Nicolaus Copernicus

First published Tue Nov 30, 2004; substantive revision Fri Sep 29, 2023

Nicolaus Copernicus (1473–1543) was a mathematician and astronomer who proposed that the sun was stationary in the center of the universe and the earth revolved around it. Disturbed by the failure of Ptolemy’s geocentric model of the universe to follow Aristotle’s requirement for the uniform circular motion of all celestial bodies. Copernicus decided that he could achieve his goal only through a heliocentric model. He thereby created a concept of a universe in which the distances of the planets from the sun bore a direct relationship to the size of their orbits. At the time Copernicus’s heliocentric idea was very controversial; nevertheless, it was the start of a change in the way the world was viewed, and Copernicus came to be seen as the initiator of what is commonly known as the Scientific Revolution.

1. Life and Works

Nicolaus Copernicus was born on 19 February 1473, the youngest of four children of Nicolaus Copernicus, Sr., a well-to-do merchant who had moved to Torun from Cracow, and Barbara Watzenrode, the daughter of a leading merchant family in Torun. The city, on the Vistula River, had been an important inland port in the Hanseatic League. However, fighting between the Order of the Teutonic Knights and the Prussian Union in alliance with the Kingdom of Poland ended in 1466, and West Prussia, which included Torun, was ceded to Poland, and Torun was declared a free city of the Polish kingdom. Thus the child of a German family was a subject of the Polish crown.

The father died in 1483, and the children’s maternal uncle, Lucas Watzenrode (1447–1512), took them under his protection. Watzenrode was a very successful cleric – he was to become bishop of Warmia (Ermland in German) in 1489 – and he both facilitated his nephew’s advancement in the church and directed his education. In 1491 Copernicus enrolled in the University of Cracow. There is no record of his having obtained a degree, which was not unusual at the time as he did not need a bachelor’s degree for his ecclesiastical career or even to study for a higher degree. But the University of Cracow offered courses in mathematics, astronomy, and astrology (see Goddu 25–33 on all the university offerings), and Copernicus’s interest was sparked, which is attested to by his acquisition of books in these subjects while at Cracow.[1]

In 1495 Watzenrode arranged Copernicus’s election as canon of the chapter of Frombork (Frauenberg in German) of the Cathedral Chapter of Warmia, an administrative position just below that of bishop. He assumed the post two years later, and his financial situation was secure for life. In the meantime, following in his uncle’s footsteps, Copernicus went to the University of Bologna in 1496 to study canon law (see Goddu part 2 on what Copernicus may have encountered in Italy). While at Bologna he lived with the astronomy professor Domenico Maria Novara and made his first astronomical observations. In addition, as Rosen (1971, 323) noted, “In establishing close contact with Novara, Copernicus met, perhaps for the first time in his life, a mind that dared to challenge the authority of [Ptolemy] the most eminent ancient writer in his chosen fields of study.” Copernicus also gave a lecture on mathematics in Rome, which may have focused on astronomy.

Copernicus’s studies at Bologna provided an advantage he did not have at Cracow – a teacher of Greek. Humanism began to infiltrate the Italian universities in the fifteenth century. As Grendler (510) remarked, “By the last quarter of the century, practically all universities had one or several humanists, many of them major scholars.” Antonio Cortesi Urceo, called Codro, became professor at Bologna in 1482 and added Greek several years later. Copernicus may have studied with him, for Copernicus translated into Latin the letters of the seventh-century Byzantine author Theophylactus Simocatta (MW 27–71) from the 1499 edition of a collection of Greek letters produced by the Venetian humanist printer Aldus Manutius. Aldus had dedicated his edition to Urceo. Copernicus had his translation printed in 1509, his only publication prior to the On the Revolutions (De revolutionibus). It is important to note that Copernicus’s acquisition of a good reading knowledge of Greek was critical for his studies in astronomy because major works by Greek astronomers, including Ptolemy, had not yet been translated into Latin, the language of the universities at the time.

Copernicus left Bologna for Frombork in 1501 without having obtained his degree. The chapter then approved another leave of absence for Copernicus to study medicine at the University of Padua. The medical curriculum did not just include medicine, anatomy, and the like when Copernicus studied it. Siraisi (1990, 16) noted that “the reception in twelfth-century western Europe of Greek and Islamic technical astronomy and astrology fostered the development of medical astrology…the actual practice of medical astrology was greatest in the West between the fourteenth and the sixteenth centuries.” Astrology was taught in the medical schools of Italy. “The importance attached to the study of the stars in medieval medical education derived from a general and widely held belief that the heavenly bodies play an intermediary role in the creation of things here below and continue to influence them throughout their existence. The actual uses of astrology in medical diagnosis and treatment by learned physicians were many and various. ‘Astrological medicine’ is a vague and unsatisfactory term that can embrace any or all of the following: first, to pay attention to the supposed effect of astrological birth signs or signs at conception on the constitution and character of one’s patients; second, to vary treatment according to various celestial conditions…third, to connect the doctrine of critical days in illness with astrological features, usually phases of the moon; and fourth, to predict or explain epidemics with reference to planetary conjunctions, the appearance of comets, or weather conditions” (Siraisi 1981, 141–42). It is true that astrology required that medical students acquire some grounding in astronomy; nevertheless, it is likely that Copernicus studied astrology while at the University of Padua.[2]

