Continental Rationalism

First published Wed Nov 21, 2007; substantive revision Mon Nov 6, 2017

The expression “continental rationalism” refers to a set of views more or less shared by a number of philosophers active on the European continent during the latter two thirds of the seventeenth century and the beginning of the eighteenth. Rationalism is most often characterized as an epistemological position. On this view, to be a rationalist requires at least one of the following: (1) a privileging of reason and intuition over sensation and experience, (2) regarding all or most ideas as innate rather than adventitious, (3) an emphasis on certain rather than merely probable knowledge as the goal of enquiry. While all of the continental rationalists meet one or more of these criteria, this is arguably the consequence of a deeper tie that binds them together—that is, a metaphysical commitment to the reality of substance, and, in particular, to substance as an underlying principle of unity.

1. Introduction: Rationalism and Substance

The seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries saw the heyday of metaphysical system-building, but the expression “continental rationalism” primarily connotes rather a set of epistemological views. By contrast to British empiricism, which traces all knowledge to sensory experience, these views emphasize a reliance on reason (ratio in Latin, hence rationalism), the resources of which are taken to be sufficient in some sense for what we know. Thus, a signature doctrine of rationalism is the doctrine of innate ideas, according to which the mind has built into it not just the structure of knowledge but even its content. Nonetheless, among the philosophers comprising the extension of the expression, metaphysical issues, particularly the ontology of substance, occupy the central place. Certainly, this is true of Leibniz and Spinoza, but also of Malebranche and other Cartesians, and even of Descartes on some plausible understandings of him.

To understand the relationship between rationalism’s metaphysical and epistemological commitments, it is helpful to recall Plato’s divided line, which establishes a parallel between objects known and the means by which they are known. In fact, the order of objects, the ordo essendi ranging in importance down from the Good to other forms, to individual things, and to images, and the order of knowing, the ordo cognoscendi, ranging from intuition of various sorts down to sensory experience, is itself to be found in various versions among the later rationalists. The important point, in any case, is that, for the continental rationalists as for Plato, the epistemological distinctions are grounded in ontological distinctions. Or, to put it in terms that reflect rationalist thinking on a number of issues, there is only a distinction of reason between the two orders. The orders of being and knowing are not really distinct; they differ only in our ways of thinking about them.

There is a good explanation of the close connection seen by the rationalists between the epistemological and ontological orders, one that also accounts for their notable reliance on reason. It derives from their answer to what Leibniz called the grand metaphysical question: why is there something rather than nothing at all? There is something because there must be something; there cannot be nothing (and this way of putting it shows the ultimate debt of the rationalists to a tradition that goes back to Parmenides). Reality, or at least some part of it, has necessary existence, and that necessity is something like logical necessity. With this answer, a whole philosophical outlook falls into place. First of all, any significant role for sensory experience falls away, since what exists can be known a priori by logic alone. Causal connections tend to be viewed as logical connections; a principle of sufficient reason falls out which tends to be read as a matter of logical deduction. One result is that there is an impulse toward monism: if the ultimate cause must exist, then that for which it is the sufficient reason must also exist, and just how the two can be distinguished becomes problematic (again, the Parmenidean antecedent is clear).

This outlook was not articulated as such by any rationalist except, perhaps, Spinoza—indeed most were concerned to avoid such consequences of their views. But the outlook does capture the intuitions behind the metaphysical systems they elaborated. And it certainly draws the contrast between them and the empiricists, who tended toward tychism, the view that the world is largely, or even entirely, a product of chance. On the empiricist account, the universe consists of many independent individuals, which, if they are connected, are so only accidentally, reducing causation to nothing more than a matter of constant conjunction. (This physical, metaphysical, and logical atomism is in the tradition of Democritus, Epicurus, and Lucretius.) Under such circumstances, only experience of the world can provide knowledge of it.

The early modern period of philosophy, including continental rationalism, is generally supposed to have been driven by the new science to a radical departure from the Aristotelianism of the late medieval or renaissance period immediately preceding it. (But see Goldstone’s 1998 problematization of the very idea of early modernity, and of the view that the period was launched by the New Science.) The mechanization and mathematization of the world demanded by the inertial physics of a moving Earth led to a revolutionary philosophy better described, at least in its rationalist version, as Platonic, or even Pythagorean. Even so, Aristotelian concepts and terminology persisted. Both were appropriated and deployed to deal with the new problems. The principal Aristotelian concept taken over by the rationalists was the concept of substance.

Aristotle’s term ousia is usually translated as “substance”. What exactly Aristotle meant by the term is a thorny matter, much debated in the literature. His account of substance in the Categories holds individual things, which he terms “proper substances”, to be paradigmatic of substance. On this account, substance is best understood by analogy with a grammatical subject—it takes a predicate, and is not predicable of anything further. Thus, while animal is predicable of horse, and horse of Bucephalus, Bucephalus stands by himself, impredicable of, and hence, numerically different from anything else. Much of Aristotle’s account in the Metaphysics—written years later—seems to accord with this. However, Metaphysics (1017b10–26) complicates the story. Aristotle there describes four uses of the term. He concludes by reducing these to two broad senses—(1) substance as hypokeimenon, the ultimate substratum, which is not predicated of anything further; and (2) substance as form— that which makes each thing the kind of thing that it is. Indications within the text suggest that, by the time that he was giving the lectures that are collected in the Metaphysics, Aristotle regarded not individual things but the matter of which these individual things are formed as the ultimate subject of predication. On this conception, there is some sense in which Bucephalus is himself predicable of matter. Thus, while the substance of the Categories serves as a principle of individuation, the substance of the Metaphysics is more complicated, serving both to individuate Bucephalus and Seabiscuit and to capture the connection or sameness that holds between them.

That substance should be called upon to account for both difference and sameness in the world indicates an inherent tension in the concept. Certainly, the two senses of the term ‘substance’ were in tension during the seventeenth century. The momentum of rationalist argument was to resolve the tension by folding the first sense into the second: there is no real differentiation in the world, only the appearance of difference. Seventeenth century rationalists assigned to substance three roles of connection. Substance was taken (1) to connect attributes as attributes of the same thing at a time (a given shape and a given size as the shape and size of the same thing), (2) to connect them over time (the later shape and size, perhaps different from the earlier, as nonetheless the shape and size of the very same thing), and (3) to connect them as somehow related to the thing as a certain kind of thing (for the Cartesians, shape and size would indicate the thing to be of the kind “extended”). However, Spinoza alone among the continental rationalists fully embraced the conception of substance as a fundamental connection between things. The other members of the movement struggled to retain a notion of substance as individuator, but did so with varying degrees of success.

2. Descartes and His Critics

The rationalism of the most famous of the rationalists is problematic on two counts. First, Descartes is known as the father of modern philosophy precisely because he initiated the so-called epistemological turn that is with us still. Since Descartes, philosophy has been especially concerned with the theory of knowledge, both in itself and as it affects other areas of philosophy. Ethics, for example, has often been concerned with how the good might be known rather than with what the good might be. With his fundamental objective of achieving certainty for his beliefs, Descartes has thus been principally responsible for the incomplete characterization of rationalism as not just etymologically but essentially connected to the claims of reason. While Descartes certainly sought to justify the claims of reason and relied upon them, even for him there are corresponding ontological views that are no less important to his system.

The second problematic aspect of Descartes’s rationalism is more difficult to resolve. Descartes was a radical voluntarist who thought that all truth, including what we take to be necessary truth, depends on the will of God. Care needs to be taken in how this view is expressed, for Descartes did not hold simply that what we take to be necessary in fact is contingent. He held that actually necessary truth depends on God’s unconstrained will, such that even propositions that are logically contradictory might have been simultaneously true. Reason itself thus seems no longer reliable, and experience would seem to be the only way of determining which of the worlds even beyond logic such a powerful and unconstrained God has created. Not many of the rationalists, even among the Cartesians, followed Descartes in this radical voluntarism, and some in recent times have seen the view as ultimately incoherent. Even so, Descartes seems to have taken the view as the basis at least of his physics, and perhaps of his whole system. Indeed, on some accounts, it was this doctrine of created truth that enabled Descartes to frame the most radical doubt hitherto conceived, when in the Meditations he entertained the possibility that he was always deceived by a mendacious deity, even when considering what appeared to him most obviously true, to wit, the existence of the “simplest things” that are the subjects of arithmetic and geometry. (Against this view, Margaret Wilson (1982, 105–114), observes that, in Meditation 1, God need only have the power to deceive me about the eternal truths, not to create them.) While a doubt (and a doctrine) this radical might lead one to despair of ever achieving sure knowledge, for Descartes, it was the catalyst for his discovery of the cogito, and with it, his first indubitable truth—the truth of his own existence.

