Embodied Cognition

First published Fri Jun 25, 2021

Embodied Cognition is a wide-ranging research program drawing from and inspiring work in psychology, neuroscience, ethology, philosophy, linguistics, robotics, and artificial intelligence. Whereas traditional cognitive science also encompasses these disciplines, it finds common purpose in a conception of mind wedded to computationalism: mental processes are computational processes; the brain, qua computer, is the seat of cognition. In contrast, embodied cognition variously rejects or reformulates the computational commitments of cognitive science, emphasizing the significance of an agent’s physical body in cognitive abilities. Unifying investigators of embodied cognition is the idea that the body or the body’s interactions with the environment constitute or contribute to cognition in ways that require a new framework for its investigation. Mental processes are not, or not only, computational processes. The brain is not a computer, or not the seat of cognition.

Once a fringe movement, embodied cognition now enjoys a fair amount of prominence. Unlike, say, ecological psychology, which has faced an uphill battle for mainstream acceptance, embodied cognition has gained a substantial following. The appointment of researchers who take an embodied perspective to cognition would, today, raise few eyebrows. Embodied cognition has been the subject of numerous articles in popular outlets. Moreover, there is not an area of cognitive science—perception, language, learning, memory, categorization, problem solving, emotion, social cognition—that has not received an embodied “make-over.”

None of this is to say, of course, that embodied cognition does not face hard questions, or has escaped harsh criticism. The numerous and sometimes incompatible claims it makes about the body’s role in cognition and the myriad methods it employs for understanding this role make it ripe for philosophical reflection. Critics charge embodied cognition with embracing a depleted conception of cognition, or with not offering a genuine replacement to computational cognitive science, or with claiming that bodies play a constitutive role in cognition when in fact their role is merely causal. Proponents have responded to all of these objections. A welcome byproduct of these debates is a new perspective on some old philosophical questions concerning what minds are, what concepts are, and how to understand the nature and significance of representation.

1. The Foils and Inspirations for Embodied Cognition

The ontological and methodological commitments of traditional computational cognitive science, which have been in play since at least the mid-Twentieth Century, are by now well understood. Early or influential applications of computationalism to cognition include theories of language acquisition (Chomsky 1959), attention (Broadbent 1958), problem solving (Newell, Shaw, and Simon 1958), attention, memory (Sternberg 1969), and perception (Marr 1982). Common to all computationally-oriented research is the idea that cognition involves a step-wise series of events, beginning with the transduction of stimulus energy into a symbolic expression, followed by transformations of this expression according to various rules, the result of which is a particular output—a grammatical linguistic utterance, isolation of one stream of words from another, a solution to a logic problem, the identification of a stimulus as being among a set of memorized stimuli, or a 3-D perception of the world.

The symbolic expressions over which cognitive processes operate, as well as the rules according to which these operations proceed, appear as representational states internal to the cognizing agent. They are individuated in terms of what they are about (phonemes, light intensity, edges, shapes, etc.). All of this cognitive activity takes place in the agent’s nervous system. It is in virtue of the activation of the nervous system that stimuli become encoded into a “mentalese” language of thought, akin to the programming languages found in ordinary computers; similarly, the rules dictating the manipulation of symbols in the language of thought are like the instructions that a C.P.U. executes in the course of carrying out a task. Rather than running spread sheets or displaying Tetris pieces, the computational brain produces language, or perceives the world, or retrieves items from memory. The methods of computational cognitive science reflect these ontological commitments. Experiments are designed to reveal the content of representational states or to uncover the steps by which mental algorithms transform input into output.

So pervasive has this computational conception of cognition been over the past decades that many cognitive scientists would be happy to identify cognition with computation, giving little thought to the possibility of alternatives. Certainly the great strides toward understanding cognition that the advent of computationalism has made possible invites the idea that computational cognitive science, if not the only game in town, is likely the best. However, ecological psychology, which J.J. Gibson (1966; 1979) began to develop around the time that computationalism came to dominate psychological practice, rejected nearly every plank of the information processing model of cognition that computational cognitive science epitomizes. More recently, connectionist cognitive science has challenged the symbolist commitments of computationalism even while conceding a role for computational processes. Both ecological psychology and connectionist psychology have played significant roles in the rise of embodied cognition and so a brief discussion of their points of influence is necessary to understand the “embodied turn.” Likewise, some embodied cognition researchers draw on a very different source for inspiration—the phenomenological tradition with special attention to Merleau-Ponty’s contributions. The next three subsections examine these various strands of influence.

1.1 Ecological Psychology

A primary disagreement between computational and ecological psychologists concerns the nature of the stimuli to which organisms are exposed. Computationalists largely regard these stimuli as, in Chomsky’s terminology, impoverished (Chomsky 1980). The linguistic utterances to which an infant comes in contact do not, on their own, contain sufficient information to indicate the grammar of a language. Similarly, the visual information present in the light that stimulates an organism’s retina does not, on its own, specify the layout of surfaces in the organism’s environment. Visual perception faces an “inverse optics” problem. For any pattern of light on a retina, there exists an infinite number of possible distal surfaces capable of producing that pattern. The visual system thus seems to confront an impossible task—while it is possible to calculate the pattern of light a reflecting surface will produce on the retina, the inverse of this problem appears to be unsolvable, and yet visual systems solve it all the time and, phenomenologically speaking, immediately.

