands to other states with conceptual contents.

Advocates of the state/content distinction, discussed in section 3, point out that although arguments for the nonconceptual nature of perception are typically aimed at articulating the nature of the contents of perception, that is, whether perception is content-nonconceptual or content-conceptual, the premises of these arguments seem to support at most a “state” conclusion (Byrne 2003, 2005, Speaks 2005, Crowther 2006, Heck 2007). For example, the argument from the fine grained nature of experience generally begins by arguing that one need not have the concepts involved in the correct specification of the content of perception in order to undergo a perception with that content, e.g., one need not have the concept red27 in order to have a perception correctly specifiable in terms of such a concept. But though this is merely reason to hold that perception is state-nonconceptual, the conclusion drawn from such an observation is that the content of perception is nonconceptual. (Heck 2007 also points this fault in the standard forms of the fineness of grain argument and proceeds to develop a form of the argument which he thinks avoids this problem and is genuinely directed at the “content” view.) However, if the distinction between concept-dependent and concept-independent state types ultimately rests on a distinction between the types of content involved in these states, as suggested in section 3, then the transition from state-nonconceptualism to content-nonconceptualism (and from state-conceptualism to content-conceptualism) is a legitimate one. We would, then, have good reason to consider the arguments above as directly relevant to the nonconceptual content of perception even though they often proceed via claims about the capacities required of a creature for having perceptual states.

4.2 Subpersonal computational states and nonconceptual content

The dominant paradigm within cognitive science involves postulating representational states at the subpersonal or subdoxastic levels (for philosophical discussion see Stich 1978, Davies 1989). Examples are the representational states implicated in tacit knowledge of the rules of syntax. It is a fundamental tenet of a broadly Chomskyan approach to syntax that speakers are credited with tacit knowledge of a grammar for their language and that this tacit knowledge is deployed in understanding spoken language. Yet when linguists give theoretical specifications of the syntactic rules contained within the grammar they frequently employ concepts that are not in the conceptual repertoire of the language-user. That is, the language-user is ascribed knowledge of rules formulated in terms of concepts that he does not possess. A similar point holds for the representational states postulated in computational theories of vision such as that put forward by Marr (1980). The contents of such states are formulated in terms of concepts (such as the concept of a zero-crossing) that are clearly not possessed by the average perceiver.

Why should it be thought that the language-user does not possess the relevant concepts? How could he grasp the rule if he did not possess the concepts required to spell it out? The point is not just that language-users are not aware of the beliefs in question. Not all unconscious mental states are nonconceptual, e.g., my having the belief that the earth revolves around the sun, often unconsciously, requires that I possess the concepts of which its content is composed. The point, rather, is that their representations of the linguistic rules are inferentially insulated from the rest of their beliefs and propositional attitudes, in a way that is fundamentally incompatible with the holistic nature of conceptual contents. This is also the case for representations at the early stages of visual processing. The representations whose function is to register zero-crossings for subsequent perceptual analysis, for example, operate independently of the person’s propositional attitudes, and so their content does not depend on the person’s conceptual repertoire.

Recently such a view of the nature of representational content has been explored by Raftopoulos and Müller (2006). They suggest that what makes the content of a representation nonconceptual is precisely the fact that its content is insulated from other knowledge structures available to the person. Indeed, according to Raftopoulos and Müller, “the existence of cognitively impenetrable mechanisms is a necessary and sufficient condition for nonconceptual content” (Raftopoulos and Müller 2006, p. 190). They review evidence to the effect that various early stages of visual processing, e.g., those responsible for attending to, and tracking, objects in space and time, operate in purely bottom-up fashion. As such, they argue, the representations underlying such capacities are produced in a conceptually unmediated way and hence their content is nonconceptual. Thus, they say, “[t]he content of the states of zero-crossings is nonconceptual … because that content is retrieved bottom-up from a visual scene. To justify the nonconceptual character of the contents of either phenomenal and subdoxastic stages [sic] … it suffices to invoke the fact that these contents are retrieved from visual scenes in conceptually unmediated ways” (Raftopoulos and Müller 2006, p. 215).