At every stage of Descartes’s argument in the Meditations, there are ontological implications: the mind’s independence of sensory perceptions (perceptions whose reliability is ultimately upset by the possibility that he is dreaming), the literally unimaginable sort of thing that a physical object such as a piece of wax must be, the existence of a veracious God, who provides a guarantee for the reliability of reason, and finally the existence of a physical world consisting of extended things. Arnauld immediately suggested to Descartes that his argument contained a circle: we can rely on reason only if we know that God exists, but we know that God exists only by relying on reason. Thus, Descartes has established the certainty only of his own existence, but nothing beyond that. Descartes thought that he had a response to this criticism, but whether he did, and how cogent it is as a rebuttal, have been perennial questions of debate among Descartes scholars. One way to understand Descartes’s procedure is that while he does not claim to prove even that he exists, he does claim to show that it is unreasonable to think otherwise. That is, he shows that the argument of the skeptic fails because the consistent application of reason leads to the view not that reason is unreliable, but precisely the opposite. The skeptic might be right, but he is unreasonable. A parallel case in the moral realm might be brought out here. Over the course of an exchange with Mesland about the nature of human freedom, Descartes notes that we can, absolutely speaking, act against against our reason and judgment. However, morally speaking, we cannot (CSM III 245/AT 4:173). When explaining what he means by this, Descartes suggests that we can only act against our better judgment and reason in the case where we take it to be a good thing to demonstrate our freedom by doing so. This is what Kenny has called the “freedom of perversity” (Kenny 1998). In other words, only with the attitude of perversion can we act against what we take to be best. So, as in the epistemological realm, so too in the moral realm: it is unreasonable or even perverse to deny the results of the consistent use of reason. Descartes thus emerges at least as a bootstrap rationalist—using innate reason and a disinclination to perversity to assert the truth of his own existence, which, in turn, serves as a foundation for a more extensive search after truth—in a way that mirrors the non-absolute status of his necessary truths. The rationalist connection between the orders of being and knowing is thus preserved.

But what sense can be made of the doctrine of created truth? By what kind of causality did God create the eternal (necessary) truths? In response to this very question Descartes replied that God did so in just the way that He created everything else, that He is the total and efficient cause not only of the existence of created things, but also of their essence. The eternal truths are just this essence of created things. As before, Descartes did not elaborate his answer, but, once again, he provided enough elsewhere for us to do so. It is clear that for Descartes, as for many other theologically orthodox thinkers, the existence of things results from an unconstrained exercise of God’s omnipotent will to create ex nihilo. What Descartes might be saying, then, is that an eternal truth or essence is also something that is created ex nihilo. The eternal truths might thus be instances of what Descartes called substance.

In the Principles, Descartes defined “substance” as a thing that exists such that its existence does not depend on any other thing. He immediately added that, strictly speaking, the term applies only to God, who, as uncreated, alone depends on nothing else to exist. However, he allowed that in an extended sense it applies to things that depend only on God’s creation and continuing conservation. These created substances are really distinct from other substances insofar as they are conceivable apart from each other. They do not require a subject of inherence, and are thus ontologically, if not causally, independent. These created substances are distinguished from other things, such as qualities, which not only depend on God causally, but also depend ontologically on other things, ultimately on created substances, as subjects of inherence. In this sense, a created substance for Descartes is like the hypokeimenon of Aristotle, playing both its roles, as individuator and bearer of qualities. However, with his definition of the real distinction, he built in an unintended tendency toward monism—a tendency that Spinoza exploited. For Descartes, one thing is really distinct from another just in case it can be conceived apart from that other. But, if this test of independence is applied to causal relations, it produces the result that there is but one substance, God.

What types of things counted as created substances for Descartes? Clearly, he takes an individual mind to be a created substance. If a mind did not have this status, then Descartes’s argument for its immortality, that it can be conceived apart from all else except God, and a fortiori from the body, would collapse. Beyond minds, however, an ambiguity appears. Although there are texts in which Descartes speaks of individual things like a piece of wax as substances, there are others—most famously, the Synopsis to the Meditations—that indicate that there is but a single extended substance, of which individual things are the modes. At a minimum, there is an asymmetry in his treatment of minds and material things, perhaps reflecting the tension between a hypokeimenon, accounting for difference, and the other sense of ousia, accounting for sameness. To say that Peter and Paul are substances is to say that their minds are numerically distinct; but to say that a piece of wax and a piece of wood are substances might be to say that they are both extended things.

However many instances of each kind there might be, there is a dualism of two kinds of substance, according to Descartes: thinking things, or minds, and extended things, or bodies. This dualism generated two well-known problems, resolved by Descartes with only partial success. One of his most incisive critics, Elisabeth of Bohemia, wanted to know how in voluntary action the will, which is a property of the unextended mind, could have an effect on the body, given that, according to Descartes’s mechanistic physics, a material thing can be affected only by what is in contact with it. Descartes replied with a rather mysterious account of how the mind and body formed a unique kind of composite. Over the course of the letters of their correspondence that focus on this issue, Elisabeth presses Descartes for an explanation of how mind and body interact. Descartes’s responses do not satisfy Elisabeth, and rightly so. For, the mysterious composite that he suggests involves the concept of a primitive notion (Shapiro, 65/AT 3:665), a concept that is not present in any other of his writings. Descartes states that we have primitive notions for the body, “extension”, for the mind, “thought”, and for the mind/body composite, “union.” He explains that each of these notions is best understood by using a faculty that is particularly well-suited to grasp it. The primitive notion for the mind, he states, is best understood by the understanding alone; the primitive notion of the body is best understood by the understanding aided by the imagination; and the primitive notion of the composite is best understood by the senses (Shapiro, 69/AT 3:691). Armed with the distinction in methodology for knowing each of these notions, Descartes diagnoses Elisabeth’s difficulty in understanding his explanation in the following way: She is trying too hard to understand the union of her mind and body by her understanding alone. The remedy to this problem, he suggests, is for the Princess to stop meditating on the problem, and to instead focus on “life and ordinary conversations” in order to conceive the union (Shapiro, 70/AT 3:692). But, of course, this recommendation does not adequately address Elisabeth’s question. For, while focusing on “life” and “ordinary conversations” may well help to conceive that the mind and body interact, a point that Elisabeth does not call into question, it furnishes nothing towards an answer to the question of how such an interaction occurs. The discussion of this topic comes to an end with Elisabeth’s suggestion that she is better able to understand the how of interaction by thinking that part of the soul is extended (Shapiro, 72/AT 4:1). On this model, a necessary condition for motion, contact, is possible.

Descartes’s effort to resolve a second difficulty is more promising, and also exemplifies the rationalistic character of his thought. The problem is to show how the mind can know something such as a material thing that is different in kind from it, given a longstanding principle that only like can know like. He rejected this essentially Aristotelian principle, but still had to give an account of such knowledge. From scholastic sources, Descartes was able to construct a theory of ideas according to which to know something is to have an idea of it, the idea being the very thing known in so far as it is known. He saw the term “idea” as ambiguous: taken materially, it has formal reality, as a mode of the mind; taken in another sense, it has objective reality, as the thing represented. But there is no real distinction between these realities, only a rational distinction. They are really the same thing considered differently. A welcome epistemological upshot of this rationalist gambit is that Descartes has no skeptical problems generated by ideas standing as a tertium quid between the knower and what is known.

This result is indicated by Descartes’s use of the term, picked up and emphasized by Malebranche, according to which there are no false ideas; every idea in this sense is materially true in that it has an object, and that is the object it appears to have. This conception of an idea is the basis for Descartes of what has been called the transparency of mind: I cannot be mistaken that I am thinking about what I am thinking about. Malebranche (whose entire philosophy was colored by his struggles with Descartes’s theory of ideas), in fact, later erected such incorrigible intentionality into the fundamental principle of his epistemology. Meanwhile, Descartes’s view that material or formal reality and objective reality are only rationally distinct might be taken to mean that minds are intrinsically intentional. A mind just is the sort of thing whose states are about something else. Arnauld extended this thesis, which adumbrates later thinkers such as Brentano, to include all mental phenomena, even sensations.

Another line of discussion that relates to the problem of dualism and the nature of ideas is advanced in 1734 by Ghanaian philosopher Anton Amo. An extraordinarily interesting thinker in his own right, Amo advances a critique of Descartes’s assertion that the mind can sense, that is, that the immaterial mind can passively receive sensory information. In his dissertation, On the Apatheia of the Human Mind, or The Absence of Sensation and the Faculty of Sense in the Human Mind and Their Presence in our Organic and Living Body, Amo states that the human mind is spirit, and that spirit is that substance that is purely active. Following the narrative of the commitment to the metaphysical reality of substance as the common feature of rationalists through this period, Amo sits firmly in the rationalist camp. But it is on the basis of this particular definition of substance that Amo distinguishes his view from Descartes’s. According to Descartes, the mind can sense. For Amo, sensation, which is purely passive, cannot be a feature of the spiritual, purely active substance of mind. There are two threads of Amo’s critique. First, he is concerned to uphold the soul in the lofty position that it deserves given its status as purely active. His critique of Descartes on this point intersects with the objections raised by Elisabeth: the mind, being immaterial, cannot interact with material things. Thus, the mind cannot have sensation of material objects (Amo, 75). Second, Amo wishes to emphasize the essential nature of the body for human beings. On his view, “to live and to have sensation” are inseparable predicates. All living things feel; all feeling things live. But, on his view, “to live” is to be embodied. This allows Amo to call into question Descartes’s claim, in Meditations II, that he is nothing but a thinking thing. For Amo, it is impossible for the “thinking thing” to live without a body. Amo is thus a dualist, like Descartes, but with the important difference of removing sensation from the mind, and locating it in the body. This move simultaneously preserves the pure activity of the mind and boosts the importance of the body in the entity that is a human being.