Computationalists regard the inescapable poverty of stimuli as placing on cognitive systems a need to draw inferences. Just as background knowledge allows you to infer from the footprints in the snow that a deer has passed by, cognitive systems, according to computationalists, rely on sub-conscious background knowledge to infer what the world is like given the partial clues the stimuli offer. The perception of an object’s size, for instance, would, according to the computationalist, be inferred on the basis of the size of the retinal image of the object together with knowledge of the object’s distance from the viewer. Perception of an object’s shape, similarly, is inferred from the shape of the retinal image along with knowledge of the object’s orientation relative to the viewer.

Ecological psychologists, on the other hand, deny that organisms encounter impoverished stimuli (Michaels and Palatinus 2014). Such a view, they believe, falsely identifies whole sensory systems with their parts—with eyes, or with retinal images, or with brain activity. Visual perceptual processes, for instance, are not exclusive to the eye or even the brain, but involve the whole organism as it moves about its environment. The motions of an organism create an ever-changing pattern of stimulation in which invariant features surface. The detection of these invariants, according to the ecological psychologist, provides all the information necessary for perception. Perception of an object’s shape, for instance, becomes apparent as a result of detecting the kinds of transformations in the stimulus pattern that occur when approaching or moving around the object. The edges of a square, for instance, will create patterns of light quite different from those that a diamond would reflect as one moves toward or around a square, thus eliminating the need for rule-guided inferences, drawing upon background knowledge, to distinguish the square from a diamond. Insights like these have encouraged embodied cognition proponents to seek explanations of cognition that minimize or disavow entirely the role of inference and, hence, the need for computation. Just as perception, according to the ecological psychologist, is an extended process involving whole organisms in motion through their environments, the same may well be true for many other cognitive achievements.

1.2 Connectionism

Connectionist systems offer a means of computation that, in many cases, eschews the symbolist commitments of computational cognitive science. In contrast to the computer that operates on symbols on the basis of internally stored rules, a connectionist system consists in networks of nodes that excite or inhibit each other’s activity according to weighted connections between them. Different stimuli will affect input nodes differently, causing distinct patterns of activation in deeper layers of nodes depending on the values of activation that the input nodes send upstream. The result of this activity will reveal itself in the activation values of a final layer of nodes—the output nodes.

Connectionist networks thus compute—they transform input activation values into output activation values—but the imputation of symbolic structures within this computational process, as well as explicit rules by which a C.P.U. executes operations upon these symbols, appears unfounded. As Hatfield (1991) describes connectionist networks, they are non-cognitive, in the sense that their operation involves none of the trappings of cognition upon which computationalists insist, and yet still computational, insofar as stimulation of their input nodes creates patterns of activation that lead to particular activation values in output nodes. For more on connectionism generally, see the entry on connectionism.

Many embodied cognition researchers saw in connectionist networks a new way to conceptualize cognition and, accordingly, to explain cognitive processes. Non-symbolic explanations of cognition, despite the “only game in town” mantra of computationalists (Fodor 1987), might be possible after all. Adding momentum to the connectionist challenge was the realization that the mathematics of dynamical systems theory could often illuminate the unfolding patterns of activity in connectionist networks and could as well be extended to include within its explanatory scope the body-environment interactions between which connectionist networks reside. Consequently, some embodied cognition researchers have argued that dynamical systems theory offers the best framework from which to understand cognition.

1.3. Phenomenology

Another source of inspiration for embodied cognition is the phenomenological tradition. Phenomenology investigates the nature and structure of our conscious, lived experiences. Although the subject of phenomenological analyses can vary widely from perception to imagination, emotion, willing, and intentional physical movements, all phenomenological analyses aim to elucidate the intentional structure of consciousness. They do so by analyzing our conscious experiences in terms of temporal, spatial, attentional, kinesthetic, social, and self awareness. In contrast to computational accounts of the mind that model consciousness in terms of input, processing, and output, phenomenological accounts ground consciousness in a host of rich and varied attentional experiences, which with practice can be described and analyzed. For more on phenomenology, see see the entry on phenomenology.

Some variations of embodied cognition are inspired by the works of phenomenologists like Martin Heidegger (1975), Edmund Husserl (1929), and Maurice Merleau-Ponty (1962) who emphasize the physical embodiment of our conscious cognitive experiences. These thinkers analyze the various ways in which our bodies shape our thoughts and how we experience our conscious activities. Some even argue that consciousness is constituted by embodiment. Merleau-Ponty, for example, argues that consciousness itself is embodied:

Insofar as, when I reflect on the essence of subjectivity, I find it bound up with that of the body and that of the world, this is because my existence as subjectivity [= consciousness] is merely one with my existence as a body and with the existence of the world, and because the subject that I am, when taken concretely, is inseparable from this body and this world (Merleau-Ponty 1962, p. 408).