However, though Raftopoulos and Müller attempt to argue that insulation from the propositional attitudes of the person is a necessary and sufficient condition for any representation to have nonconceptual content, this does not seem to be the case with representations in general and certain personal level representations in particular. At least with regards to personal level representations, Tye (1995) argues that one’s conceptual capacities often are involved in determining the content of a perceptual representation, and yet that the content of that representation is nonconceptual. This is the case, for example, in the process of perceptually disambiguating an ambiguous figure (e.g., the two faces/vase figure). Though the production of a disambiguated perceptual representation (e.g., experiencing the figure as a vase) might involve more than merely information recovered bottom-up (e.g., it might employ the concept vase), it does not follow that the resulting perception is conceptual. This is so since for the content of a representation to be nonconceptual it merely needs to be the case that one can undergo a state with such representational content without possessing the concepts that enter into a correct specification of its content, and it seems reasonable that one can undergo the same disambiguated experience of the figure without possessing any concepts (and in particular, without possessing the concept vase).

A similar suggestion concerning cognitive penetrability and its potential impact on the nonconceptual status of the penetrated states is explored by Macpherson (2012, 2015). One of her favorite examples comes from Delk & Fillenbaum (1965), who demonstrate that familiarity with exemplars of a standardly colored category, e.g., familiarity with (red) apples or (yellow) bananas, influences the perceived color of instances of that category. In a more recent study, Hansen et al. (2006) obtained the same effect by presenting subjects with a picture of a banana on a uniform grey background and asking them to adjust the color of the fruit until it appears grey. Their results show that “…subjects adjusted the banana to a slightly bluish hue--its opponent color--in order for it to appear neutral gray. At the point where the banana was actually achromatic, at the origin of the color space, it still appeared yellowish.” (p. 1367) In this case, it appears that one’s knowledge of bananas ‘penetrates’ one’s experience of bananas. She calls this form of cognitive penetration, cognitive penetration ‘lite’, where possession of some concepts may causally influence the type of experience one undergoes. Yet she argues that in these cases, though the token-experience of the banana’s color is influenced by one’s prior knowledge – one undergoes a deeper yellow type of experience – it is an experience-type that one who does not have concepts pertaining to such colors can nonetheless undergo.

Thus, it is consistent with the notion of nonconceptual content that the representation in question is in fact produced in what Raftopoulos and Müller would call a conceptually mediated way, whereby concepts in the subject’s possession influence the content of a personal level representation, without the content of the representation being specifiable in terms of concepts available to the subject. That is, it does not seem to be a necessary condition on the nonconceptual content of representations in general that they be insulated from the propositional attitudes; at least in the case of personal level representations this necessity condition fails. Furthermore, Toribio (2014) argues that even in the case of early vision, the specific target of Raftopoulos and Müller (2006), the claim that cognitive impenetrability is a necessary and sufficient condition on the contents of early vision being nonconceptual is false. (However, see Raftopoulos 2014a, 2014b, 2017 for possible replies.)

Still, it is open to a critic of nonconceptual content to deny that ascriptions of content at the subpersonal level should be taken literally. John McDowell takes this view (McDowell 1994b), suggesting that subpersonal content is merely “as if” content (an argument for the same conclusion is offered in Searle 1990). Alternatively, it might be argued (as in Connolly 2010) that the subpersonal information processing actually involves concepts. However, these lines of argument fly in the face not just of the practice of cognitive scientists, but also of some important philosophical analyses of the notion of subpersonal representation (Burge 1986, Egan 1992, Bermúdez 1995).

4.3 Psychological explanation

In explaining the behavior of nonlinguistic and prelinguistic creatures cognitive ethologists and developmental psychologists often appeal to representational states. Spelke, for example, attempts to explain the development of the ability to perceptually organize the visual array into unitary, persisting objects by appeal to an infant’s capacity to form a representation of the visual surface layout and the presence of mechanisms following basic principles of cohesion, boundedness, rigidity, and no action at a distance (Spelke 1990). These capacities are claimed to explain the infant’s rudimentary physical reasoning, underlying, for example, its ability to track the motion of particular objects and exhibit certain expectancy responses regarding the persistence of objects behind occlusions (as exhibited, for example, in Baillargeon’s (1987) famous drawbridge experiment, in which an infant is habituated to see a screen rotate 180°, and is dishabituated when the screen ‘passes through’ an object placed behind it. The dishabituation reflects the infant’s expectation that the screen’s rotation will be blocked by the occluded object). Such research suggests that an explanation of the infant’s behavior should appeal to the way the infant is perceptually aware of the world, as segmented into objects that exhibit certain predictable regularities.