Copernicus did not receive his medical degree from Padua; the degree would have taken three years, and Copernicus had only been granted a two-year leave of absence by his chapter. Instead he matriculated in the University of Ferrara, from which he obtained a doctorate in canon law. But he did not return to his chapter in Frombork; rather he went to live with his uncle in the episcopal palace in Lidzbark-Warminski (Heilsberg in German). Although he made some astronomical observations, he was immersed in church politics, and after his elderly uncle became ill in 1507, Copernicus was his attending physician. Rosen (1971, 334–35) reasonably conjectured that the bishop may have hoped that his nephew would be his successor, but Copernicus left his uncle because his duties in Lidzbark-Warminski interfered with his continuing pursuit of his studies in astronomy. He took up residence in his chapter of Frombork in 1510 and stayed there the rest of his life.

Not that leaving his uncle and moving to Frombork exempted Copernicus from continued involvement in administrative and political duties. He was responsible for the administration of various holdings, which involved heading the provisioning fund, adjudicating disputes, attending meetings, and keeping accounts and records. In response to the problem he found with the local currency, he drafted an essay on coinage (MW 176–215) in which he deplored the debasement of the currency and made recommendations for reform. His manuscripts were consulted by the leaders of both Prussia and Poland in their attempts to stabilize the currency. He was a leader for West Prussia in the war against the Teutonic Knights, which lasted from 1520–1525. He was physician for the bishop (his uncle had died in 1512) and members of the chapter, and he was consulting physician for notables in East and West Prussia.

Nevertheless, Copernicus began to work on astronomy on his own. Sometime between 1510 and 1514 he wrote an essay that has come to be known as the Commentariolus (MW 75–126) that introduced his new cosmological idea, the heliocentric universe, and he sent copies to various astronomers. He continued making astronomical observations whenever he could, hampered by the poor position for observations in Frombork and his many pressing responsibilities as canon. Nevertheless, he kept working on his manuscript of On the Revolutions. He also wrote what is known as Letter against Werner (MW 145–65) in 1524, a critique of Johann Werner’s “Letter concerning the Motion of the Eighth Sphere” (De motu octavae sphaerae tractatus primus). Copernicus claimed that Werner erred in his calculation of time and his belief that before Ptolemy the movement of the fixed stars was uniform, but Copernicus’s letter did not refer to his cosmological ideas.

In 1539 a young mathematician named Georg Joachim Rheticus (1514–1574) from the University of Wittenberg came to study with Copernicus. Rheticus brought Copernicus books in mathematics, in part to show Copernicus the quality of printing that was available in the German-speaking cities. He published an introduction to Copernicus’s ideas, the Narratio prima (First Report). Most importantly, he convinced Copernicus to publish On the Revolutions. Rheticus oversaw most of the printing of the book, and on 24 May 1543 Copernicus held a copy of the finished work on his deathbed.

2. Astronomical Ideas and Writings

2.1 Pre-Copernican Astronomy

Classical astronomy followed principles established by Aristotle. Aristotle accepted the idea that there were four physical elements – earth, water, air, and fire. He put the earth in the center of the universe and contended that these elements were below the moon, which was the closest celestial body. There were seven planets, or wandering stars, because they had a course through the zodiac in addition to traveling around the earth: the moon, Mercury, Venus, the sun, Mars, Jupiter. Beyond that were the fixed stars. The physical elements, according to Aristotle moved vertically, depending on their ‘heaviness’ or ‘gravity’; the celestial bodies were not physical but a ‘fifth element’ or ‘quintessence’ whose nature was to move in perfect circles around the earth, making a daily rotation. Aristotle envisioned the earth as the true center of all the circles or ‘orbs’ carrying the heavenly bodies around it and all motion as ‘uniform,’ that is, unchanging.

But observers realized that the heavenly bodies did not move as Aristotle postulated. The earth was not the true center of the orbits and the motion was not uniform. The most obvious problem was that the outer planets seemed to stop, move backwards in ‘retrograde’ motion for a while, and then continue forwards. By the second century, when Ptolemy compiled his Almagest (this common name of Ptolemy’s Syntaxis was derived from its Arabic title), astronomers had developed the concept that the orbit moves in ‘epicycles’ around a ‘deferrent,’ that is, they move like a flat heliacal coil around a circle around the earth. The earth was also off-center, on an ‘eccentric,’ as the heavenly bodies moved around a central point. Ptolemy added a point on a straight line opposite the eccentric, which is called the ‘equalizing point’ or the ‘equant,’ and around this point the heavenly bodies moved uniformly. Moreover, unlike the Aristotelian model, Ptolemy’s Almagest did not describe a unified universe. The ancient astronomers who followed Ptolemy, however, were not concerned if his system did not describe the ‘true’ motions of the heavenly bodies; their concern was to ‘save the phenomena,’ that is, give a close approximation of where the heavenly bodies would be at a given point in time. And in an age without professional astronomers, let alone the telescope, Ptolemy did a good job plotting the courses of the heavenly bodies.