This phenomenological influence can be seen clearly in embodied cognition analyses of the relation between mind and body. These analyses reject the idea that mentality is fundamentally different and separate from physicality and the corollary idea that others’ mentality is somehow hidden from view. Inspired by Husserl and other phenomenologists, embodied cognition proponents argue that Cartesian-style analyses of the mind and the body fundamentally misconstrue cognition (Gallagher and Zahavi, 2008). Cognition is not purely or even typically an intellectual, solipsistic introspection in the way Descartes’ Meditations suggest. Rather, cognition is physically interactive, embedded in physical contexts, and manifested in physical bodies. Even contemporary philosophers and cognitive scientists who reject mind-body dualism may fall into the trap of intuitively regarding mental and physical as distinct and thereby accept the idea that we must infer the existence and nature of other minds from indirect cues. From the perspective that phenomenologists favor, however, all cognition is embodied and interactive and embedded in dynamically changing environments. Attention to the way in which our own conscious experiences are structured by our bodies and environments reveals that there is no substantial distinction between mind and body. The embodiment of cognition makes our own and others’ minds just as observable as any other feature of the world. In other words, phenomenological analysis of our conscious experiences reveals the Mind-Body Problem and Problem of Other Minds to be merely illusory problems. This phenomenological analysis of the relation between mind and body and our relation to other minds deeply influenced proponents of embodied cognition such as Shaun Gallagher (2005), Dan Zahavi (2005), and Evan Thompson (2010).

2. Embodied Cognition: Themes and Close Relations

Unlike computational cognitive science, the commitments of which can be readily identified, embodied cognition is better characterized as a research program with no clear defining features other than the tenet that computational cognitive science has failed to appreciate the body’s significance in cognitive processing and to do so requires a dramatic re-conceptualization of the nature of cognition and how it must be investigated. Different researchers view the body’s significance for cognition as entailing different consequences for the subject matter and practice of cognitive science. Nevertheless, through this very broad diversity of views it is possible to extract three major themes around which discussion of embodied cognition can be organized (see Shapiro 2012; 2019a).

2.1 Three Themes of Embodied Cognition

The three themes of embodiment around which most of the following discussion will be organized are as follows.

Conceptualization: The properties of an organism’s body limit or constrain the concepts an organism can acquire. That is, the concepts by which an organism understands its environment depend on the nature of its body in such a way that differently embodied organisms would understand their environments differently.

Replacement: The array of computationally-inspired concepts, including symbol, representation, and inference, on which traditional cognitive science has drawn must be abandoned in favor of others that are better-suited to the investigation of bodily-informed cognitive systems.

Constitution: The body (and, perhaps, parts of the world) does more than merely contribute causally to cognitive processes: it plays a constitutive role in cognition, literally as a part of a cognitive system. Thus, cognitive systems consist in more than just the nervous system and sensory organs.

The theses above are not intended to be individually exclusive—embodied cognition research might show tendencies toward more than one at a time. Similarly, descriptions of embodied cognition might be organized around a larger number of narrower themes (M. Wilson 2002); however, efforts to broaden the themes, thereby reducing their number, risks generalizing the description of embodied cognition to the extent that its purported novelty is jeopardized.

Before examining how these themes receive expression, it is worth pausing to compare embodied cognition to some closely related research areas. Sometimes embodied cognition is distinguished from embedded cognition, as well as extended cognition and enactive cognition. However, despite the distinctions between the four “Es”—embodied, embedded, enactive, and extended—it is not uncommon to use the label “embodied” to include any or all of these “Es”. The E-fields share the view, after all, that the brain-centrism of traditional cognitive science, as well as its dependence on the computer for inspiration, stands in the way of a correct understanding of cognition.

2.2 Embedded Cognition

Embedded cognition assumes that cognitive tasks—dividing a number into fractions, navigating a large ship, retrieving the correct book from a shelf—require some quantity of cognitive effort. The cognitive “load” that a task requires can be reduced when the agent embeds herself within an appropriately designed physical or social environment. For instance, Martin and Schwartz (2005) found that children are more successful at calculating ¼ of 8 when allowed to manipulate pie pieces than if only viewing the pieces. The cognitive load required to navigate a large Navy vessel exceeds the capacity of any single individual, but can be distributed across a number of specialists, each with his or her own particular task (Hutchins 1996). Arranging books on a shelf alphabetically makes searching for a particular title much easier than it would be if the books were simply set randomly upon the shelf. In all of these cases, the cognitive capacities of an individual are enhanced when provided with the opportunity to interact with features of a suitably organized physical or social environment.