According to Spelke (1988), the content of those representations appealed to in explaining the infant’s responses in tasks as those mentioned above is conceptual content. The manifest behavior reflects the infant’s incipient object concept and its capacity to utilize this concept in a primitive form of physical reasoning. However, if one has an account of what it is to possess a concept that makes it inappropriate to attribute mastery of the corresponding concept to the creature whose behavior is being explained, then the appeal to representations in the explanation of its behavior is also motivation for the notion of nonconceptual representational content.

One such understanding stresses the relation between possessing concepts and being able to justify certain canonical judgments involving that concept, going on to argue that providing justifications is a paradigmatically linguistic activity—a matter of identifying and articulating the reasons for a given classification, inference or judgment (McDowell 1994a). If this is the case, then nonlinguistic and prelinguistic creatures will not be able to possess concepts and those representations we attribute to them in explaining their behavior will have to be nonconceptual. However, there is a variety of possible responses to this argument. It might be objected, for example, that possessing a given concept simply requires being able to make de facto justified judgments involving that concept rather than being able to justify judgments involving that concept. Or it might be objected that the ability to justify judgments involving some concept is not necessarily linguistic, since it is possible to identify the justification for a judgment without engaging in communication.

However, the argument from the need to provide psychological explanations of the behavior of nonhuman animals and human infants to the existence of nonconceptual content does not stand or fall with the thesis that concepts are necessarily linguistic. It has been argued that there is a distinction between two different types of thinking (Mithen 1996). Many students of the type of cognition engaged in by animals and infants view it as being domain-specific and modular in important respects, best understood in terms of bodies of “knowledge” closely focused on particular aspects of the natural and social worlds. An example of such domain-specificity is found in the perceptual module Spelke suggests is responsible for the segmentation of the visual array into objects according to certain basic physical principles (Spelke 1990, 1994, Carey and Spelke 1996). These domain-specific modules are thought to have evolved separately and for specific purposes and are not integrated with each other (Hirschfeld and Gelman 1994). In contrast, many philosophers have suggested that the type of conceptual thought engaged in by language-users is essentially domain-general, systematic and productive. Concept-possessors can generate an indefinite number of new thoughts from the concepts they possess and their thoughts obey what Evans (1982) has termed the generality constraint. As Evans says, “We cannot avoid thinking of a thought about an individual object x, to the effect that it is F, as the exercise of two separable capacities; one being the capacity to think of x, which could be equally exercised in thoughts about x to the effect that it is G or H; and the other being a conception of what it is to be F, which could be equally exercised in thoughts about other individuals, to the effect that they are F” (Evans 1982, p. 75).

If the generality constraint is taken to be an essential characteristic of conceptual thought (as it is by Evans 1982, Peacocke 1992, and Heck 2007, for example) then it seems to follow that many (if not all) non-linguistic creatures are not capable of engaging in conceptual thought. For illustration we can look again at infants’ object perception. Though the infant is capable of representing its environment in a particular way that explains its expectations regarding object motion and object persistence, the fact that such representations are domain-specific suggests that this characteristic of conceptual thought is violated. In particular, the domain-specificity of this type of cognition makes it the case that capacities operative in constructing object representations are not ones that can be engaged generally in contexts falling beyond the domain of operation of the module. Thus, we have a violation of the generality constraint with respect to these representations. This suggests that the kinds of capacities that are involved in the infant’s representation of the environment are not conceptual. So, if they are correctly described as representing the world at all, their representations must be nonconceptual. See also the discussion of analog magnitude representations in Beck (2012).

Of course, the plausibility of this way of motivating the notion of nonconceptual content is a hostage to fortune in two important senses, one empirical and one philosophical. The argument rests upon an empirical claim about the appropriate way to explain the behavior of non-linguistic and pre-linguistic creatures—and in particular upon the assumption that it will not turn out to be possible to explain such behavior in non-psychological terms. But the argument also depends upon the thesis that the domain of behavior explicable in psychological terms extends further than the domain of concept possession—and this in turn depends upon a substantive philosophical account of what it is to possess a concept. If, for example, possessing the concept of an F simply requires being able to discriminate Fs from the rest of the perceptual environment and/or to act on them in a suitable manner, then it is hard to see how any evidence that animals and young infants represent the world will not also be evidence that they represent the world conceptually.