But Amo’s dualism faces the same problem as Descartes’s: if we accept the fact that the body senses and the mind does not, then Amo must provide an explanation for how the mind and body communicate. In particular, he must provide an explanation for how the body can sense, for instance, pain, and communicate this sensation to the purely active mind. While Amo might seem no better situated than Descartes to offer such an explanation, he does endorse an interesting definition of “idea” that may provide a starting point for such an explanation. Amo states that when we think of the manner in which a human being functions, there are four elements that must be kept separate: mind, the operation of the mind, idea, and immediate sensation. Both the mind and its operations are immaterial, he says, and immediate sensation is a property of body. However, on Amo’s view, “idea” is to be understood as “a composite entity; for there is an idea when the mind makes present to itself a sensation pre-existing in the body, and thereby brings the feeling before the mind” (Amo, 74). If by “composite”, Amo means a composite of material and immaterial substance, then this suggestion bears some resemblance to Elisabeth’s claim, above, that she thinks that there could be a material part of the soul that could account for its ability to interact with the body. Of course, explaining just how the mind makes a sensation present to itself and thus brings a feeling before it, will determine the success of any such explanation.

3. Malebranche and Cavendish

The battle between the Cartesians and their opponents in the latter half of the seventeenth century was one of the great struggles in the history of philosophy, but it was one in which the lines were not clearly drawn. For, although those in the Cartesian camp claimed the banner of Descartes, there were as many differences among them as between them and their opponents. Perhaps the most important difference among them hinged on whether or not they accepted Descartes’s doctrine of created truth. Desgabets and his student Régis were the most important among the few who did accept the doctrine. Along with their acceptance of the doctrine, however, came nascent tendencies toward empiricism. On the other hand, Malebranche, the most notable among the Cartesians who rejected the doctrine of created truth, developed a philosophical system with a purer rationalistic character than Descartes’s own. Descartes had advised his followers to follow not him but their own reason. Malebranche, like other heterodox Cartesians, justified his differences from Descartes as the result of following this injunction. On his view, his rejection of the doctrine of created truth followed from his commitment to other, deeper views in Descartes. He thus represented himself as more Cartesian than Descartes himself.

The philosophy of Malebranche is sometimes portrayed as a synthesis of Descartes and Augustine, but a more precise way to put this relation is that Malebranche used Augustine to rectify shortcomings he perceived in the philosophy of Descartes. Chief among these was Descartes’s theory of ideas, which, according to Malebranche, not only fails to reflect human beings’ proper dependence on God but also leads inevitably to skepticism. Initially, Malebranche thought that he agreed with Descartes’s theory, but in the long debate over the nature of ideas he had with Arnauld, who held a close version of Descartes’s theory, Malebranche came to see a need for a different account.

Not implausibly, Arnauld took Descartes’s claim about the ambiguity of the term “idea” to mean that “idea”, or “perception”, refers to one and the same thing, a thing which stands in two different relations. Insofar as it is related to what is known, it is called an idea; insofar as it is related to the mind, it is called a perception. This (act of) perception he took to be related to the mind as a mode of it. It is at this point that Malebranche detected the threat of skepticism. What we know, indeed what we know in the most important instances of knowledge, is universal, necessary, and infinite, as in the case of certain mathematical knowledge. But nothing that is the mode of a particular, contingent and finite mind can be universal, necessary or infinite. If ideas were modes of the mind, then we would not have such knowledge; but since we do have such knowledge, ideas must be something else. Malebranche argued that the only being in which such ideas could exist is God. Following Augustine, he took ideas to be the exemplars in the mind of God after which He creates the world. This construal had the additional advantage for Malebranche of guarding against skepticism because, although idea and object are no longer identical, they are nonetheless necessarily connected as exemplar and exemplum. Even so, it remained true for Malebranche that, when we look at a material thing, what we in fact see is not that thing but its idea. This is the core of his view of “vision of all things in God”, which he welcomed as an indication of human beings’ dependence on the deity. The immediate vehicle whereby we have such knowledge is a particular, contingent, and finite mode of the mind; but the universal, necessary, and infinite object of that mode can exist only in some other kind of being. How are these ideas known to the mind if they are not in it, at least not as modes of it? Although ideas are not innate to the mind, for that would make them modes of it, they are nonetheless always present to it. In seeking to know, whether we realize it or not, we are consulting Reason, which Malebranche identifies with the second person of the Trinity, the logos of Neoplatonic theology. Our effort to know is a “natural prayer” that Reason always answers.

As for individual substances, Malebranche clearly thought that every material thing and every mind is a substance in the sense of a hypokeimenon. But when pressed late in his life to show how this status for them comported with the rest of his system, how they could be anything but modes of a single substance, in short how he avoided the drift into Spinozistic monism, he was in fact hard pressed. In the Search After Truth, Malebranche clearly committed himself to the view that everything is either a substance or a mode. In addition, he accepted Descartes’s criterion for a substance that it be conceivable apart from everything else. However, he maintained that any given portion of extension is conceivable apart from the rest of extension and is thus a substance. (Descartes did not think this, otherwise void space would be possible for him.) Since extension is conceptually divisible to infinity, Malebranche is committed to an infinite number of extended substances. Apart from the whole of extension, moreover, every substance contains an infinite number of substances, of (each of) which it is a mode. It is also a part of an infinite number of substances, which are modes of it. The explanatory value of the concept of substance would seem to have been lost with such results as these. Malebranche’s view seems to be a degenerate version of Descartes’s texts to the effect, surprising but coherent, that there is but one material substance, res extensa, whose modes are particular material things. Here the effect is to reverse the Aristotelian logic of substance. To say of \(x\), a particular thing, that it is extended \(E\), is to say not that a substance \(x\) has a property \(E\), but that \(x\) is a mode of res extensa.

These difficulties in accounting for substance on Malebranche’s part seem to derive from his Platonism. As a Platonist, he was interested less in substance as the hypokeimenon, which accounts for difference, than in its other sense of ousia, which accounts for sameness. Thus, Malebranche’s skid to Spinozism is greased even when he talks about mind, the essence of which is thought—not this or that thought, “but substantial thought, thought capable of all sorts of modifications or thoughts”. Since the same substantial thought is had by all possessed of a mind, Malebranche’s view smacks even of the single intellectual soul for all human beings of the Latin Averroists. In this sense too, then, his heterodoxy as a Cartesian is part and parcel with his deep commitment to rationalism, and in particular with his rationalistic reduction of phenomenal difference to real sameness.

The final rationalistic aspect of Malebranche’s thought that deserves attention here is his theory of causation. For Malebranche, a cause is that between which and whose effect there is a necessary connection. On his view, the causal connection that is characterized by this kind of necessity is that between God’s will and its effects. Thus, for Malebranche, only God has causal efficacy. What we take to be real causes—for example the motion of a billiard ball that collides with another that then begins to move—are in fact only occasional causes, the occasions for the operation of the only real cause.

A cousin of Malebranche’s occasionalism is worth noting here. Margaret Cavendish agrees with Malebranche that bodies do not cause change in one another, but she disagrees with him about whether nature is self-moving. Where Malebranche takes created things to possess no causal power at all, Cavendish takes them to possess the power of self-motion. On her view, when bodies interact, there is no transfer of motion. Cavendish’s commitment to this view is grounded in her belief that properties cannot be transferred between bodies. Because motion is a property, she argues, motion cannot be transferred between bodies. Following this line of reasoning, when bodies come into contact, they act as occasional causes, that is, causes that merely occasion a change. In an interaction, one body will serve as occasional cause, and the second body will serve as a “principal” cause, which brings about, in itself, the appropriate effect (see Detlefsen 2006 and the entry on Cavendish). Both thinkers also hold the view, ubiquitous in the period, that motion is issued into the created world as a result of God’s willing it. Cavendish is careful to note that this issuance is the result not of “an immediate action of God” but rather by an “all-powerful command” (Cavendish, 209). She rejects the former option on the grounds that such continual, immediate action is unsuitable to “an immovable and immutable essence” (Cavendish, 209). On this point, she and Malebranche are in agreement.

The difference in the way that they conceive of occasional causation is in how they understand the content of the “all-powerful command” that introduces motion into the system. On Malebranche’s view, a true cause is one where we can perceive a necessary connection between it and its effect. The only candidate for such a connection is between the infinite will as cause, and its effects. Moreover, he seems to also endorse the claim that for a cause to bring out its effect, it must possess the knowledge of how to bring it about. In the case of the relationship between a finite mind and the body to which it is joined, our ignorance of how the mind “causes” the body to move is enough to deny that there is causal connection. In short, only God has the required knowledge to effect these kinds of changes. These arguments undergird the central Malebranchean commitment: the utter dependence of all created things on God. As such, it makes sense, on his system, to deny causal efficacy to anything other than God. Such a denial of causal efficacy entrenches the dependence of created things on their creator.

Cavendish tells a different kind of story here. She notes that those who show discomfort with the notion that God, through His command, gave the power of self-motion to all created things, are clouded by their “ambition” (Cavendish, 209). Ambition leads certain thinkers to imagine that the immaterial substance of their souls is the only created thing that possesses self-motion. On this understanding of causation, they feel closer to God, who is radically self-moving, and superior to material things, which do not possess the ability to self-move. However, Cavendish notes, the decree from God that introduces motion into the created world is just as easily imparted to material things as to immaterial things. As such, there is no reason to suppose that He did not give the power of self-motion to material things.