Not all Greek astronomical ideas followed this geocentric system. Pythagoreans suggested that the earth moved around a central fire (not the sun). Archimedes wrote that Aristarchus of Samos actually proposed that the earth rotated daily and revolved around the sun.[3]

During the European Middle Ages, the Islamic world was the center of astronomical thought and activity. During the ninth century several aspects of Ptolemy’s solar theory were recalculated. Ibn al-Haytham in the tenth-eleventh century wrote a scathing critique of Ptolemy’s work: “Ptolemy assumed an arrangement that cannot exist, and the fact that this arrangement produces in his imagination the motions that belong to the planets does not free him from the error he committed in his assumed arrangement, for the existing motions of the planets cannot be the result of an arrangement that is impossible to exist” (quoted in Rosen 1984, 174). Swerdlow and Neugebauer (46–48) stressed that the thirteenth-century Maragha school was also important in finding errors and correcting Ptolemy: “The method of the Maragha planetary models was to break up the equant motion in Ptolemy’s models into two or more components of uniform circular motion, physically the uniform rotation of spheres, that together control the direction and distance of the center of the epicycle, so that it comes to lie in nearly the same position it would have in Ptolemy’s model, and always moves uniformly with respect to the equant.” They found that Copernicus used devices that had been developed by the Maragha astronomers Nasir al-Din Tusi (1201–1274), Muayyad al-Din al-Urdi (d. 1266), Qutb al-Din al-Shirazi (1236–1311), and Ibn al-Shatir (1304–1375). In addition, Ragep, 2005, has shown that a theory for the inner planets presented by Regiomontanus that enabled Copernicus to convert the planets to eccentric models had been developed by the fifteenth-century, Samarqand-trained astronomer ali Qushji (1403–1474).[4]

Renaissance humanism did not necessarily promote natural philosophy, but its emphasis on mastery of classical languages and texts had the side effect of promoting the sciences. Georg Peurbach (1423–1461) and (Johannes Müller) Regiomontanus (1436–1476) studied Greek for the purpose of producing an outline of Ptolemaic astronomy. By the time Regiomontanus finished the work in 1463, it was an important commentary on the Almagest as well, pointing out, for example, that Ptolemy’s lunar theory did not accord with observations. He noted that Ptolemy showed the moon to be at various times twice as far from the earth as at other times, which should make the moon appear twice as big. At the time, moreover, there was active debate over Ptolemy’s deviations from Aristotle’s requirement of uniform circular motion.

2.2 The Commentariolus

It is impossible to date when Copernicus first began to espouse the heliocentric theory. Had he done so during his lecture in Rome, such a radical theory would have occasioned comment, but there was none, so it is likely that he adopted this theory after 1500. Further, Corvinus, who helped him print his Latin translation in 1508–09, expressed admiration for his knowledge of astronomy, so that Copernicus’s concept may have still been traditional at this point. His first heliocentric writing was his Commentariolus. It was a small manuscript that was circulated but never printed. We do not know when he wrote this, but a professor in Cracow cataloged his books in 1514 and made reference to a “manuscript of six leaves expounding the theory of an author who asserts that the earth moves while the sun stands still” (Rosen, 1971, 343; MW 75). Thus, Copernicus probably adopted the heliocentric theory sometime between 1508 and 1514. Rosen (1971, 345) suggested that Copernicus’s “interest in determining planetary positions in 1512–1514 may reasonably be linked with his decisions to leave his uncle’s episcopal palace in 1510 and to build his own outdoor observatory in 1513.” In other words, it was the result of a period of intense concentration on cosmology that was facilitated by his leaving his uncle and the attendant focus on church politics and medicine.

It is impossible to know exactly why Copernicus began to espouse the heliocentric cosmology. Despite his importance in the history of philosophy, there is a paucity of primary sources on Copernicus. His only astronomical writings were the Commentariolus, the Letter against Werner, and On the Revolutions; he published his translation of Theophylactus’s letters and wrote the various versions of his treatise on coinage; other writings relate to diocesan business, as do most of the few letters that survive. Sadly, the biography by Rheticus, which should have provided scholars with an enormous amount of information, has been lost. Therefore, many of the answers to the most interesting questions about Copernicus’s ideas and works have been the result of conjecture and inference, and we can only guess why Copernicus adopted the heliocentric system.

Most scholars believe that the reason Copernicus rejected Ptolemaic cosmology was because of Ptolemy’s equant.[5] They assume this because of what Copernicus wrote in the Commentariolus:

Yet the widespread [planetary theories], advanced by Ptolemy and most other [astronomers], although consistent with the numerical [data], seemed likewise to present no small difficulty. For these theories were not adequate unless they also conceived certain equalizing circles, which made the planet appear to move at all times with uniform velocity neither on its deferent sphere nor about its own [epicycle’s] center…Therefore, having become aware of these [defects], I often considered whether there could perhaps be found a more reasonable arrangement of circles, from which every apparent irregularity would be derived while everything in itself would move uniformly, as is required by the rule of perfect motion. (MW 81).