5. Specifying nonconceptual content

We have so far been talking about nonconceptual content in very general terms. If the notion of nonconceptual content is to be useful, however, we need to have a substantive account of what nonconceptual content consists in and how it is to be ascribed—an account that will be the equivalent at the nonconceptual level of, for example, the Fregean account of concepts and concept possession.

Theories of nonconceptual content can be either global accounts or local accounts of content. To say that they are global accounts is just to say that they purport to be accounts of content tout court, rather than specifications of content circumscribed to a particular representational domain (such as the three domains mentioned in the section above). What is central to global accounts of nonconceptual content is that they deny that even the paradigmatically conceptual propositional attitudes ever involve conceptual contents. As a result, such accounts of content are particularly amenable to proponents of the “state” view of the nonconceptual debate (discussed above, section 3). If all content is nonconceptual, the nonconceptual debate can only be meaningfully carried out at the level of state types, not at the level of content. Furthermore, since these accounts of nonconceptual content are fundamentally non-contrastive, they are of limited use in formulating the debate about nonconceptual content. As a result, in what follows we will be more interested in local accounts of nonconceptual content. However, before attending to the various local specifications of nonconceptual content we will briefly discuss two popular global accounts of nonconceptual content—possible world semantics and Russellian semantics (as we shall see, in discussing Tye’s account of the content of perception, these global views can be modified so as to apply only locally).

The first global account of nonconceptual content, which was already mentioned above, is possible world semantics (see, e.g., Stalnaker 1984, 1998, Lewis 1979, 1986). According to proponents of this view, the content of a mental representation consists of a proposition, where propositions are taken to be functions from possible worlds to truth values, or alternatively the set of possible worlds in which the proposition is true. Beliefs and other propositional attitudes are then attitudes a person might hold towards such sets of possible worlds. For example, if one believes that Norman shot Susan, one has the belief attitude towards those possible worlds in which Norman actually did shoot Susan. This is merely to say that one takes the actual world to be a member of the set of possible worlds in which the proposition is true. Similarly, having a perception is having a representational state the content of which is the set of possible worlds in which the perception is correct.

The second global account of nonconceptual content is the Russellian account. Proponents of this view also hold that the content of a mental representation should be understood as a proposition. However, they follow Russell, broadly, in arguing that propositions are ordered n-tuples of objects and properties. Propositional attitudes are then relations between a person and an ordered n-tuple that is the proposition that is the content of the attitude. For example, to have the belief that Norman shot Susan is to stand in the belief relation towards the proposition <<Norman, Susan>, being shot by>. (Theories falling under this heading differ greatly; as representatives, see Salmon 1986, Soames 1987, Perry 1979, 1980, and other various articles in the collection edited by Salmon and Soames 1988.) Similarly, the contents of a perceptual representation are just the objects that are represented and the properties that appear to characterize them. To perceive a blue carpet is to have a representational state the content of which is the carpet and the property blueness, that is, <carpet, blueness>. (Some Russellians, e.g., Tye 1995, 2000, 2005, hold that only the properties things appear to have constitute the content of perception.)

Both possible world semantics and Russellian accounts of content are considered to be coarse grained accounts of content (in contrast to the Fregean fine grained account of content). For example, it seems to follow from the possible worlds account that a thinker who entertains the thought expressed by the sentences ‘bachelors are unmarried men’ and ‘unmarried men are unmarried men’ is related in both cases to the same set of possible worlds, and hence is having thoughts with the same content. Similarly regarding the Russellian account of content. A thinker who entertains the thought expressed by the sentences ‘Jocasta is beautiful’ and ‘Oedipus’ mother is beautiful’ is related in both cases to the same objects and properties (since Jocasta just is Oedipus’ mother), and hence is having thoughts with the same content. Some have argued that this implication and other related ones are detrimental to any coarse-grained account of content, in particular when applied to the propositional attitudes. We will not review these arguments here, since they are elaborated elsewhere. (For more detailed discussion of these global accounts of content, see the entries on structured propositions, propositional attitude reports, and belief.)

Turning now to the local accounts of nonconceptual content, we can expect that a substantive account of nonconceptual content will be tailored to a specific explanatory task—and each of the three motivations discussed in the previous section for introducing the notion will lend itself to a different such account.