Cavendish’s criticism of those whose ambition clouds the way they think about self-motion does not apply to Malebranche, however. For, on his view, no created thing, human souls included, possesses the power to self-move. Given Malebranche’s combined rationalistic and theological commitments, none of this is surprising. The surprise, or at least irony, comes when Malebranche’s arguments that natural causes—even and especially human volitions—cannot be real causes cross the channel and are deployed by Hume. The radical empiricist account of causation that Hume gave in terms of constant conjunction is just Malebranche’s rationalist occasionalism without the role assigned to God. For Hume, Malebranche’s occasional causes are the only causes.

4. Spinoza

The centrality of substance for the continental rationalists is further borne out by the importance of that concept for Spinoza, especially within his Ethics. Spinoza devoted the entire first part of that work to a consideration of substance, or, as he also termed it “Deus sive Natura” (“God, in other words, Nature”). The remaining parts trace the consequences of his conception of substance for epistemology, psychology, physics, and ethics. While Spinoza’s account of substance is quite rightly regarded as a development and working-out of Descartes’s metaphysics, there are also (as with Descartes and Malebranche) considerable, and important, differences between the two. What is important for our present purposes, however, is that (as with Malebranche) Spinoza’s departures from Descartes are almost always the manifestation of a form of rationalism purer than Descartes’s own. Most radically, Spinoza replaced Descartes’s substance pluralism with a monistic account modelled on Cartesian extended substance. Just as, in some places, Descartes treats bodies as mere modes of a single extended substance, so, for Spinoza, all individuals—both bodies and minds—are modes of a single substance.

Spinoza arrived at this position by way of a decidedly uncartesian account of attributes. While Descartes held that two substances of the same type can share the same principal attribute, Spinoza rejected this. Any two substances, argued Spinoza, must be distinguished either by their attributes (Spinoza dropped the modifier “principal”) or by their modes. But, since modes are themselves both ontologically and causally dependent on the substances of which they are affections, they cannot be the individuating principle for them. Thus, it must be the attributes themselves that individuate substances (and not just types of substances, as Descartes argued). Similarly, while Descartes held that each substance is characterized by one and only one principal attribute, Spinoza invoked the principle of plenitude to show that substance must have infinite attributes. Based on a variation of the ontological argument, he maintained that substance is pure, utterly unlimited being. It must therefore, he argued, possess infinite attributes, in the dual sense of possessing unlimited attributes and of possessing all attributes. Since substance is characterized by infinite attributes, and since no two substances can share a single attribute, there can be only one substance. This radical monism was repugnant to many who, like English philosopher Anne Conway, saw that it eliminated any and all distinction between the creator, God, and His creation.

Spinoza’s one substance is at the farthest possible remove from Aristotle’s proper substances. Whereas, for Aristotle, individual things, such as Bucephalus, are paradigmatic substances, Spinoza denies their substantiality. But does this mean that, unlike Aristotelian proper substances, which are not predicable of anything else, Spinoza’s finite modes are predicable of substance? Scholars are divided on this point. Curley has argued that Spinoza retains the conception of the substance-mode distinction as a distinction between independent and dependent being, but rejects the view that the substance-mode distinction correlates to the distinction between a subject of predication and its predicate. Bennett, however, argues that Spinoza does indeed regard finite modes as predicable of substance, or, as he puts it, as “adjectival on the world”. Bennett characterizes Spinoza’s account of substance as a “field metaphysic” in which individual things are simply clusters of qualities within regions of space. Just as a blush is merely a confluence of properties on a region of a face, so the face—indeed, the person whose face it is—is a confluence of properties “on a region” of substance.

Whether or not Spinoza rejected the predicability of finite modes, it is clear that he did not regard them as either causally or conceptually independent in the way that is requisite for substance. For Spinoza, substance is “in itself and is conceived through itself”, whereas a mode is “in something else and is conceived through something else”. The “in itself/in something else” aspect of these two definitions captures Descartes’s conception of causal independence, while the “conceived through itself/through something else” aspect refers to Descartes’s conceivability-apart criterion for ontological independence. Descartes, it will be recalled, regarded divine substance as both causally and ontologically independent, but created substances as ontologically, but not causally, independent, since they depend on God’s creative (and conservative) power for their existence. It is in this sense that, for Descartes, the term “substance” is used equivocally for God and created substances. Spinoza, however, denied that “substance” is an equivocal term. In so doing, he eliminated two asymmetries in Descartes’s metaphysics—that between divine and created substance, and the asymmetry between extended and thinking substance that Descartes expresses in the Synopsis to the Meditations. For Spinoza, finite minds are not themselves substances, but rather modes of thinking substance. That is, for Spinoza, at the most fundamental level, all minds reduce to the thinking substance of which they are affections.

Spinoza’s account of the eternal verities marks a similar rationalistic advance over Descartes’s metaphysics. For Spinoza, God is just substance simpliciter. He lacks volition and personality; his only characteristics are pure being, infinity, necessity, and activity. While Spinoza agreed with Descartes that God is the cause of all things, he regarded him not as a transeunt cause, creating the universe “from the outside” through an act of will, but as an immanent cause, from whom the universe unfolds out of his own necessity. For Spinoza, all things therefore follow by logical (and not merely causal) necessity from God’s eternal and infinite nature. In this sense, not only mathematical truths but indeed such apparently contingent facts as Caesar’s having crossed the Rubicon are necessary truths for Spinoza. The difference between them is not the necessity of the truths themselves but rather the route that we take to arrive at them. While mathematical truths, for instance, are deducible by reason alone, Spinoza recognized that the finitude of human understanding prevents, or at least impedes, our similarly deducing empirical facts about the world. In contrast with some empiricists, who regard cause and effect as mere constant conjunction, for Spinoza, the relationship between cause and effect has the force of a logical entailment; empirical facts are themselves necessary truths. The universe is thus, in principle at least, perfectly intelligible to reason.

For Spinoza, as for Descartes, the metaphysical commitment to substance underwrote a rationalist epistemology that strongly privileges reason and intuition over sensation and imagination. The distinctive character of Spinoza’s epistemological rationalism is rooted in his principle that “the order and connection of ideas is the order and connection of things”. For Descartes, the mind and the body are, though intimately connected, radically heterogeneous. How it is that the mind comes to know things about the physical world therefore remains, despite his best efforts, a somewhat murky business. By rejecting the substantiality of both minds and bodies, and by regarding them both as modes of a single substance, Spinoza obviated this difficulty. For Spinoza, the mind and the body are the very same thing conceived in two different ways. Persistent clusters of qualities in space are bodies. The ideas—or, in Descartes’s terminology, the objective reality—of these bodies are minds. Just as a single body has a corresponding objective reality, so collections of bodies characterized by various relations also have a corresponding objective reality with isomorphic parts and relations. Since there is no gap between minds and bodies, there is therefore no difficulty in principle in perceiving the physical world. On Spinoza’s account, we perceive the physical world in two ways—(1) by perceiving the actions of our own bodies, and (2) by perceiving the effects of other bodies on ours. Thus, when one’s body runs, the correlative ideas are in one’s mind. Likewise, when someone steps on one’s toe, the physical effects on the toe likewise have their counterparts in the mind’s ideas.

Despite the necessary connection the mind has with the body, argued Spinoza, sensation and imagination are inherently limited. The idea of substance qua substance must be a perfect unity. However, the idea which constitutes the human mind is complex—not a unity but a plurality of ideas. That idea is therefore confused, rather than clear and distinct. Clear and distinct understanding, on Spinoza’s account, must partake of the unity of the idea of substance, and not of the fragmentary nature of the idea of the human body and its affects. This cognitive unity is achieved in two ways—through reason (which Spinoza termed “knowledge of the second kind”) and through intuition (“knowledge of the third kind”). When we cognize through sensation and imagination (“knowledge of the first kind”), we try to grasp many ideas at once, and thereby produce confusion. Reason and intuition, by contrast, provide us with access to just one idea—the substantial unity underlying our body and our mind. Reason does this from “the fact that we have common notions and adequate ideas of the properties of things”, while intuition proceeds “from an adequate idea of the formal essence of certain attributes of God”. To understand the substantial unity that is the necessary cause of our body and our mind is to grasp them sub specie aeternitatis.

This epistemological ideal forms the core of Spinoza’s rationalistic ethics—and, hence, on one plausible account, the core of his Ethics. Spinoza’s monism entails that the sort of individuals that Aristotle regarded as primary substances are distinguished not by their own substantial unity, but by their conatus—their striving to persist. Thus, self-preservation is not just one possible goal of ethical agents; it is the very thing that makes those agents individuals. Our essence, and our ethical task, is thus to be active, whereas, by contrast, to be passive threatens our persistence. The mind persists through activity and is threatened by passivity. It is therefore in our self-interest to pursue adequate ideas through knowledge of the second and third kinds. The more we join our minds with God through adequate knowledge of things under the form of eternity, the less we are affected by external things and, hence, by our own passions, which are nothing but our passivity in the face of forces external to us. Adequate knowledge of God gives us equanimity and calm, and literally ensures our persistence. Ethical virtue is thus fundamentally epistemological. For Spinoza, the most rationalist of figures discussed here, the good life is the utterly rational life.