2.3 Extended Cognition

Close kin to embedded cognition, extended cognition moves from the claim that cognition is embedded to claim additionally that the environmental and social resources that enhance the cognitive capacities of an agent are in fact constituents of a larger cognitive system, rather than merely useful tools for a cognitive system that retains its traditional location wholly within an agent’s nervous system (Clark and Chalmers 1998; Menary 2008). Some interpret the thesis of extended cognition to mean that cognition actually takes place outside the nervous system—within the extra-cranial resources involved in the cognitive task (Adams and Aizawa 2001; 2008; 2009; 2010). Others interpret the thesis more modestly, as claiming that parts of an agent’s environment or body should be construed as parts of a cognitive system, even if cognition does not take place within these parts, thus extending cognitive systems beyond the agent’s nervous system (Clark and Chalmers 1998; Wilson 1994; Wilson and Clark 2001).

2.4 Enactive Cognition

Enactivism is the view that cognition emerges from or is constituted by sensorimotor activity. Currently, there are three distinct strands of enactivism (Ward, Silverman, and Villalobos 2017). Autopoietic Enactivism conceives of cognition in terms of the biodynamics of living systems (Varela, Thompson, and Rosch 2017; Di Paolo 2005). Just as a bacterium is created and maintained by processes that span the organism and environment, so too is cognition generated and specified through operation of sensorimotor processes that crisscross the brain, body, and world. On this version of enactivism, there is no bright line between mental processes and non-mental biological processes. The former simply are an enriched version of the latter. Sensorimotor Enactivism is another strand of enactivism that focuses on explaining the intentionality and phenomenology of perceptual experiences in particular (O’Regan and Noë 2001; Noë 2004). This view holds that perception consists in active exploration of the environment, which establishes patterns of dependence between our movements, sensory states, and the world. Perceivers need not build and manipulate internal models of the external world. Instead, they need only skillfully exploit sensorimotor dependences that their exploratory activities reveal. Finally, Radical Enactivism aims to replace all representational explanations of cognition with embodied, interactive explanations (Hutto and Myin 2013; Chemero 2011). The primary tactic guiding Radical Enactivism is to deconstruct and eliminate the notion of mental content in cognitive science. This tactic manifests in critiques of attempts to naturalize intentionality, redescribing cognitive processes studied in mainstream cognitive science, and challenging concepts employed even by closely related views, such as Autopoietic Enactivism’s notion of sensemaking (Chemero 2016). These three strands of enactivism vary in their target explanations and methodology. However, they share the commitment to the idea that cognition emerges from sensorimotor activity.

3. Conceptualization

Returning now to the three themes around which this discussion of embodied cognition is organized, the first is Conceptualization. According to Conceptualization, the concepts by which organisms recognize and categorize objects in the world, reason and draw inferences, and communicate with each other, are heavily body-dependent. The morphological properties of an agent’s body will constrain and inform the meaning of its concepts. The claim that concepts are embodied in this way has been defended via quite distinct routes.

3.1 Metaphor and Basic Concepts

Lakoff and Johnson (1980; 1999) offered an early and influential defense of Conceptualization. Their argument begins with the plausible premise that human beings rely extensively upon metaphorical reasoning when learning or developing an understanding of unfamiliar concepts. Imagine, for instance, trying to explain to a child the meaning of election. Drawing a connection between election and a concept the child already understands, like foot race, makes the job easier. The “elections are races” metaphor provides a kind of scaffolding for introducing and explaining the content of the election concept. Candidates are like runners hoping to win the race. They will adopt various strategies. They must be careful not to start too fast or they might burn out before reaching the finish line. It’s about endurance through the long stretch—more a marathon than a sprint. Some will play dirty, trying to trip others up, knocking them off their stride. There will be sore losers but also graceful winners. Appeal to the content of a familiar concept—foot race—provides the child with a framework or stance for learning the unfamiliar concept—election.

The next step toward the embodiment of concepts proceeds with the observation that, through pain of regress, not all concepts can be acquired through metaphorical scaffolding. There must be a class of basic concepts that (if not innate) we learn some other way. Lakoff and Johnson argue that these basic concepts derive from the kinds of “direct physical experience” (1980: 57) that come from moving a human body through the environment. The concept up, for instance, is basic, emerging from possession of a body that stands erect, so that “[a]lmost every movement we make involves a motor program that either changes our up-down orientation, maintains it, presupposes it, or takes it into account in some way” (1980, 56). Lakoff and Johnson offer a similar account for how human beings come to possess concepts like front, back, pushing, pulling, and so on.

Basic concepts reflect the idiosyncrasies of particular kinds of bodies. Insofar as less-basic concepts depend upon metaphorical extensions of these most basic concepts, they will in turn reflect the idiosyncrasies of particular kinds of bodies. All concepts, Lakoff and Johnson appear to believe, are “stamped” with the body’s imprint as the characteristics of the body “trickle up” into more abstract concepts. They thus arrive at Conceptualization: “the peculiar nature of our bodies shapes our very possibilities for conceptualization and categorization” (1999, 19). Insofar as this is true, one should expect that differently-bodied organisms, equipped with a different class of basic concepts, would conceptualize and categorize their worlds in nonhuman ways.