The most developed proposal has come from Christopher Peacocke who has proposed a radically externalist conception of nonconceptual content aimed explicitly at explaining the nonconceptual content of perceptual states (Peacocke 1992). Peacocke suggests that a given perceptual content should be specified in terms of the ways of filling out the space around the perceiver that are consistent with the content’s being correct. For each minimally discriminable point within the perceiver’s perceptual field (where these are identified relative to an origin and axes centered in the perceiver’s body) we need to start by specifying whether it is occupied by a surface and, if so, what the orientation, solidity, hue, brightness and saturation of that surface are. This specification gives us the way the perceiver represents the environment. The content of that representation is given by all the ways of filling out the space around the perceiver in which the minimally discriminable points have the appropriate values. The representation is correct just if the space around the perceiver is occupied in one of those ways. Peacocke calls this type of nonconceptual content positioned scenario content.

However, such a specification of the content of perception does not completely capture the way the world perceptually appears to us. Two representations may have the same positioned scenario contents and yet differ in the way they represent the world to us as being. As an example, upon looking at a 45° tilted square one might perceive it as a tilted square or as an upright diamond. In both cases of perceiving the square as a square and as a diamond the positioned scenario content is the same; that is, in both cases the ways of filling out the space around the observer that are consistent with the correctness of the scenario content are the same. However, there is still a phenomenal difference between these two ways of representing the square.

To account for this difference in the way in which the same object is perceptually represented Peacocke argues that there is an additional layer of nonconceptual content that he calls proto-propositional content, which involves objects, properties, and relations rather than concepts (Peacocke 1992). This level of content accounts for the way in which the square is perceived. When it is perceived as a square one perceives a symmetry about the bisectors of the sides, and when it is perceived as a diamond one perceives a symmetry about the bisectors of its angles. The content is nonconceptual since the observer need not have the concepts of symmetry, or angle, or side, that are mentioned in specifying the content of his perception.

This proposal provides an attractive way of capturing the distinctive features of the phenomenology of perception highlighted in the previous section (see 4.1 above). Peacocke’s account of nonconceptual content is analog, unit-free and possesses the appropriate fineness of grain. Nonetheless, as Cahen (2019) has recently argued, such an externalist account of nonconceptual content, though it may capture the phenomenology of perception, is in tension with internalist commitments pertaining to the rational role of perception. Another source of difficulty is that it is not so clear how such an account can be applied beyond the domain of perception. It may well be that certain subpersonal states have such nonconceptual contents—those associated with the subpersonal underpinnings of vision are obvious candidates. But the representational states implicated in tacit knowledge of syntactic theory, for example, do not fit this model.

Tye suggests a different notion of robustly nonconceptual content of perception (Tye 2005). According to Tye, perception involves Russellian nonconceptual content. This is supposedly in conflict with Peacocke who, in discussing the experience of perceiving the tilted square, claims at one point that “We must, in describing the fine-grained phenomenology, make use of the notion of the way in which some property or relation is given in the experience” (Peacocke 2001a, p. 240). Appealing to a way in which the property of being a square is perceived is in conflict with Tye’s coarse-grained account of the content of perception which is required for his broader representationalist account of conscious perception (see the entry on the contents of perception (section 7) and the entry on representational theories of consciousness). Thus, Tye proposes that in perceiving the tilted square, perception doesn’t represent the property of being a square in two possible ways, but rather that in addition to representing the property of being square it represents various other properties; which additional properties are represented will determine the way the square appears. One suggestion is that when the figure is perceived as a square, the property of being tilted is represented, and when it is perceived as a diamond the property of being upright is represented. These are represented properties of the object, not ways in which the property, being square, is represented.

Some theorists concerned with nonconceptual content at the subpersonal level have favored a broadly teleological account of what this content consists in (drawing upon the teleological theory of content developed in Millikan 1984). This approach can be extended to cover content-bearing states such as those implicated in linguistic understanding (see the entry on teleological theories of mental content). The key notion here is the proper function of, for example, the mechanisms underlying a particular stage in visual information processing (construed normatively in terms of what those mechanisms should do, and usually underwritten by evolutionary considerations). Proper functions are relational, where this means that they are defined in relation to features of the environment. According to teleological theories, content can be specified in terms of relational proper functions. So, for example, the content of a state in early visual processing might be specified in terms of the edges in the perceived environment that that stage has evolved to identify. Given the particular features that a processing mechanism has been ‘designed’ or ‘selected’ to detect, it is functioning correctly when it responds appropriately to the presence of those features, and incorrectly when it responds in their absence (for example, to a sudden contrast in light intensity not due to the presence of an edge). Correctness conditions are fixed with reference to evolutionary design and past performance.