Goddu (381–84) has plausibly maintained that while the initial motivation for Copernicus was dissatisfaction with the equant, that dissatisfaction may have impelled him to observe other violations of uniform circular motion, and those observations, not the rejection of the equant by itself, led to the heliocentric theory. Blumenberg (254) has pointed out that the mobility of the earth may have been reinforced by the similarity of its spherical shape to those of the heavenly bodies.

As the rejection of the equant suggests a return to the Aristotelian demand for true uniform circular motion of the heavenly bodies, it is unlikely that Copernicus adopted the heliocentric model because philosophies popular among Renaissance humanists like Neoplatonism and Hermetism compelled him in that direction.[6] Nor should we attribute Copernicus’s desire for uniform circular motions to an aesthetic need, for this idea was philosophical not aesthetic, and Copernicus’s replacing the equant with epicyclets made his system more complex than Ptolemy’s. Most importantly, we should bear in mind what Swerdlow and Neugebauer (59) asserted:

Copernicus arrived at the heliocentric theory by a careful analysis of planetary models – and as far as is known, he was the only person of his age to do so – and if he chose to adopt it, he did so on the basis of an equally careful analysis.

In the Commentariolus Copernicus listed assumptions that he believed solved the problems of ancient astronomy. Bardi has suggested that these assumptions are non-Euclidean axioms. Copernicus stated that the earth is only the center of gravity and center of the moon’s orbit; that all the spheres encircle the sun, which is close to the center of the universe; that the universe is much larger than previously assumed, and the earth’s distance to the sun is a small fraction of the size of the universe; that the apparent motion of the heavens and the sun is created by the motion of the earth; and that the apparent retrograde motion of the planets is created by the earth’s motion. Although the Copernican model maintained epicycles moving along the deferrent, which explained retrograde motion in the Ptolemaic model, Copernicus correctly explained that the retrograde motion of the planets was only apparent not real, and its appearance was due to the fact that the observers were not at rest in the center. The work dealt very briefly with the order of the planets (Mercury, Venus, earth, Mars, Jupiter, and Saturn, the only planets that could be observed with the naked eye), the triple motion of the earth (the daily rotation, the annual revolution of its center, and the annual revolution of its inclination) that causes the sun to seem to be in motion, the motions of the equinoxes, the revolution of the moon around the earth, and the revolution of the five planets around the sun.

2.3 On the Revolutions

The Commentariolus was only intended as an introduction to Copernicus’s ideas, and he wrote “the mathematical demonstrations intended for my larger work should be omitted for brevity’s sake…” (MW 82). In a sense it was an announcement of the greater work that Copernicus had begun. The Commentariolus was never published during Copernicus’s lifetime, but he sent manuscript copies to various astronomers and philosophers. He received some discouragement because the heliocentric system seemed to disagree with the Bible, but mostly he was encouraged. Although Copernicus’s involvement with official attempts to reform the calendar was limited to a no longer extant letter, that endeavor made a new, serious astronomical theory welcome. Fear of the reaction of ecclesiastical authorities was probably the least of the reasons why he delayed publishing his book.[7] The most important reasons for the delay was that the larger work required both astronomical observations and intricate mathematical proofs. His administrative duties certainly interfered with both the research and the writing. He was unable to make the regular observations that he needed and Frombork, which was often fogged in, was not a good place for those observations. Moreover, as Gingerich (1993, 37) pointed out,

[Copernicus] was far from the major international centers of printing that could profitably handle a book as large and technical as De revolutionibus. On the other [hand], his manuscript was still full of numerical inconsistencies, and he knew very well that he had not taken complete advantage of the opportunities that the heliocentric viewpoint offered…Furthermore, Copernicus was far from academic centers, thereby lacking the stimulation of technically trained colleagues with whom he could discuss his work.

The manuscript of On the Revolutions was basically complete when Rheticus came to visit him in 1539. The work comprised six books. The first book, the best known, discussed what came to be known as the Copernican theory and what is Copernicus’s most important contribution to astronomy, the heliocentric universe (although in Copernicus’s model, the sun is not truly in the center). Book 1 set out the order of the heavenly bodies about the sun: “[The sphere of the fixed stars] is followed by the first of the planets, Saturn, which completes its circuit in 30 years. After Saturn, Jupiter accomplishes its revolution in 12 years. The Mars revolves in 2 years. The annual revolution takes the series’ fourth place, which contains the earth…together with the lunar sphere as an epicycle. In the fifth place Venus returns in 9 months. Lastly, the sixth place is held by Mercury, which revolves in a period of 80 days” (Revolutions, 21–22). This established a relationship between the order of the planets and their periods, and it made a unified system. This may be the most important argument in favor of the heliocentric model as Copernicus described it.[8] It was far superior to Ptolemy’s model, which had the planets revolving around the earth so that the sun, Mercury, and Venus all had the same annual revolution. In book 1 Copernicus also insisted that the movements of all bodies must be circular and uniform, and noted that the reason they may appear nonuniform to us is “either that their circles have poles different [from the earth’s] or that the earth is not at the center of the circles on which they revolve” (Revolutions, 11). Particularly notable for Copernicus was that in Ptolemy’s model the sun, the moon, and the five planets seemed ironically to have different motions from the other heavenly bodies and it made more sense for the small earth to move than the immense heavens. But the fact that Copernicus turned the earth into a planet did not cause him to reject Aristotelian physics, for he maintained that “land and water together press upon a single center of gravity; that the earth has no other center of magnitude; that, since earth is heavier, its gaps are filled with water…” (Revolutions, 10). As Aristotle had asserted, the earth was the center toward which the physical elements gravitate. This was a problem for Copernicus’s model, because if the earth was no longer the center, why should elements gravitate toward it?

