## Notes to Descartes’ Mathematics

1.
Given the primary goal to situate *La Géométrie*
in the philosophical debates surrounding early modern mathematical
practice, there will be no discussion of Book Three, the section of
Descartes’ work that stands as a primary impetus in the development of
modern algebra. For an illuminating treatment of Book Three, see Bos
(2001), Chapter 27.

2. This is not to say that these more complicated curves were required for solutions to these problems. See, for instance, Panza (2011), 59–61 for solutions to the problem of angle trisection that did not rely on the spiral.

3.
Note here the difficulty of
mapping Viète’s stages of exegetics and zetetics onto
Pappus’s stages of analysis and synthesis. Pappus claims
that synthesis involves the reversal of analysis, but for Viète,
there is no such reversal. Rather, the analysis that is applied
in the stage of exegetics involves an elaboration of a problem in terms
of equations, whereas the synthesis in the stage of zetetic involves
constructions in the plane, and importantly, the analysis does not
indicate *how* to construct the curve required to complete the
synthesis. A similar issue arises in Descartes’ *La
Géométrie* (see section 3.2). As such,
what we find in Viète (and later in Descartes) is that an
essential ingredient of their early modern algebraic analysis is
treating what is sought after as known, which is accomplished by the
use of variables to represent both known and unknown quantities.

4.
When Descartes presents
Beeckman the specimen of algebra in 1628, he promises to supply his
more complete Parisian *Algebra* at a later time. However,
it is not clear whether Descartes actually gave Beeckman the complete
*Algebra*, since Descartes reports to Mersenne in a letter from
25 January 1638 that no one has a copy of his *Algebra* (AT I,
501). What is certain is that he gave Beeckman at least some
parts of that project in early 1629, because they were transcribed by
Beeckman in his *Journal*.

5.
The problem I present here is one that van Schooten uses to clarify
Descartes’ analytic procedure in his 1683 annotated Latin
version of *La Géométrie*, and it is glossed over
by Smith and Latham in G, p. 9, Note 12. It is worth noting that Smith
and Latham’s treatment of the problem is somewhat
misleading. They claim that the problem illustrates Descartes’
directive that we are to reduce a determinate geometrical problem to
a *set* of equations, which we must solve simultaneously (see
G, p. 9, Note 11). However, this directive from Descartes only applies
when we are dealing with multiple unknowns, in which case we establish
an equation for each unknown in the problem. When there is only one
unknown, as in the example above, there is only equation to which the
problem must be reduced. Smith and Latham claim, in contrast, that we
reduce the above problem to \(x = b^2 / (a - b)\) and also to \((a + b
+ x)\times(x) = (b + x)^2\). However, these two equations are
equivalent and thus, do not offer a set of equations that can be
solved simultaneously.

6.
In this case and throughout *La Géométrie*,
Descartes uses oblique coordinates that are intrinsic to the problem.
That is, the coordinates designate distances that are given naturally
by the figures in the problem. In contemporary analytic geometry, we
use typically use orthogonal *axes* (with \(x\) as the
horizontal axis and \(y\) as the vertical axis) for our
coordinate system, and these axes are, as it were, extrinsic to the
problem.

7. The mesolabe compass is presented again at the opening of Book Three, where Descartes uses the compass to solve the problem of constructing mean proportionals, the same problem for which the compass was used in 1619 (see section 2.2 and G, 152–157).