Although Lakoff and Johnson see Conceptualization as incompatible with computational cognitive science, their grounds for doing so are tenuous. Metaphorical reasoning consists in applying aspects of one concept’s content to that of another. Because such reasoning is explicitly about content, and because computationalism is a theory about how to process mental states in virtue of their content, Lakoff and Johnson’s antagonism toward computationalism seems unwarranted. Additionally, their case for Conceptualization remains largely a priori. They claim that organisms morphologically distinct from human beings—spherical in shape, say—would be unable to develop some human concepts (1980, 57), but with no such beings available to test, this assertion is entirely speculative.

3.2 Embodied Concepts

A far more developed and empirically grounded case for Conceptualization comes from psychological and neurological studies that show a connection between a subject’s use of a concept and activity in the subject’s sensorimotor systems. Arising from these studies is a view of concepts as containing within their content facts about the sensorimotor particularities of their possessors. Because these particularities reflect the properties of an organism’s body—how, for instance, it moves its limbs when interacting with the world—the content of its concepts too will be constrained and informed by the nature of its body.

Central to the idea that concepts are embodied is the description of such concepts as modal. This label is intended to make stark the anti-computationalism that proponents of embodied concepts endorse. Symbols in a computer—strings of 1s and 0s—are amodal, in the sense that their relationship to their contents is arbitrary. Words too are amodal symbols. The symbol ‘lake’ means lake, but not in virtue of any resemblance or nomological connection it bears towards lakes. There is no reason that ‘lake’, rather than some other symbol, should mean lake—as is obvious when thinking about words that mean lake in non-English languages. All mental symbols, from the perspective of computational cognitive science, are amodal in this sense.

Modal symbols, on the other hand, retain information about the sources of their origin. They are not just symbols, but, in Barsalou’s (1999; Barsalou et al. 2003) terminology, perceptual symbols. Thoughts about a lake, for instance, consist in activation of the sensorimotor areas of the brain that had been activated during previous encounters with actual lakes. A lake thought re-activates areas of visual cortex that respond to visual information corresponding to lakes; areas of auditory cortex that respond to auditory information corresponding to lakes; areas of motor cortex that correspond to actions typically associated with lakes (although this activation is suppressed so that it does not lead to actual motion), and so on. The result is a lake concept that reflects the kinds of sensory and motor activities that are unique to human bodies and sensory systems. Lake means something like “thing that looks like this, sounds like this, smells like this, allows me to swim within it like this”. Moreover, because how things look and sound depend on the properties of sensory systems, and because the interactions something affords depends on the properties of motor systems, concepts will be body-specific.

Much of the evidence for the modality of concepts arises from demonstrations of an orientation-dependent spatial compatibility effect (OSC) (Symes, Ellis, and Tucker 2007). Tucker and Ellis (1998), for instance, asked subjects to judge whether a given object, e.g., a pan, was right-side-up or upside down. The object was oriented either rightwards or leftwards. So, for instance, the pan’s handle extended toward the right or left. Subjects would indicate whether the object was right-side-up or upside down by pressing a button to their right with their right index finger or to their left with their left index finger. Subjects’ reaction times were shorter when using a right finger to indicate a response when the object was oriented to the right than when oriented toward the left, and, mutatis mutandis, for left-finger responses when the object was oriented to the left. Despite the fact that subjects were not asked to consider horizontal orientation of the stimulus object, this orientation influenced response times (for related work on the OSC, see Tucker and Ellis 2001; 2004).

Relatedly, Glenberg and Kaschak (2002) showed an action-sentence compatibility effect (ASC). Subjects were asked to judge the sensibility of sentences like “open the drawer” or “close the drawer.” Sentences of the first kind suggested actions that would require a motion of the hand toward the body and sentences of the second kind suggested actions with motions away from the body. Subjects would indicate the sensibility of the sentence by pressing a button that required a hand motion either away from the body or toward the body. Glenberg and Kaschak found that reaction times were shorter when the response motion was compatible with the motion suggested by the action sentences.

Both the OSC and ASC effects have been taken to show that concepts are modal. Thoughts about pans, for instance, activate areas in motor cortex that would be activated when actually manipulating a pan. Subjects are slower to respond to a leftward oriented pan with their right finger, because seeing the pan’s orientation activates motor areas in the brain associated with grasping the pan with the left hand, priming a left finger response while inhibiting a right finger response. Similarly, the meaning of words like “open” and “close” include in their content the kinds of motor activity that would be involved in opening or closing motions. The meaning of object concepts thus contain information about how objects might be manipulated by bodies like ours; action concepts consist, in part, of information about how bodies like ours move.

Further evidence for the claim that concepts are packed with sensorimotor information comes from Edmiston and Lupyan (2017), who asked subjects questions that required for their answers either “encyclopedic” knowledge—“Does a swan lay eggs?”—or visual knowledge—“Does a swan have a beak?”. Interestingly, they found that visual interference during the task would diminish performance on questions requiring visual knowledge but not encyclopedic knowledge. They took this as evidence for the embodiment of concepts insofar as the effect of visual interference would be expected if concepts were modal—if, in this case, they involved the activation of vision centers in the brain—but not if concepts were amodal symbols, divorced from their sensorimotor origins.