5. Leibniz and Conway

As we have seen, rationalist epistemology is grounded in a metaphysical commitment to substance. The concept of substance allowed the rationalists to reduce all complexity and plurality to an underlying simplicity and unity, versus the empiricists, who, in their skepticism about substance, were committed to regarding reality as fundamentally plural and complex. Spinoza’s metaphysics marked the culmination of this rationalist momentum. In Leibniz, the last great continental rationalist, we see its final movement. Leibniz, like other rationalists before him, regarded quotidian things as phenomena that ultimately reduce to perfectly simple substances. However, for Leibniz, there is an infinite number of these simple substances, each of them causally and perceptually isolated from all of the others. Leibniz reasoned that this is the best of all possible worlds because it balances the maximal possible complexity with the maximal possible order. In thus privileging neither unity nor plurality, neither simplicity nor complexity, and in striking the balance that he did on purely rational principles, Leibniz exemplified a more complex, more comprehensive and, ultimately, more mature rationalism than that of his predecessors.

For Leibniz, at the most fundamental level, reality is characterized by simple substances, or “monads”, a term that Leibniz picked up from Francis Mercury van Helmont and Anne Conway in 1696 (Merchant 1979). Since there are composites, Leibniz argued, there must be simple substances that, together, constitute these composites. Being simple, monads have neither parts, nor extension, nor form, nor divisibility. Leibniz saw them as the “true Atoms of nature”. While Leibniz thus retained a strong commitment to substance, he resisted rationalism’s synechistic momentum, which privileged the metaphysical and methodological stance of the continuity of the universe, by rehabilitating substance’s Aristotelian role as an individuator. However, while, for Aristotle, Bucephalus is a proper substance, Leibniz regarded Bucephalus not as a substance but as himself comprising a collection of simple substances. Leibniz agreed with Aristotle’s characterization of substance as the grammatical subject of predication and not itself predicable of anything else. However, he complained that this account does not go far enough. For Leibniz, the essence of substance lies not in the fact that it is the subject of predication, but in the fact that every possible predicate may be asserted or denied of it. In this way, every individual substance has a complete concept, a conception so complete (that is, so fully determinate) that every fact about the substance, and about its situation in the universe—past, present or future —follows from it analytically.

Leibniz’s insistence that every individual substance has a complete concept entailed that, unlike Spinoza, he regarded Cartesian thinking substance and not Cartesian extended substance as paradigmatic of substance. Descartes’s extended substance (like Spinozistic substance) is, on Leibniz’s account, not a substance at all since it does not afford a principle of individuation. Leibniz argued that, whereas a real substance has a complete concept, the Cartesian notion of extended substance is an abstraction arrived at through an incomplete concept. Matter on its own is insufficient to form or to constitute a substance. For Leibniz, a body could never be a candidate for substance since bodies are susceptible to alteration and are infinitely divisible. We can thus never arrive at a body of which it can be said, “Here really is an entity.” Moreover, whereas Cartesian extended substance is totally inert, Leibniz insisted that activity is the hallmark of substance. Anything that acts is a substance; every substance constantly and uninterruptedly acts. For Leibniz, this position follows from God’s perfection. God’s planning of the universe was so perfect that it only required to be set in motion by him. True substances (that is, entia per se) are active and self-causing. On Leibniz’s account, God would lack all dignity were he the sole cause in the universe—that is, if occasionalism or interventionism were necessary. God’s perfect planning avoids the necessity for (continual or continuous) extraordinary concourse. Thus, God’s perfection entails that all substances are active; passive extension is only matter, not substance.

The activity, or appetition, that Leibniz regards as characterizing the monads is intimately bound up with his Principle of Sufficient Reason. For Leibniz, a monad contains its whole history because each monadic state (except for those states—creation is paradigmatic of these—that are the result of divine causation) has its sufficient cause in the preceding state. In turn, the present state is the sufficient cause of all succeeding states. Despite this emphasis on the inherent activity of substance, Leibniz, like Spinoza, rejected the possibility of transeunt causation among substances. Monads are “windowless” and neither admit nor emit causal influence. Moreover, being thus windowless, monads can no more receive perceptions from the world than they can any other external causation. Rather, a monad’s perceptions are built-in at creation. By preestablished harmony, these perceptions perfectly align with the universe’s infinite monadic states. This entails that while there is no genuine transeunt causation at the monadic level, a kind of pseudocausation results from monads’ harmonized perceptions of each other as their respective appetitions convey them through successive changes. For Leibniz, causal relations thus reduce to logical relations in that every change in a substance follows from its concept.

While Leibniz’s view that every substance has a complete concept reinforces the centrality of reason in his epistemology, in doing so, it seems to undercut human and even divine volition, and thereby to slide toward Spinozism. If every fact about Julius Caesar, and indeed, every other fact about the universe is rationally deducible from the Roman Dictator’s complete concept, then it would seem that only one course for the universe is possible. However, this is not a step that Leibniz was willing to take. Were there no distinction between contingent and necessary truths, argued Leibniz, fatalism would be true, and human liberty of the will would be impossible. Leibniz sought to avert this result by distinguishing between hypothetical and absolute necessity. Absolute necessity, he argued, is governed by the principle of contradiction. Something is absolutely necessary if its negation is logically impossible. Hypothetical necessity, on the other hand, describes a state of affairs that is necessary ex hypothesi—that is, just in case a particular antecedent holds—but not logically necessary. On Leibniz’s account, the fact that Caesar crossed the Rubicon is only hypothetically necessary; it follows necessarily from the existence of the individual substance that is Caesar, but its denial is not logically impossible. According to Leibniz, God at creation conceived of an infinite array of possible worlds. The myriad contingent facts of each of these worlds are only hypothetically necessary. That is, they would only be necessary if God were to instantiate that world. Since the present world is the one that God chose to instantiate, all of the contingent facts of this world are certain. However, they are nonetheless contingent since their negation implies no absurdity. That is, there was no logical impossibility preventing Caesar from deciding not to cross the Rubicon. In this sense, his will—and, indeed, human will generally—is free. Leibniz’s argument for hypothetical necessity has an obvious antecedent in Descartes’s doctrine of created truth. However, unlike Descartes, Leibniz limited the doctrine’s scope to contingent truths. He nonetheless hoped to avoid Spinozist necessitarianism. Whether or not he succeeded in doing so is a matter of debate in the literature.

Inasmuch as it characterizes the universe as composed of a plurality of individual existences, none of which has any genuine causal efficacy over any other, Leibniz’s position shows considerable affinities with Hume’s empiricism. However, while Hume inferred from this the importance of experience, Leibniz instead took this ontology to preclude adventitious knowledge. He thus remained committed on metaphysical grounds to the doctrine of innate ideas. In his rejection of transeunt causation among substances, Leibniz rejected the notion that we can learn new things about the world in the sense of gaining new ideas that do not already exist in our souls. On Leibniz’s account, the temporal coincidence of a certain phenomenon with one’s “learning” of the phenomenon was preestablished at creation in the same way that all monadic states were. Leibniz admitted that it is idiomatically acceptable to speak about acquiring knowledge via the senses. However, he regarded all sensory reports as reducible to, and explicable as, descriptions of logical relations. Leibniz’s theory of knowledge thus relegates the Aristotelian idea of human beings as blank slates who learn through induction to a mere façon de parler. By contrast, he strongly endorsed Plato’s doctrine of recollection to the extent that it locates all knowledge in ideas already residing in the soul. Socrates’s exchange with Meno’s slave boy, argued Leibniz, shows that the soul already possesses the ideas upon which truths about the universe depend, and needs only to be reminded of them.

On Leibniz’s account, substances have built into them perceptions of the whole universe. Every substance, he argued, is a mirror of the whole universe to the extent that everything that has ever happened or existed or will ever happen or exist are included in its complete concept. The perceptions of all substances, he maintained, thus resemble God’s infinite perception in their unlimited scope. It is with respect to clarity and distinctness that the perceptions of created substance fall short of God’s. For Leibniz, the best of all possible worlds is that world that balances the maximal possible complexity with the maximal possible order. The existing world satisfies this through the infinite variety of perspectives taken by the monads. By the principle of order, each monad reflects the very same world as do the other monads. However, by the principle of complexity, the monads reflect the world from an infinite number of unique perspectives. This infinite variety in perspectives entails that each monad reflects all of the others with varying degrees of clarity and distinctness. In this way, the universe is replete with an infinite number of different representations of God’s works. Among these, only God’s perceptions are universally clear and distinct. While the complexity requirement for the best of all possible worlds would seem to preclude in principle the possibility of human beings achieving knowledge of the universe sub specie aeternitatis, Leibniz made a special exception for human souls. On Leibniz’s account, all monads have low-level perceptions, of the kind that we experience when we are in a stupor. However, the souls of living things have, over and above this, feelings and memories. Human souls have, besides this, through divine election, the power of reason. It is reason that allows us to understand the universe as a system, through the use of models and idealizations, and thereby to grasp the eternal truths. In this way, argued Leibniz, human minds are not only mirrors of the universe of created things, but indeed mirror God himself.