The second book of On the Revolutions elaborated the concepts in the first book; book 3 dealt with the precession of the equinoxes and solar theory; book 4 dealt with the moon’s motions; book 5 dealt with the planetary longitude and book 6 with latitude.[9] Copernicus depended very much on Ptolemy’s observations, and there was little new in his mathematics. He was most successful in his work on planetary longitude, which, as Swerdlow and Neugebauer (77) commented, was “Copernicus’s most admirable, and most demanding, accomplishment…It was above all the decision to derive new elements for the planets that delayed for nearly half a lifetime Copernicus’s continuation of his work – nearly twenty years devoted to observation and then several more to the most tedious kind of computation – and the result was recognized by his contemporaries as the equal of Ptolemy’s accomplishment, which was surely the highest praise for an astronomer.” Surprisingly, given that the elimination of the equant was so important in the Commentariolus, Copernicus did not mention it in book 1, but he sought to replace it with an epicyclet throughout On the Revolutions. Nevertheless, he did write in book 5 when describing the motion of Mercury:

…the ancients allowed the epicycle to move uniformly only around the equant’s center. This procedure was in gross conflict with the true center [of the epicycle’s motion], its relative [distances], and the prior centers of both [other circles]…However, in order that this last planet too may be rescued from the affronts and pretenses of its detractors, and that its uniform motion, no less than that of the other aforementioned planets, may be revealed in relation to the earth’s motion, I shall attribute to it too, [as the circle mounted] on its eccentric, an eccentric instead of the epicycle accepted in antiquity (Revolutions, 278–79).

2.4 Rheticus and the Narratio prima

Although Copernicus received encouragement to publish his book from his close friend, the bishop of Chelmo Tiedemann Giese (1480–1550), and from the cardinal of Capua Nicholas Schönberg (1472–1537), it was the arrival of Georg Joachim Rheticus in Frombork that solved his needs for a supportive and stimulating colleague in mathematics and astronomy and for access to an appropriate printer. Rheticus was a professor of mathematics at the University of Wittenberg, a major center for the student of mathematics as well as for Lutheran theology. In 1538 Rheticus took a leave of absence to visit several famous scholars in the fields of astronomy and mathematics. It is not known how Rheticus learned about Copernicus’s theory; he may have been convinced to visit Copernicus by one of the earlier scholars he had visited, Johann Schöner, though, as Swerdlow and Neugebauer (16) noted, by “the early 1530’s knowledge of Copernicus’s new theory was circulating in Europe, even reaching the high and learned circles of the Vatican.” Rheticus brought with him some mathematical and astronomical volumes, which both provided Copernicus with some important material and showed him the quality of the mathematical printing available in the German centers of publishing.[10] Rheticus’s present of the 1533 edition of Regiomontanus’s On all Kinds of Triangles (De triangulis omnimodis), for example, convinced Copernicus to revise his section on trigonometry. But Rheticus was particularly interested in showing Copernicus the work of the Nuremberg publisher Johann Petreius as a possible publisher of Copernicus’s volume. Swerdlow and Neugebauer (25) plausibly suggested that “Petreius was offering to publish Copernicus’s work, if not advertising by this notice that he was already committed to do so.” Rheticus wrote the Narratio prima in 1540, an introduction to the theories of Copernicus, which was published and circulated. This further encouraged Copernicus to publish his Revolutions, which he had been working on since he published the Commentariolus.

The Narratio prima was written in 1539 and took the form of a letter to Johann Schöner announcing Copernicus’s findings and describing the contents of the Revolutions. He dealt with such topics as the motions of the fixed stars, the tropical year, the obliquity of the ecliptic, the problems resulting from the motion of the sun, the motions of the earth and the other planets, librations, longitude in the other five planets, and the apparent deviation of the planets from the ecliptic. He asserted that the heliocentric universe should have been adopted because it better accounted for such phenomena as the precession of the equinoxes and the change in the obliquity of the ecliptic; it resulted in a diminution of the eccentricity of the sun; the sun was the center of the deferents of the planets; it allowed the circles in the universe to revolve uniformly and regularly; it satisfied appearances more readily with fewer explanations necessary; it united all the spheres into one system. Rheticus added astrological predictions and number mysticism, which were absent from Copernicus’s work.