A final source of evidence for embodied concepts comes from neurological investigations that reveal activation in the sensorimotor areas of the brain associated with particular actions. Reading a word like ‘kick’ or ‘punch’ causes activity in motor areas of the brain associated with kicking and punching (Pulvermüller 2005). Stimulation of these areas by transcranial magnetic stimulation can affect comprehension of such words (Pulvermüller 2005; Buccino et al. 2005). Again, results like these are precisely what an embodied theory of concepts would predict but would be unexpected on standard computational amodal theories of concepts. If the concept kick includes in its content motions distinctive of a human leg, as determined by activity in the motor cortex, then, as Conceptualization entails, it shows the imprint of a specific sort of embodiment.

Critics of embodied concepts have issued a number of challenges. Most basically, one might question whether empirical studies like those just mentioned are targeting concepts at all. Why think, for instance, that the meaning of the concept pan includes information about how pans must be grasped; and that the meaning of open includes information about how an arm should move? Claims like these seem inattentive to a distinction between a concept and a conception (Rey 1983; 1985; Shapiro 2019a). The meaning of the concept bachelor, for instance, is unmarried male. But apart from this concept is a conception of a bachelor, where a conception involves something like typical or representative features. A bachelor conception might include things like being a lothario, or being young, or participating in bro-culture. These concepts are associated with the concept bachelor, but not actually part of the meaning of the concept. Similarly, that pans might be grasped so, or opening involves moving an arm like so, might not be part of the meaning of the concepts pan and open, but instead features of one’s conception of pans and one’s conception of how to open things.

Just as defenders of embodied concepts might not be investigating concepts after all, but instead only conceptions—only features associated with concepts—it may be that the motor activity that accompanies thoughts about concepts does not contribute to the meaning of a concept but is instead only associated with the concept. The psychologists Mahon and Caramazza (2008) argue for this way of interpreting the neurological studies taken to support of embodied concepts. The finding that exposure to the word ‘kick’ causes activity in the motor areas of the brain responsible for kicking does not show that kick is a modal concept. Mahon and Caramazza suggest that linguistic processing of a word might create a cascade of activity that flows to areas of the brain that are associated with the meaning of the word. A thought about kick is associated with thoughts about moving one’s leg, which in turn causes activity in the motor system, but there is no motivation for regarding this activity as part of the kick concept—no motivation for seeing it as evidence for the modality of the concept (Mahon 2015). Thinking about a kick causes one to think about moving one’s leg, which causes activity in motor cortex, but the meaning of kick is independent of such activity.

Finally, even granting the modality of concepts like pan and kick, one might question whether all concepts are embodied, as some embodied cognition researchers suggest (Barsalou 1999). Of special concern are abstract concepts like democracy, justice, and morality (Dove 2009; 2016). Unlike pan, the meaning of which might involve information from sensory and motor systems, what sensory and motor activity might be included in the meaning of justice? Barsalou (2008) and Barsalou and Wiemer-Hastings (2005) offer an account of how abstract concepts might be analyzed in modal terms, but debate over the issue is far from settled.

4. Replacement

Many who take an embodied perspective on cognition believe that the commitments of traditional cognitive science must be jettisoned and replaced with something else. No more computation, no more representation, no more manipulation of symbols. Researchers who promote the complete replacement of traditional cognitive science tend to show the influence of ecological psychology. Less radical are arguments for abandoning some elements of traditional cognitive science, for instance the idea that cognition is a product of rule-guided inference, while retaining others, e.g., the idea that cognition still involves representational states. This position has roots in the connectionist alternative to computationalism discussed in §1.2. Support for Replacement arrives from several directions.

4.1 Robotics

Early ventures in robotics took on board the idea that cognition is computation over symbolic representations. The robot Shakey (1966–1972) for instance, created at the Artificial Intelligence Laboratory at what was then the Stanford Research Institute, was programmed to navigate through a room, avoiding or pushing blocks of various shapes and colors. Guiding Shakey’s behavior was a program, called STRIPS, which operated on symbolically encoded images of the blocks, combining them with stored descriptions of Shakey’s world. As the roboticist Brooks characterizes Shakey’s architecture, it cycles through iterations of sense-model-plan-act sequences (Brooks 1991a). A camera senses the environment, a computer builds a symbolic model of the environment from the camera images, the STRIPS program combines the model with stored symbolic descriptions of the environment, creating plans for a course of action. Shakey’s progress was slow—some tasks would take days to complete—and heavily dependent on an environment carefully structured to make images easier to process.