Turning to the third motivation for the notion of nonconceptual content, one might expect the notion of nonconceptual content involved in psychological explanation to be essentially perceptual. Some authors have argued, for example, that the representational states of non-linguistic creatures are essentially perceptual and tied to the creature’s possibilities for action and reaction in the immediate environment (see, for example, Dummett 1993 and Campbell 1994, although neither of these two authors puts the point in terms of nonconceptual content). This thought might be developed in conjunction with an ability-based understanding of nonconceptual content along the lines proposed by Adrian Cussins (Cussins 1990). The central feature of Cussins’s account of experiential content is that it should be understood not in terms of notions such as truth and truth-conditions, but rather in terms of the organism’s abilities to act upon the perceived environment. What the organism perceives (the content of its perception) is a distal environment structured in terms of the possibilities it affords for action. This conception of an ability-based conception of content yields a sharp distinction between the success-governed level of proto-thoughts and the truth-governed level of full-fledged thought. Proto-thought does not involve experience of an objective world.

Other authors concerned with explaining the behavior of non-linguistic and pre-linguistic creatures have proposed applying a richer notion of nonconceptual content that is not essentially pragmatic and that can be deployed in a style of explanation analogous to propositional attitude explanation. Nonconceptual contents in this richer sense are properly assessable for truth or falsity (rather than simply pragmatic success or failure) and can serve as the objects of beliefs and desires (or proto-beliefs and proto-desires). Bermúdez (1998) offers an account along these lines developing certain aspects of Peacocke’s scenario content. In later work he extended this approach to the ascription of thoughts to non-linguistic and prelinguistic creatures, developing a model based on a version of success semantics and integrating what he termed proto-logical inferential capacities (Bermúdez 2003).

6. The autonomy of nonconceptual content

One question that arises when thinking about nonconceptual content is whether a thinker can be in states with nonconceptual content despite not possessing any concepts at all. That is, can nonconceptual content be completely autonomous of conceptual content? The possibility of an affirmative answer to this question is important for many theorists who wish to employ the notion of nonconceptual content to explain the behavior of nonlinguistic and prelinguistic creatures (depending, of course, on how demanding their notion of a concept is). Similarly for those theorists who hold both that subpersonal computational states possess nonconceptual content and that the relevant modules can exist in creatures not capable of any conceptual thought.

However, Christopher Peacocke offers an argument against the autonomy thesis; concluding that “… nonconceptual content is not a level whose nature is completely explicable without reference to conceptual contents … At the most basic level, conceptual and nonconceptual content must be elucidated simultaneously” (Peacocke 1992, pp. 90–91). His argument is based on a neo-Kantian understanding of the relation between experience of an objective world and self-consciousness. In essence he suggests that no creature can properly be attributed states with genuine spatial contents unless it grasps the distal environment in a minimally objective way. A condition on grasping the distal environment in this way is that the organism is capable of utilizing such states in forming and updating an integrated representation of the layout of its environment and is thus able to reidentify particular locations within it. The requirement of concept possession comes in because these capacities essentially involve an ability to represent both the spatial configuration of the environment and one’s own changing position within that environment—and, he suggests, this would be impossible for a creature lacking a rudimentary concept of the first-person.

This argument is powerful, but can be challenged. Supporters of the autonomy thesis, beginning with Bermúdez (1994), have suggested that the interrelated capacities to represent the spatial configuration of the environment and to represent one’s own location within the environment need not depend on the possession of a primitive first-person concept. Rather, these capacities can be understood at the nonconceptual level. In particular, Bermúdez (1995, 1998) appeals to the notion of a nonconceptual point of view to explain the interdependence of spatial awareness of the distal environment and awareness of one’s own location within that environment at the nonconceptual level. For further discussion of this type of nonconceptual self-consciousness see section 7.

Peacocke himself eventually accepted the Autonomy Thesis on the grounds that the capacities mentioned in the conditions for a state to have genuine objective spatial content do not necessitate a conceptual notion of the first-person; indeed, he agrees with Bermúdez that these capacities can be accounted for nonconceptually and without involving any first-person notion (Peacocke 2002).