The Narratio prima was printed in 1540 in Gdansk (then Danzig); thus, it was the first printed description of the Copernican thesis. Rheticus sent a copy to Achilles Pirmin Gasser of Feldkirch, his hometown in modern-day Austria, and Gasser wrote a foreword that was published with a second edition that was produced in 1541 in Basel. It was published again in 1596 as an appendix to the first edition of Johannes Kepler’s Mysterium cosmographicum (Secret of the Universe), the first completely Copernican work by an adherent since the publications by Copernicus and Rheticus.

2.5 Printing On the Revolutions and Osiander’s Preface

The publication of Rheticus’s Narratio prima did not create a big stir against the heliocentric thesis, and so Copernicus decided to publish On the Revolutions. He added a dedication to Pope Paul III (r. 1534–1549), probably for political reasons, in which he expressed his hesitancy about publishing the work and the reasons he finally decided to publish it. He gave credit to Schönberg and Giese for encouraging him to publish and omitted mention of Rheticus, but it would have been insulting to the pope during the tense period of the Reformation to give credit to a Protestant minister.[11] He dismissed critics who might have claimed that it was against the Bible by giving the example of the fourth-century Christian apologist Lactantius, who had rejected the spherical shape of the earth, and by asserting, “Astronomy is written for astronomers” (Revolutions, 5).[12] In other words, theologians should not meddle with it. He pointed to the difficulty of calendar reform because the motions of the heavenly bodies were inadequately known. And he called attention to the fact that “if the motions of the other planets are correlated with the orbiting of the earth, and are computed for the revolution of each planet, not only do their phenomena follow therefrom but also the order and size of all the planets and spheres, and heaven itself is so linked together that in no portion of it can anything be shifted without disrupting the remaining parts and the universe as a whole” (Revolutions, 5).

Rheticus returned to Wittenberg in 1541 and the following year received another leave of absence, at which time he took the manuscript of the Revolutions to Petreius for publishing in Nuremberg. Rheticus oversaw the printing of most of the text. However, Rheticus was forced to leave Nuremberg later that year because he was appointed professor of mathematics at the University of Leipzig. He left the rest of the management of printing the Revolutions to Andrew Osiander (1498–1552), a Lutheran minister who was also interested in mathematics and astronomy. Though he saw the project through, Osiander appended an anonymous preface to the work. In it he claimed that Copernicus was offering a hypothesis, not a true account of the working of the heavens: “Since he [the astronomer] cannot in any way attain to the true causes, he will adopt whatever suppositions enable the motions to be computed correctly from the principles of geometry for the future as well as for the past …these hypotheses need not be true nor even probable” (Revolutions, xvi). This clearly contradicted the body of the work. Both Rheticus and Giese protested, and Rheticus crossed it out in his copy.

2.6 Sixteenth Century Reactions to On the Revolutions

Copernicus’s fame and book made its way across Europe over the next fifty years, and a second edition was brought out in 1566.[13] As Gingerich’s census of the extant copies showed, the book was read and commented on by astronomers (for a fuller discussion of reactions, see Omodeo). Gingerich (2004, 55) noted “the majority of sixteenth-century astronomers thought eliminating the equant was Copernicus’ big achievement.”

While Martin Luther may have made negative comments about Copernicus because the idea of the heliocentric universe seemed to contradict the Bible,[14] Philip Melanchthon (1497–1560), who presided over the curriculum at the University of Wittenberg, eventually accepted the importance of teaching Copernicus’s ideas, perhaps because Osiander’s preface made the work more palatable. His son-in-law Caspar Peucer (1525–1602) taught astronomy there and began teaching Copernicus’s work. As a result, the University of Wittenberg became a center where Copernicus’s work was studied. But Rheticus was the only Wittenberg scholar who accepted the heliocentric idea. Robert Westman (1975a, 166–67; 2011, chap. 5) suggested that there was a ‘Wittenberg Interpretation’: astronomers appreciated and adopted some of Copernicus’s mathematical models but rejected his cosmology, and some were pleased with his replacement of the equant by epicyclets. One of these was Erasmus Reinhold (1511–1553), a leading astronomer at Wittenberg who became dean and rector. He produced a new set of planetary tables from Copernicus’s work, the Prutenic Tables. Although, as Gingerich (1993, 232) pointed out, “there was relatively little to distinguish between the accuracy of the Alfonsine Tables and the Prutenic Tables,” the latter were more widely adopted; Gingerich plausibly suggested that the fact that the Prutenic Tables more accurately predicted a conjunction between Jupiter and Saturn in 1563 made the difference. Reinhold did not accept the heliocentric theory, but he admired the elimination of the equant. The Prutenic Tables excited interest in Copernicus’s work.

Tycho Brahe (1546–1601) was the greatest astronomical observer before the invention of the telescope. He called Copernicus a ‘second Ptolemy’ (quoted in Westman 1975, 307) and appreciated both the elimination of the equant and the creation of a planetary system. But Tycho could not adopt the Copernican system, partly for the religious reason that it went against what the Bible seemed to preach. He, therefore, adopted a compromise, the ‘geoheliostatic’ system in which the two inner planets revolved around the sun and that system along with the rest of the planets revolved around the earth.