Brooks’s approach to robotics disavows the computational principles on which Shakey was designed, embracing instead a Gibsonian-inspired architecture. The result has been robots that exhibit far more versatility than Shakey ever displayed—robots that can roam cluttered environments, avoiding obstacles, setting goals for themselves, collecting soda cans for recycling, and more. Brooks’s “Creatures” run on what he calls a subsumption architecture. Rather than cycling through sense-model-plan-act sequences, Creatures contain arrays of sensors that are connected directly to behavior-generating mechanisms. For instance, the sensors on Brooks’s robot Allen were connected directly to three different kinds of behavior-generators: Avoid, Wander, and Explore. When sensors detected an object in Allen’s path, the Avoid mechanism would cause Allen to stop its forward motion, turn, and then proceed. The Wander generator would simply send Allen along a random heading, while the Explore generator would steer Allen toward a selected target. The three kinds of activity layers as Brooks called them, continually compete with each other. For instance, if Allen were Wandering and came across an obstacle, Avoid would step in and prevent Allen from a collision. Explore could inhibit Wander’s activation in order to keep Allen on course toward a target. From the competitive interactions of the three layers emerged unexpectedly flexible and seemingly goal-oriented behavior.

According to Brooks, his Creatures have no need for representations. Implementing an idea from ecological psychology, Brooks says that the activity layers in his robots connect “perception to action directly” (1991b, 144). A robot designed in this way need not represent the world because it is able to “use the world as its own model” (1991b, 139). The robot’s behavior evolves through a continuous loop: the body moves, which changes the stimulation its sensors receive, which directly causes new movement, and so on. Because nothing stands “in between” the sensory signals and the robot’s behavior, there is no need for something that plays the standard intermediating role of a representational state. The robot does not require, for instance, a model of its environment in order to navigate through hallways. The move-sense loop does its job without one.

Despite the success of Brooks’s robots in comparison to their computational ancestors, and the impact Brooks’s ideas have had on industry (e.g., Roomba vacuum cleaners), whether Brooks’s insights pave the way for a radical, representation-free, cognitive science, as some enactivists like Chemero (2009) and Hutto and Myin (2013) believe, is far from certain. A first question concerns whether the behavior of Brooks’s Creatures really proceeds without the benefit of representational states. The sensors with which the Creatures are equipped, after all, send signals to the various activity layers so that the layers can respond to objects in the environment. Moreover, the various layers communicate with each other in order to modulate each other’s activities. They are, in effect, signaling each other with messages that seem to have a semantics: “go ahead,” or “stop!”.

Skeptics about representation, such as Chemero (2009) and Hutto and Myin (2013) focus on the continuous contact that Brooks’s Creatures bear to their environments as a reason to deny a role for representation. Because a Creature is in constant contact with the world, it does not need to represent the world. But constant contact does not always obviate a need for representation. Consider, for instance, that an organism might be in constant contact with many features of its environment—sunlight, humidity, oxygen, the gravitational pull of the moon, and so on. Yet, surely it will be sensitive to only some of these features—only some of these features will shape the organism’s behavior. A natural way to describe how some features make a difference to an organism while others do not might appeal to representation—an organism detects some features, represents them, and not others. Whether detection of this sort must involve representation will depend on the theory of representation that one adopts. One might therefore see the success of Brooks’s challenge to representation, and the enactivists’ embrace of the challenge, as hostage to a theory of representation, the details of which will no doubt themselves be controversial.

Another response to Brooks’s work doubts whether something like the subsumption architecture, even granting that it makes no use of representations, can “scale up”—can produce the more advanced sorts of behavior that cognitive scientists typically investigate (Shapiro 2007). Matthen (2014) argues that once we move just a little beyond the capabilities of Brooks’s Creatures, explanations of behavior will require an appeal to representations. For instance, imagine an organism that knows how to move from point A to point B, and from point A to point C, and on the basis of this knowledge, “figures out” how to move from point B to point C (Matthen 2014). It would seem that such an organism must possess a representation of the relations between points A, B, and C for such a calculation to be possible.

Clark and Toribio (1994) describe some cognitive tasks as “representation-hungry.” Examples include imagining or thinking about non-existent entities (e.g., unicorns) or counterfactual states of affairs (what would happen if I sawed through the tree in this direction?). Of necessity, an organism cannot be in constant contact with non-existents. That human beings so readily and often entertain such thoughts poses a difficulty for enactivists like Chemero and Hutto and Myin who see in Brooks’s “world as its own model” slogan a foundation for all or most cognition. Because the world contains no unicorns, using the world as a model cannot explain thoughts about unicorns.

4.2 Dynamical Systems Approaches to Cognition

Around the turn of the century, some cognitive scientists (Beer 2000; 2003; Kelso 1995; Thelen and Smith 1993; Thelen et al. 2001) and philosophers (Van Gelder 1995; 1998) began to advocate for dynamical systems approaches to cognition. Van Gelder (1995; 1998) argued that the computer, as the defining metaphor for cognitive systems, should be replaced with something more like the Watt’s centrifugal governor. A centrifugal governor regulates the speed of a steam engine by modulating the opening of a steam valve. As the valve opens, a spindle to which flyballs are connected spins faster, causing the flyballs to rise, which then cause the steam valve to close, decreasing the speed at which the spindle spins, causing the flyballs to drop, thus opening the steam valve, and so on. Whereas a computational solution to maintaining engine speed might represent the engine’s current speed, compare it to a representation of the engine’s desired speed, and then calculate and correct for the difference, the centrifugal governor does its job without having to represent or calculate anything (although some have argued that representations are indeed present in the governor: Bechtel 1998; Prinz and Barsalou 2000).