7. Nonconceptual content: Problems, prospects, and applications

It should be clear from the preceding sections that the basic idea of nonconceptual content provides a promising tool for tackling a range of problems in the philosophy of mind and cognition. Allowing that a creature’s representational capacities can outstrip its conceptual capacities makes it possible for philosophers and cognitive scientists to study aspects of cognition and behavior that remain outside the scope of more traditional approaches—from subpersonal computational mechanisms to the psychological states of non-human animals and human infants to the nature of perceptual experience.

It should be recognized, however, that there may well not be a unitary notion of nonconceptual content applicable to these various domains. We need to distinguish between the formal notion of nonconceptual content (the idea of a way of representing the world that is not constrained by conceptual capacities) and the different concrete proposals for developing this basic idea (such as Peacocke’s notion of scenario content). There is potential for serious confusion if it is assumed that a specific theory of nonconceptual content proposed for one area can be unproblematically applied to another area. It may well turn out, for example, that fundamentally different notions of nonconceptual content are required for subpersonal computational states and perceptual experiences.

Indeed, recent work on nonconceptual content has expanded beyond its origins in visual perception to other modalities and even beyond perception. Thus, Young (2015, 2020), drawing on a broad empirical literature, argues that olfactive representations, unlike conceptual representations, are not concatenatively compositional. As such they are best understood as representational but nonconceptual. Others have moved beyond perception and have argued for a nonconceptual account of the contents of emotions (see e.g., Gunther 2003, Tye 2008, Döring 2009, Wringe 2015, Tappolet 2016 and 2022; for recent arguments to the contrary, see, e.g., Slaby 2020, Demmerling 2020) and possibly other affective-evaluative experiences (Mitchell 2018). Beck (2012) has argued that certain cognitive states with analog magnitude content (primitive representations of spatial, temporal, numerical, and other magnitudes) are best understood as nonconceptual, as they do not satisfy Evans’ Generality Constraint, discussed above (but see replies by Gillett 2014, Grey 2014, and Beck’s further replies in his 2014). Mental imagery provides another interesting phenomenon to which, due to its quasi-perceptual nature, the notion of nonconceptual content seems readily applicable (however, see Arcangeli 2020 for an argument to the effect that imagination, unlike perception, is importantly concept-dependent).

While the philosophy of perception has been the area where the conceptual/nonconceptual distinction has been most discussed, the theory of nonconceptual content has been fruitfully employed in other areas of philosophy. A case in point is the study of self-consciousness (see the entry on self-consciousness). In 1998 two books independently developed theories of nonconceptual self-consciousness (Hurley 1998 and Bermúdez 1998). Bermúdez and Hurley both emphasized prelinguistic forms of self-consciousness, arguing that linguistic self-reference and associated modes of conceptual self-consciousness both emerge from, and need to understood in terms of, much more primitive forms of self-specifying information. For Bermúdez these include:

  • information in visual and other exteroceptive perceptual modalities specifying the perceiver’s own spatial and kinematic properties
  • information via affordances that specify the perceiver’s capacities for acting upon the distal environment
  • information through somatic proprioception, kinesthesia, and active touch about both the disposition of body parts and the limits of the bodily self.
  • self-locating information about the subject’s changing location in objective space exploited in navigation involving cognitive maps

Several of these forms of nonconceptual self-consciousness have been discussed more recently by Kristina Musholt (2013, 2015), who argues that though such forms of awareness provide necessarily self-specifying information, they should not properly be considered modes of self-conscious, as they contain no explicitly self-referring component. Rather than thinking of the self as being part of the (explicit) representational contents of perception and proprioception, she argues it should be thought of as being implicit in the mode of presentation (Musholt 2015).

Christopher Peacocke’s recent work on consciousness and self-consciousness identifies what he terms a “nonconceptual parent” of the first-person concept (Peacocke 2014). What he calls Degree 1 of subject involvement “is exhibited by a subject who enjoys states with nonconceptual content that is objective, and which represents the subject as standing in spatial relations to other objects and events in the spatial world” (2014, p. 35). Like Bermúdez and Hurley, Peacocke sees Gibson’s analysis of vision as illuminating a basic form of nonconceptual self-consciousness. Unlike them, however, he does not think that nonconceptually self-conscious subjects are necessarily embodied.