Leibniz is committed to the view that, given God’s perfection, anything God creates must also be perfect—this is why the created world is the best possible world. This means that a large part of his writings are theodicean in spirit. Leibniz shares this spirit with his close contemporary, Anne Conway. Conway’s system is motivated by her desire to reject Cartesian dualism, Spinozism, and Hobbesian materialism. On her view, any commitment to the existence of material substance is a commitment to the existence of “dead mass”. Any such view is gravely mistaken. For, she holds that nature is shot through with the “vital principle of motion”, which has life and perception, qualities befitting any creation of God (Chapter IX, section 2). Conway thus rejects Descartes’s dualism, while nevertheless noting that because he accepts the immateriality of God, he is at least better than Hobbes, who holds that God is material. Finally, she registers that her disagreement with Spinoza has to do with his monism, which effaces any distinction between God and creatures (Chapter IX, section 3).

To avoid the problem that she identifies with Descartes and Hobbes, Conway asserts a monism: all creatures are composed of one kind of substance—spiritual. To avoid the problem she associates with Spinoza, Conway asserts that while only one (spiritual) substance exists, the universe is divided into three “species” that differ in their essences: creatures, Christ, and God. This tripartite separation is grounded on the basis of the changeability of the member(s) of the species: the essential feature of creatures is that they can change for the better and for the worse, the essential feature of Christ is that he can only change for the better, and God’s essence is that He is unchanging (Chapter VI, section 4). In postulating these three “species” of the one substance, Conway is able to assert God’s separation from creation, as well as a metaphysically and morally mediating role for Christ. This mediating role for Christ is of central importance to Conway’s theodicy. On her view, accepting this tripartite division of species “will contribute greatly to the propagation of the true faith and Christian religion among Jews and Turks and other infidel nations” (Chapter VI, section 5). This is because once we appreciate the reasoning in favor of a mediator between creatures and God, and we accept this reasoning, we believe in Christ whether we call the mediator by that name or not. In this way, Conway can answer a particularly difficult challenge to any Christian thinker: how can Christianity be the universal religion, in which salvation depends on knowing Christ, when so much of the Earth’s population is ignorant of Christ? On her system, she can assert that many people may know Christ as mediator, without knowing him by name or even by role in the Christian religion.

While the rise of British empiricism and of Kant’s critical philosophy marked the end of continental rationalism as a movement, the elegant visions of Leibniz and Conway are a fitting paean to the movement and, indeed, to the power of human reason.

6. Beyond Continental Rationalism: Other Voices

Since the early twentieth century, “continental rationalism” has been profitably juxtaposed with “British empiricism”. The juxtaposition turns on the notion that the rationalist views that were popular on the “continent” were contemporaneous with the empiricist views that dominated the philosophical conversations in Britain.

While the demarcation between rationalism and empiricism may be useful as an interpretive and pedagogical tool, it should be borne in mind that it is a construction in retrospect. The distinction between Empirici and Dogmatici is traceable from ancient Roman medicine to Baconian (both Roger and Francis) philosophy of science. While Kant and his early commentators imported the distinction into philosophy, the terminology of “rationalism” and “empiricism”, and the association of these terms with, respectively, the Continent and Britain emerged at the end of the nineteenth century (Aaron Wilson, 16–20).

In recent years scholars have problematized both the general rationalist/empiricist distinction and the “continental rationalism”/“British empiricism” divide. As Norton has shown, the “British” in “British Empiricism” can be called into question when we take notice of the important role played by the French philosopher Pierre Gassendi in the propagation of empiricist thinking in the period (Norton 1981). Indeed, British philosophers in the relevant historical period were far less disconnected from the Continent than they are today. Philosophical crossings from Britain were frequent and fruitful. In particular, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume all crossed the Channel. Further, Loeb (1981) argues with some plausibility that the rationalist-empiricist divide neglects strong rationalist strands in Locke’s and Berkeley’s thought. Increasingly, scholars of the early modern period (but again, recall Goldstone’s critique of early modernity as a periodization) are looking outside the bounds of the rationalist/empiricist distinction in order to more accurately capture the intersections and divergences present in the constellation of ideas in the period.

Indeed, problematizing the distinction between continental rationalism and British empiricism offers benefits beyond the possibility for greater interpretative nuance and accuracy. In earlier sections of this entry, we troubled the association of rationalism with the Continent by considering British philosophers Margaret Cavendish and Anne Conway alongside Malebranche and Leibniz, and Ghanaian philosopher Anton Amo alongside Descartes. A focus on seventeenth and eighteenth century rationalists, broadly conceived, as opposed to continental rationalists in particular, makes possible the inclusion in the conversation of other figures—notably, women and non-Europeans—who did not live on the Continent but who mark nodes of influence and importance in rationalist thought. Thus, an additional strong motivation to call the distinction into question is in an effort to include other voices in this period.

Before we consider two final rationalist women philosophers from Britain, a brief digression is in order on the degree to which rationalism permitted the philosophical participation of women (and to a lesser extent of racialized others).

It is by now a familiar trope that rationalism excludes women. Genevieve Lloyd famously argues that Descartes’s reconceptualization of reason as an attainment, and as an attainment achieved by pure mind uncorrupted by sensuality and society, unintentionally (but significantly) excludes women—whose domestic roles inevitably involved the sensual and the social (Lloyd 1984/1993, 40–51). Susan Bordo characterizes Cartesian “objectivism and mechanism” as a “flight from the female cosmos and ‘feminine’ orientation towards the world” (Bordo 1987, 100, emphasis in the original). Whether or not rationalism constitutively excludes women, it is clear that some individual rationalists do so. See, for instance, Hasana Sharp’s argument that Spinoza sees the better but does the worse in his assertion in the Political Treatise that women are naturally unequal to men (Sharp 2012).

Against the characterization of rationalism as excluding women, Margaret Atherton draws on Mary Astell and Damaris Lady Masham to argue that in fact rationalism offered a framework in which women (and, one presumes, members of non-European cultures) could do philosophy. By prescribing a method of reasoning that doesn’t hinge on a particular education or social standing, argues Atherton (after Astell), rationalism reconceptualizes reason as in principle possible for all humans—man and woman, Plow-man and Doctor (Atherton, 32). Erica Harth traces the history of sixteenth and seventeenth century French “salon women” and offers evidence that Descartes’s clear, jargon-free French and commitment to being intelligible by lay people made Cartesianism appealing to the women who regularly participated in philosophical salons. Further, Harth reconstructs the thought of the prominent salon women to show that they extend Cartesianism in novel ways (Harth 1991). However, she notes that most of what comes down to us from French Cartesianism of the day originated in the male-only academy, and not the salons.

Whatever the remaining legacy of Cartesian women in France, Astell remains an important interpreter and proponent of Descartes’s epistemological method, a method she explicitly endorses as the basis for supporting the education of, and philosophical inquiry by, women. In her two-part 1694 and 1697 A Serious Proposal to the Ladies: Wherein a Method is offer’d for the Improvement of their Minds, Astell urges that meditation (in Descartes’s sense of that term) avails itself to all who apply themselves to it with dedication. She admits that those (women or labourers, for instance) whose circumstances do not permit them to contemplate truth may at first find such contemplation unfruitful. However, she proposes reading, discoursing, and serious meditation as remedies to this situation. While Astell rejects the view that some people’s embodiment make them more suited for practical than intellectual pursuits, she acknowledges that some reasoners’ animal spirits may incline them to volatility of thought; she therefore counsels reasoners to withdraw their minds from their bodies and the material world. Alice Sowaal identifies in Astell three central rationalist themes: “an emphasis of the mind over the body; a theory of innate ideas as the origin of knowledge; and a methodology that leads the novice from confusion to clarity” (Sowaal). Astell bolsters her Cartesian method with a theological argument that God would not create naturally defective rational beings, and hence that all human beings are capable of rational thought. If women are at first unable to reason well, it is the result of their circumstances and not their nature, she argues. Astell thus both draws on Descartes and anticipates Wollstonecraft.

Relaxing the criteria for inclusion in the “rationalist” camp also invites us to appropriately situate the rationalism of Scottish philosopher Mary Shepherd. Shepherd was a sharp critic of Hume’s endorsement of the causal system we might call “Malebranche without God”. Shepherd raised her objections to Hume’s theory on the basis of her commitment to the superiority of reason for knowledge, and in particular knowledge of the truths of causation. Here we see that she shares at least one characteristic of those typically ascribed to rationalists, the exaltation of reason over the senses in knowledge acquisition. In An Essay Upon the Relation of Cause and Effect (1824), Shepherd seeks to dismantle Hume’s causal theory of constant conjunction by arguing that we can indeed have intuitive knowledge that everything that exists requires a cause. Moreover, on her view, it is reason, not “custom” or “habit”, that is our chief guide in the understanding of our daily lives (27–28). Shepherd’s critique of Hume is important in its own right as a valuable contribution to the philosophical conversation of her age. It is also, however, representative of the way that the rationalist perspective was being articulated in the first quarter of the 19th century. As such, it marks a moment in the history of rationalism. Putting Shepherd into conversation with her fellow rationalists across time only serves to deepen and broaden our understanding of this line of thinking.