Among Catholics, Christoph Clavius (1537–1612) was the leading astronomer in the sixteenth century. A Jesuit himself, he incorporated astronomy into the Jesuit curriculum and was the principal scholar behind the creation of the Gregorian calendar. Like the Wittenberg astronomers, Clavius adopted Copernican mathematical models when he felt them superior, but he believed that Ptolemy’s cosmology – both his ordering of the planets and his use of the equant – was correct.

Pope Clement VII (r. 1523–1534) had reacted favorably to a talk about Copernicus’s theories, rewarding the speaker with a rare manuscript. There is no indication of how Pope Paul III, to whom On the Revolutions was dedicated reacted; however, a trusted advisor, Bartolomeo Spina of Pisa (1474–1546) intended to condemn it but fell ill and died before his plan was carried out (see Rosen, 1975). Thus, in 1600 there was no official Catholic position on the Copernican system, and it was certainly not a heresy. When Giordano Bruno (1548–1600) was burned at the stake as a heretic, it had nothing to do with his writings in support of Copernican cosmology, and this is clearly shown in Finocchiaro’s reconstruction of the accusations against Bruno (see also Blumenberg’s part 3, chapter 5, titled “Not a Martyr for Copernicanism: Giordano Bruno”).

Michael Maestlin (1550–1631) of the University of Tübingen was the earliest astronomer after Rheticus to adopt Copernicus’s heliocentricism. Although he wrote a popular textbook that was geocentric, he taught his students that the heliocentric system was superior. He also rejected Osiander’s preface. Maestlin’s pupil Johannes Kepler wrote the first book since the publication of On the Revolutions that was openly heliocentric in its orientation, the Mysterium cosmographicum (Secret of the Universe). And, of course, Kepler eventually built on Copernicus’s work to create a much more accurate description of the solar system.


A. Complete Works of Copernicus

In 1972 the Polish Academy of Sciences under the direction of J. Dobrzycki published critical editions of the Complete Works of Copernicus in six languages: Latin, English, French, German, Polish, and Russian. The first volume was a facsimile edition. The annotations in the English translations are more comprehensive than the others. The English edition was reissued as follows:

  • Minor Works, 1992, trans. E. Rosen, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press (originally published as volume 3 of Nicholas Copernicus: Complete Works, Warsaw: Polish Scientific Publishers, 1985). Referred to herein as MW.
  • On the Revolutions, 1992, trans. E. Rosen, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press (originally published as volume 2 of Nicholas Copernicus: Complete Works, Warsaw: Polish Scientific Publishers, 1978). Referred to herein as Revolutions.

B. Other Translations of Copernicus’s Works

  • On the Revolutions of the Heavenly Spheres, 1955, trans. C.G. Wallis, vol. 16 of Great Books of the Western World, Chicago: Encyclopedia Britannica; 1995, reprint, Amherst: Prometheus Books.
  • On the Revolutions of the Heavenly Spheres, 1976, trans. and ed. A.M. Duncan, Newton Abbot: David & Charles.
  • “The Derivation and First Draft of Copernicus’s Planetary Theory: A Translation of the Commentariolus with Commentary,” 1973, trans. N.M. Swerdlow, Proceedings of the American Philosophical Society, 117: 423–512.

C. Translations of Other Primary Sources

  • Bruno, G., 1977, The Ash Wednesday Supper, trans. E.A. Gosselin and L.S. Lerner, Hamden: Archon Books, 1995; reprint, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Pico della Mirandola, Disputationes adversus astrologiam divinatricem, E. Garin (trans. and ed.), 2 vols., Florence: Vallecchi, 1946, 1952.
  • Rheticus, G.J., Narratio prima, in E. Rosen, 1971, 107–96.