Primitive, nonconceptual, forms of self-consciousness are also critical for the acquisition of the first-person concept and for grounding thoughts whose contents have an important property introduced in Shoemaker (1968). This is the property of being immune to error through misidentification relative to the first-person concept, defined so that properties attributed in such thoughts must be properties of the thinker, if they are instantiated at all. Cahen and Musholt (2017) argue that it is precisely because certain representational states with nonconceptual content, e.g., perception and proprioception, do not contain an explicitly self-referring (or self-identifying) component, but do supply necessarily self-specifying information that, while such modes of awareness are not themselves immune to error through misidentification, they can serve as the basis for first-personal judgments that are so immune.

The claim that perception has nonconceptual content has further implications. In his most recent book, Block (2023) utilizes the notion in demarcating the border between perception and cognition. It is also instrumental in supporting his own theory of consciousness, as against higher-order and global workspace theories of phenomenal consciousness, as well as in supporting his influential distinction between phenomenal and access consciousness.

The notion of nonconceptual content also promises to shed light on the nature of implicit cognition and procedural knowledge (know-how). Bermúdez and Cahen (2022) argue that the involvement of representations with nonconceptual contents best explains cases of purported implicit cognition, e.g., as involved in linguistic competency and in cases of know-how, such as one’s knowing how to ride a bike. In such cases, the involvement of content bearing, representational, states explains why it is correct to attribute to the subject some piece of (linguistic or procedural) knowledge, and the nonconceptual character of the content of those states explains why the subject is not in a position to articulate the knowledge she possesses. This is why such knowledge remains implicit. Such an account of know-how is interesting as it carves a middle ground between intellectualist accounts (e.g., Stanly and Williamson 2001, Stanley 2011) who insist that such knowledge as is available to the subject must be conceptual, which then make it unclear why it should remain inarticulable, and ‘ability accounts’ (e.g., Dreyfus 2005, Noë 2005, Glick 2012, Wiggins 2012), who seem insensitive to the explanatory significance of knowledge as involving internal representations. Toribio (2015) also appeals to nonconceptual representations in developing her non-dispositional anti-intellectualist account of know-how, and Ferretti (2021) argues that know-how involves a nonconceptual capacity to select ways of acting.

The notion of nonconceptual content has also been applied to shed light on potential forms of metarepresentational cognition, particularly in nonhuman animals. Many philosophers have argued that certain types of metarepresentation (thinking about thinking) are in principle unavailable to non-linguistic creatures (e.g., Davidson 1975, Bermúdez 2003). Potential counter-evidence has come from models of animal behavior and animal cognition that seem to depend upon attributing primitive forms of metarepresentation outside the linguistic realm. Shea (2014) argues that the detection of reward prediction error, which is a staple of influential models of learning in cognitive science, should be understood as a nonconceptual form of metarepresentation. Shea’s arguments are (sympathetically) rejected in Carruthers (2021). Carruthers, however, proposes a different candidate for nonconceptual metarepresentation, suggesting that we look instead at evaluations of cognitive effort, of the sort that occur when a creature, for example, compares an option with high effort but high reward, to an option with lower effort, but correspondingly lower reward.

As we consider these applications, however, it should be reiterated that the notion of nonconceptual content is essentially contrastive—and the significance of the notion depends upon the particular way of understanding concepts with which it is contrasted. Some psychological states that would count as nonconceptual for a theorist with a rich and demanding notion of what it is to possess a concept would be conceptual for a theorist with a more relaxed view of concepts. Before we can plausibly claim to have a full understanding of the possibilities of the notion of nonconceptual content, we need to have a much clearer view than we currently have of what it is to possess a concept. As we saw earlier, on the most minimal view of concepts, a thinker can be credited with a concept of Fs provided that he can discriminate things that are F from things that are not F. A richer view of concepts might demand that the thinker have a full appreciation of the grounds on which one might judge something to be an F. The most demanding view of concepts might require the thinker to be able to justify and defend the judgment that something is an F. Clearly, different locations on this broad spectrum will generate different ways of thinking about what is to count as nonconceptual content—as well as different assessments of the overall significance of the notion.


An enhanced copy of the bibliography for this entry with links at PhilPapers is available.

Many of the papers listed below are reprinted in the anthology Essays on Nonconceptual Content, York Gunther (ed.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 2003.

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