In sum then, while the notion of continental rationalism can be a useful heuristic, especially for teaching and learning, it ought not to be a strict criterion. A less restrictive conception of rationalism not only supports a more historically accurate, nuanced understanding of philosophical movements in the period; it also renders the rationalist canon more diverse. As historians of philosophy increasingly work to develop more inclusive canons, such a reconceptualization is all to the good.


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  • Opuscules et Fragments Inédits de Leibniz, L. Couturat (ed.), Paris: Felix Alcan, 1903.
  • Leibnizens Mathematische Schriften, C. I. Gerhardt (ed.), Berlin: Weidman, 1875–90.
  • Die Philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, C.I. Gerhardt (ed.), Berlin: Weidman, 1875–90. Theodicy, A. Farrer (ed.) and E. Huggard (trans.), New Haven: Yale University Press, 1952.
  • Philosophical Papers and Letters, L. Loemker (ed.), 2nd ed., Dordrecht: Reidel, 1969. Philosophical Writings, M. Morris and G. Parkinson (eds. and trans.), London: Dent, 1973.
  • New Essays on Human Understanding, P. Remnant and J. Bennett (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982.
  • Leibniz: Selections, P. Wiener (Ed.), New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1951.

Secondary Sources

  • Abraham, William, 1964, “The Life and Times of Anton Wilhelm Amo”, Transactions of the Historical Society of Ghana, 7: 60–81. [A biography of Amo.]
  • Adams, Robert Merrihew, 1994, Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist, Oxford: Oxford University Press. [A careful and penetrating study that benefits from the author’s extensive of knowledge of Leibniz’s oeuvre.]
  • Allison, Henry, 1987, Benedict de Spinoza: An Introduction, New Haven: Yale University Press. [A classic work by an eminent Spinoza scholar. Suitable for beginners, but also useful for those well-versed in Spinoza.]
  • Atherton, Margaret, 1993, “Cartesian Reason and Gendered Reason”, A Mind of One’s Own: Feminist Essays on Reason and Objectivity, Eds. Louise Antony and Charlotte Witt, Boulder: Westview Press. [Against arguments that Descartes’s conception of rationality served to exclude women, Atherton here adduces evidence that some early modern women philosophers regarded Cartesian reason as egalitarian, and were encouraged by it in their work.]
  • –––, 1996, “Lady Mary Shepherd’s Case Against George Berkeley”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 4(2): 347–366. [An analysis of Shepherd’s objections to Hume, and the manner in which she distinguishes her view from Berkeley’s.]
  • –––, 2005, “Reading Lady Mary Shepherd”, The Harvard Review of Philosophy, 13(2):73–85. [An introduction to both Shepherd’s biography and her philosophical disputes with Dugald Stewart and John Fearn.]
  • Bennett, Jonathan, 1984, A Study of Spinoza’s Ethics, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing. [A clear, penetrating study of Spinoza whose arguments and analogies have entered the scholarly idiom. Essential reading for Spinozists.]
  • Bermúdez, José Luis, 1997, “Scepticism and Science in Descartes”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 57(4): 743–772. [An argument for separating the importance of scepticism for motivating Descartes’s project and our interpretation of him as a canonical rationalist.]
  • Bolton, Martha Brandt, 201, “Causality and Causal Induction: The Necessitarian Theory of Lady Mary Shepherd”, in Causation and Modern Philosophy, Keith Allen and Tom Stoneham (eds.), 242–261. New York/Routledge. [A detailed look at Shepherd’s views of cause, causal principles, and mathematical induction. The latter topic includes some discussion of Shepherd’s dispute with Dugald Stewart.]
  • Bordo, Susan, 1987, The Flight to Objectivity: Essays on Cartesianism and Culture, Albany: State University of New York Press. [A classic feminist psychoanalytic study of Descartes’s Meditations. Inter alia, Bordo argues that Descartes reconceives rationality as paradigmatically masculine.]
  • Boyle, Deborah, 2009, Descartes on Innate Ideas, London: Continuum. [A comprehensive study of Descartes’s nativism. Boyle argues that, for Descartes, we have implicit knowledge of our innate ideas, and that reflection is required to make the knowledge explicit. The volume includes a thorough survey and critique of the secondary literature on innate ideas in Descartes.]
  • Bryson, Cynthia B, 1998, “Mary Astell: Defender of the ‘Disembodied Mind’”, Hypatia, 13(4): 40–62. [An argument in favor of Astell being the first English, woman feminist. Bryson argues that Astell’s version of Cartesian dualism allows her to reject the subordination of women, and her rejection of the possibility of “thinking matter” allows her to reject the kinds of social contracts between men and women that Locke endorsed in his political system.]
  • Carriero, John, 1995, “On the Relationship Between Mode and Substance in Spinoza’s Metaphysics”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 33(2): 245–73. [Carriero traces the medieval Aristotelian influence of Spinoza’s substance/mode distinction, and in so doing challenges Curley’s argument that Spinozist modal dependence is causal dependence.]
  • Cottingham, John, 1984, Rationalism, London: Paladin Books. [A concise, accessible survey of issues in both early modern and contemporary rationalism.]
  • Curley, Edwin, 1988, Behind the Geometric Method, Princeton: Princeton University Press. [A brief, persuasive argument for a naturalistic understanding of Spinoza’s Ethics by a leader in the field.]
  • Della Rocca, Michael, 1996, Representation and the Mind-Body Problem in Spinoza, Oxford: Oxford University Press. [The authoritative work on Spinoza’s theory of ideas.]
  • –––, 2005, “Descartes, the Cartesian Circle, and Epistemology without God”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 70(1): 1–33. [An interpretation of Descartes’s system that would allow him to escape the circle objection.]
  • –––, 2008, Spinoza, London and New York: Routledge. [An accessible introduction to Spinoza’s main doctrines, with a useful sketch of the historical context.]
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2006, “Atomism, Monism, and Causation in the Natural Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish”, Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, 3: 199–240. [A discussion of the tension between Cavendish’s monism and her anti-atomism.]
  • Donagan, Alan, 1988, Spinoza, Chicago: University of Chicago Press. [A spare, compulsively readable interpretation of Spinoza’s mature work as a whole, with an emphasis on his naturalism.]
  • Fantl, Jeremy, 2016, “Mary Shepherd on Causal Necessity”, Metaphysica, 17(1): 87–108. [An argument that Shepherd’s anti-Humeanism is actually stronger than has been heretofore appreciated.]
  • Fraenkel, Carlos, Dario Perinetti, and Justin Smith, Eds, 2010, The Rationalists: Between Tradition and Innovation, Dordrecht: Springer. [Essays on varied topics by key thinkers in the field, all of them devoted to understanding and problematizing the category of rationalism by considering aspects of key rationalist figures in their historical contexts.]
  • Frankfurt, Harry, 1965, “Descartes’ Validation of Reason”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 2: 149–56. [A seminal work dealing with the alleged circularity of Descartes’s Meditations.]
  • Garber, Daniel and Michael Ayers, Eds., 1998, The Cambridge History of Seventeenth Century Philosophy, 2 vols., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [This collection provides a comprehensive look at the relevant philosophical period, with invaluable material about the historical and social context.]
  • Garrett, Don, Ed., 1996, The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press. [Essays on all aspects of Spinoza’s thought by top Spinoza scholars.]
  • Goldstone, Jack, 1998, “The Problem of the ‘Early Modern’ World”, Journal of the Economic and Social History of the Orient, 41(3): 249–284. [An influential problematization of the “early modern” periodization that in particular identifies the eurocentrism and the myth of progress on which the periodization trades. Goldstone also explores inconsistencies between the manner in which the boundaries of the early modern era are drawn and usual conventions in historical periodization.]
  • Guéroult, Martial, 1968, Spinoza I: Dieu, Paris: Georg Olms. [Guéroult is credited with having dealt Wolfson’s subjectivist account of Spinoza’s attributes its death blow.]
  • Hagengruber, Ruth, 2015, “Cutting Through the Veil of Ignorance: Rewriting the History of Philosophy”, The Monist, 98: 34–42. [An argument in favor of taking the philosophical writings of women through the history of philosophy as contributions of general relevance to this history.]
  • Harth, Erica, 1991, “Cartesian Women”, Yale French Studies 80: 146–164. [A useful study of the thought of French Cartesian women, especially those who were prominent in the philosophical salons of the seventeenth century.]
  • Huenemann, Charles, 2008, Understanding Rationalism, Durham, UK: Acumen. [A clear and helpful introduction to Descartes, Spinoza and Leibniz, written for college juniors.]
  • Ishiguro, Hidé, 1972, Leibniz’s Philosophy of Logic and Language, Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press. [A clear, untechnical discussion of Leibniz’s arguments considered in light of contemporary angloamerican logic.]
  • Jolley, Nicholas (editor), 1995, The Cambridge Companion to Leibniz, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [Essays on all aspects of Leibniz’s thought by top Leibniz scholars.]
  • Kenny, Anthony, 1998, “Descartes on the Will”, in John Cottingham (ed.), Descartes, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pages 132–60. First appeared in R.J. Butler (ed.), 1973, Cartesian Studies, New York: Barnes and Noble. [Articulation of the “freedom of perversity” interpretation of Descartes’s discussions with Mesland on freedom.]