D. Secondary Sources

  • Bardi, A., 2023, “Copernicus and Axiomatics,” in Handbook of the History and Philosophy of Mathematical Practice, B. Sriraman (ed.), Cham: Springer, doi:10.1007/978-3-030-19071-2_110-1
  • Blåsjö, V., 2014, “A Critique of the Arguments for Maragha Influence on Copernicus,” Journal for the History of Astronomy, 45: 183–195.
  • Blumenberg, H., 1987, The Genesis of the Copernican World, R.M. Wallace (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Cohen, I.B., 1960, The Birth of a New Physics, Garden City: Anchor Books; revised edition, New York: W.W. Norton, 1985.
  • –––, 1985, Revolutions in Science, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Crowe, M.J., 1990, Theories of the World from Antiquity to the Copernican Revolution, New York: Dover Publications.
  • Feldhay, R. and F.J. Ragep (eds.), 2017, Before Copernicus: The Cultures and Contexts of Scientific Learning in the Fifteenth Century, Montreal: McGill-Queens University Press.
  • Finocchiaro, M.A., 2002, “Philosophy versus Religion and Science versus Religion: the Trials of Bruno and Galileo,” in H. Gatti (ed.), 51–96.
  • Gatti, H. (ed.), 2002, Giordano Bruno: Philosopher of the Renaissance, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • Gillespie, C.C. (ed.), 1970–80, Dictionary of Scientific Biography, New York: Scribner’s.
  • Gingerich, O., 1993, The Eye of Heaven: Ptolemy, Copernicus, Kepler, New York: American Institute of Physics.
  • –––, 2002, An Annotated Census of Copernicus’ De revolutionibus, Leiden: Brill Academic Publishers; Nuremberg, 1543 and Basel, 1566.
  • –––, 2004, The Book Nobody Read: Chasing the Revolutions of Nicolaus Copernicus, New York: Walker & Company.
  • Goldstein, B., 2002, “Copernicus and the Origin of His Heliocentric System,” Journal for the History of Astronomy, 33: 219–235.
  • Goddu, A., 2010, Copernicus and the Aristotelian Tradition: Education, Reading, and Philosophy in Copernicus’s Path to Heliocentrism, Leiden: Brill.
  • Grendler, P., 2002, The Universities of the Italian Renaissance, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Hallyn, F., 1990, The Poetic Structure of the World: Copernicus and Kepler, D. Leslie (trans.), New York: Zone Books.
  • Koestler, A., 1989, The Sleepwalkers, London: Penguin, reprint of 1959 edition.
  • Koyré, A., 1957, From the Closed World to the Infinite Universe, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • –––, 1973, The Astronomical Revolution: Copernicus, Kepler, Borelli, R.E.W. Maddison (trans.), Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Kuhn, T., 1957, The Copernican Revolution, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Morrison, R., 2014, “A Scholarly Intermediary between the Ottoman Empire and Renaissance Europe,” Isis, 105: 32–57.
  • –––, 2017, “Jews as Scientific Intermediaries in the European Renaissance,” in Feldhay and Ragep (eds.), 198–214.
  • Omodeo, P.D., 2014, Copernicus in the Cultural Debates of the Renaissance: Reception, Legacy, Transformation, Leiden: Brill.
  • Ragep, F.J., 2005, “Ali Qushji and Regiomontanus,” Journal for the History of Astronomy, 36: 359–71.
  • –––, 2007, “Copernicus and His Islamic Predecessors,” History of Science, 45: 65–81.
  • –––, 2016, “Ibn al-Shatir and Copernicus: The Uppsala Notes Revisited,” Journal for the History of Astronomy, 47: 395–415.
  • –––, 2017, “From Tun to Turin: The Twists and Turns of the Tusi Couple,” in Feldhay and Ragep (eds.), 161–97.
  • Rosen, E.,1970a, “Copernicus,” in Gillespie (ed.), 3: 401–11.
  • –––, 1970b, “Rheticus,” Gillespie (ed.), 11: 395–97.
  • –––, 1971, Three Copernican Treatises, 3d ed., New York: Octagon Books.
  • –––, 1975, “Was Copernicus’ Revolutions Approved by the Pope?” Journal of the History of Ideas, 36: 531–42.
  • –––, 1984, Copernicus and the Scientific Revolution, Malabar, FL: Krieger Publishing Co.
  • Saliba, G., 2007, Islamic Science and the Making of the European Renaissance, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Shumaker, W., 1979, The Occult Sciences in the Renaissance: A Study in Intellectual Patterns, Berkeley: University of California Press, reprint of 1972 edition.
  • Siraisi, N., 1981, Taddeo Alderotti and His Pupils: Two Generations of Italian Medical Learning, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1990, Medieval and Early Renaissance Medicine: An Introduction to Knowledge and Practice, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Swerdlow, N., 1973, “The Derivation and First Draft of Copernicus’s Planetary Theory: A Translation of the Commentariolus with Commentary,” Proceedings of the American Philosophical Society, 117: 423–512.
  • –––, 2000, “Copernicus, Nicolaus (1473–1543),” in Encyclopedia of the Scientific Revolution, W. Applebaum (ed.), New York: Garland Publishing, 162–68.
  • –––, 2017, “Copernicus’s Derivation of the Heliocentric Theory from Regiomontanus’s Eccentric Models of the Second Inequality of the Superior and Inferior Planets” Journal for the History of Astronomy, 48: 33–61.
  • Swerdlow, N. and O. Neugebauer, 1984, Mathematical Astronomy in Copernicus’s De Revolutionibus, 2 vols., New York: Springer-Verlag.
  • Westman, R., 1975a, “The Melanchthon Circle, Rheticus, and the Wittenberg Interpretation of the Copernican Theory,” Isis, 66: 165–93.
  • –––, 1975b, “Three Responses to the Copernican Theory: Johannes Praetorius, Tycho Brahe, and Michael Maestlin,” in Westman (ed.), 1975c.
  • –––, (ed), 1975c, The Copernican Achievement, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • –––, 2011, The Copernican Question: Prognostication, Skepticism, and Celestial Order, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Yates, F., 1979, Giordano Bruno and the Hermetic Tradition, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, reprint of 1964 edition.

Other Internet Resources

  • Nicolaus Copernicus, in the MacTutor History of Mathematics Archive, maintained by J.J. O’Connor and E.F. Robertson (School of Mathematics and Statistics University of St. Andrews, Scotland).

Copyright © 2023 by
Sheila Rabin <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free