  • Kenny, Anthony (editor), 1986, Rationalism, Empiricism and Idealism, Oxford: Oxford University Press. [A useful collection, mostly of lectures delivered at the British Academy by leading scholars of early modern philosophy.]
  • Krause, Andrej, 2009, “Amo’s Ontology”, Philosophia Africana, 12(2): 141–157. [A discussion of Amo’s general ontology and how it informs his commitment to the insensitivity of the human soul.]
  • Lascano, Marcy, 2013, “Anne Conway: Bodies in the Spiritual World”, Philosophy Compass, 8(4): 327–336. [A defense of Conway’s articulation of her monism, with an emphasis on the important role for “body” in a system where the only substance is spirit.]
  • Lennon, Thomas M., 1993, The Battle of the Gods and Giants: The Legacies of Descartes and Gassendi, 1655–1715, Princeton: Princeton University Press. [An account of the contest between the Cartesians and their principal opponents as an extension of the battle that Plato depicts in the Sophist between the materialists and the friends of the forms.]
  • Lewis, Geneviève (Rodis), 1950, L’individualité selon Descartes, Paris: J.Vrin. [Discusses all the texts on both sides of the question of the uniqueness of extended substance.]
  • Lin, Martin, 2011, “Rationalism and Necessitarianism”, Noûs, 46(3): 418–448. [A discussion of Spinoza’s and Leibniz’s disagreement over whether metaphysical rationalism leads to necessitarianism.]
  • Lloyd, Genevieve, 1993, The Man of Reason: “Male” and “Female” in Western Philosophy, 2nd Ed., London: Routledge [This influential feminist study traces the construction of reason as masculine in the history of Western philosophy. Lloyd sees Descartes’s method as a crucial move in the historical philosophical centering of masculine thought.]
  • Loeb, Louis, 1981, From Descartes to Hume: Continental Metaphysics and the Development of Modern Philosophy, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press. [Loeb famously challenges the rationalist-empiricist divide, arguing that important aspects of Locke’s and Berkeley’s thought are rationalist in character.]
  • Mates, Benson, 1986, The Philosophy of Leibniz: Metaphysics & Language, Oxford: Oxford University Press. [An internalist reading of Leibniz focusing in particular on logical issues and on Leibniz’s nominalism.]
  • McCracken, Charles J., 1983, Malebranche and British Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press. [A classic account of Malebranche’s influence on British philosophy, which also contains a wonderful 100 page account of Malebranche’s system.]
  • Melamed, Yitzhak, 2013, “Spinoza’s Metaphysics of Thought: Parallelisms and the Multifaceted Structure of Ideas”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 86(3): 636–683. [A reinterpretation of Spinozist parallelism that seeks to resolve why human beings can only know two of substance’s infinite attributes.]
  • Merchant, Carolyn, 1979, “The Vitalism of Anne Conway: Its Impact on Leibniz’s Concept of the Monad”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 17(3): 255–269. [A discussion of Conway’s system, and her influence on Leibniz.]
  • Moreau, Joseph, 1947, “Malebranche et le spinozisme”, in Joseph Moreau (ed.), Malebranche: Correspondance avec J.-J. Dortous de Mairan, Paris: Vrin, pages 1–99. [Moreau provides an excellent introduction to and analysis of this correspondence in his introduction to this edition of the correspondence.]
  • Nadler, Steven., Ed., 1993, Causation in Early Modern Philosophy: Cartesianism, Occasionalism, and Preestablished Harmony, University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press. [A collection of essays concerning the three main rationalist theories of causation. The essays in this collection consider not only the major figures discussed in the above article, but also a number of intermediate and minor figures.]
  • Nelson, Alan, Ed., 2005, A Companion to Rationalism, Oxford, Blackwell. [An ably edited collection of essays devoted to the historical antecedents of rationalism, to the movement’s “golden age” and to rationalist elements in contemporary thought.]
  • Norton, David Fate, 1981, “The Myth of British Empiricism”, History of European Ideas, 1(4): 331–344. [An argument problematizing the very category of “British Empiricism.”]
  • Okruhlik, Kathleen and James R. Brown, Eds., 1985, The Natural Philosophy of Leibniz, Dordrecht: D. Reidel. [A challenging collection devoted to the role of physics and natural philosophy in the development of Leibniz’s thought.]
  • Perry, Ruth, 1986, The Celebrated Mary Astell: An Early English Feminist, Chicago, University of Chicago Press. [An influential intellectual biography of Astell.]
  • Peterman, Alison, 2015, “Spinoza on Extension”, Philosophers’ Imprint, 15(14): 1–23. [An argument against the interpretation that Spinoza takes extension in space to be a fundamental property of physical things.]
  • Rozemond, Marleen, 1998, Descartes’s Dualism, Cambridge: Harvard University Press. [A thorough account of the topic indicated, including valuable scholastic background.]
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1992, A Critical Exposition of the Philosophy of Leibniz, London: Routledge. [First published in 1900, this work includes Russell’s classic arguments that the basis of Leibniz’s thought lies in his Aristotelian logic, and that, for Leibniz, relational properties are merely ideal.]
  • Schmaltz, Tad, 2002, Radical Cartesianism: The French reception of Descartes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [A treatment of those few—specifically, Desgabets and Régis—who accepted Descartes’s doctrine of created truth.]
  • Shapiro, Lisa, 2007, “Volume Editor’s Introduction”, in Lisa Shapiro (ed. & trans.), The Correspondence Between Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia and René Descartes, Chicago: University of Chicago Press. [The definitive analysis of this correspondence.]
  • –––, 2008, “Princess Elisabeth and Descartes: The Union of Soul and Body and the Practice of Philosophy”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 7(3): 503–520. [An argument in favor of viewing Elisabeth as a philosopher in her own right, and not merely a correspondent of Descartes.]
  • Sharp, Hasana, 2012, “Eve’s Perfection: Spinoza on Sexual (In)Equality”, Journal of the History of Philosophy 50(4): 559–580. [A study of inconsistencies in Spinoza’s account of women’s capacities.]
  • Smith, Justin, 2015, Nature, Human Nature, & Human Difference: Race in Early Modern Philosophy, Princeton: Princeton University Press. [A useful study of the construction of race in early modernity and its interactions with the philosophical thought of the day.]
  • Sowaal, Alice, 2004, “Cartesian Bodies”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 34(2): 217–40. [This useful article sorts Descartes’s inconsistent language about substance in terms of levels.]
  • –––, 2007, “Mary Astell’s Serious Proposal: Mind, Method, and Custom”, Philosophy Compass, 2(2): 227–243. [A discussion of Astell’s theory of mind.]
  • –––, 2015, “Mary Astell”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2015 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Sutherland, Christine Mason, 2005, The Eloquence of Mary Astell, Calgary: University of Calgary Press. [A recent study of Astell’s importance as a rhetorician.]
  • Tollefsen, Deborah, 1999, “Princess Elisabeth and the Problem of Mind-Body Interaction”, Hypatia, 14(3): 59–77. [A discussion of Elisabeth’s objections to Descartes’s dualism.]
  • Wilson, Aaron, 2016, Peirce’s Empiricism: Its Roots and Its Originality, Lanham: Lexington Books. [This study of American Pragmatist Charles Sanders Peirce contains a useful chapter on the history of the rationalism-empiricism distinction.]
  • Wilson, Margaret Dauler, 1982, Descartes, New York: Routledge. [See Chapter Three for a clear and useful discussion of Descartes’s doctrine of created truths.]
  • Wiredu, Kwasi, 2004, “Amo’s Critique of Descartes’ Philosophy of Mind”, in Kwasi Wiredu (ed.), A Companion to African Philosophy, Malden, Massachusetts: Blackwell Publishing, Ltd., pages 200–206. [Introduction to Amo’s biography, and main lines of his critique against Descartes’s theory of mind.]
  • Wolfson, Harry, 1934, The Philosophy of Spinoza, 2 vols., Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. [Wolfson’s is still the classic argument for the subjectivist account of attributes in Spinoza.]
  • Woolhouse, R.S., 1993, Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz: The Concept of Substance in Seventeenth Century Metaphysics, London and New York: Routledge. [A deep account of many of the themes covered here, with something of value for readers at all levels.]

Other Internet Resources

  • Catholic Encyclopedia, maintained by Kevin Knight of the New Advent Catholic website. Includes entries on all of the figures discussed in the above article.
  • Descartes E Il Seicento, maintained by Giulia Belgioioso (Director, Centro Interdipartmentali Di Studi Su Descartes E Il Seicento), Jean-Robert Armogathe (Centre d’études cartésiennes) et al.
  • Leibnitiana, maintained by Gregory Brown at the University of Houston.
  • Leibniz, maintained by Jan Cover of the Purdue University Department of Philosophy.
  • Necessarily Eternal, this so-called “Catablog of (All) Things Spinoza” has not been updated since 2009. Nonetheless, it houses a very impressive linked list of active Spinoza scholars and other useful resources.
  • Project Vox, maintained by Duke University, is a valuable online resource that aims to give voice to Early Modern women philosophers, whose voices have been unjustly ignored through most of history. You can find bibliographies, biographies, teaching tools, and images here.
  • Studia Spinoziana, maintained by Ron Bombardi, Department of Philosophy, Middle Tennessee State University.

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Thomas M. Lennon

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