The centrifugal governor is an example of a dynamical system. Typical of dynamical systems is behavior that changes continuously through time—the height of the flyballs, the speed of the spindle, and the size of the steam valve opening all change continuously through time, and the rate of change in each effects the rate of change of the others. Dynamical systems theory provides the mathematical apparatus—differential and difference equations—to model dynamical systems. It is to these equations that dynamical cognitive science looks for explanations of cognition.

Among the most-cited examples of a dynamical explanation of cognition is the Haken-Kelso-Bunz (HKB) model of coordination dynamics (Haken, Kelso, and Bunz 1985; Kelso 1995). This model, consisting of a single differential equation, captures the dynamics of coordinated finger wagging. Subjects are asked to wag their right and left index fingers either in-phase, where each finger moves toward and away from each other, or out-of-phase, like windshield wipers. As the rate of finger wagging increases, out-of-phase motion will “flip” to in-phase motion, but motion that starts in-phase will remain in-phase. In dynamical terms, the coordination of finger wagging has two attractors, or regions of stability, at slower speeds (in-phase and out-of-phase) but only one attractor at a higher speed (in-phase). The HKB model makes a number of predictions borne out by observation, for instance that there are only two stable wagging patterns at lower speeds, that erratic fluctuations in coordination will occur near the critical threshold at which out-of-phase wagging transforms to in-phase, and that deviations from out-of-phase wagging will take longer to correct near the speed of transformation to in-phase (see Chemero 2001 discussion).

Other influential examples of dynamical explanations of cognition have focused on the coordination of infants’ legs for stepping behavior (Thelen and Smith 1993), perseverative reaching behavior in infants (Thelen et al. 2001), and categorization in a simulated agent (Beer 2003). Authors of these studies have been explicit in their belief that traditional cognitive science should be replaced with the commitments of dynamical cognitive science. Among these commitments is a rejection of representation as a necessary component of cognition as well as a view of cognition as “unfolding” from the continuous interactions between an organism’s brain, body, and environment rather than as emerging from discrete, rule-guided, algorithmic steps. This latter commitment returns us to the theme of embodiment. As Thelen et al. explain:

To say that cognition is embodied means that it arises from bodily interactions with the world. From this point of view, cognition depends on the kinds of experiences that come from having a body with particular perceptual and motor capabilities that are inseparably linked and that together form the matrix within which reasoning, memory, emotion, language, and all other aspects of mental life are meshed“ (2001, 1).

Of course, computational cognitive scientists can accept as well that cognition ”arises from bodily interactions with the world,“ in the sense that the inputs to cognitive processes often arise from bodily interactions with the world. Thelen et al. (2001) must then mean something more than that. Presumably, the idea is that the body is like a component in a centrifugal governor, and cognition arises from the continuous interactions between the body, the brain, and the world. Spivey, another prominent dynamical cognitive scientist, puts matters like this: ”For the new psychology on the horizon, perhaps we are ready to discard the metaphor of the mind as computer…and replace it with a treatment of the mind as a natural continuous event“ (2007, 29), much as, presumably, how the regulation of a steam engine’s speed is the result of the continuous interactions of the components of a centrifugal governor.

One challenge facing dynamical approaches to cognition echoes that confronting roboticists like Brooks. Just as the principles underlying the subsumption architecture may not scale-up in ways that can explain more advanced cognitive capacities, so too one might wonder whether dynamical approaches to such capacities will succeed. Perhaps finger wagging and infant stepping behavior are not instances of cognition in the first place, or are so only in an attenuated sense (Shapiro 2007; 2013), in which case any lessons learned from their investigation have little relevance to cognitive science.

Or perhaps as dynamical cognitive scientists examine more explicitly cognitive phenomena, they will find themselves in need of tools associated with standard cognitive science. Spivey, a pioneer of dynamical systems approaches, is on friendly terms with the idea of representations. Dietrich and Markman (2001) have argued that even behavior like coordinated finger wagging depends on representation, although perhaps not a conception of representation as ”thick“ as one usually attributed to computationalism. Once again, it is evident that resolving some of the controversy surrounding the Replacement thesis hinges on the theory of representation that one adopts.

Another criticism of dynamical cognitive science questions whether the differential equations that are offered as explanations of cognitive phenomena are genuinely explanatory. Chemero (2001) and Beer (2003) insist that they are. The equations can be used to predict the behavior of organisms as well as to address counterfactuals about behavior (how would the organism have behaved if such and such had occurred?)—both hallmarks of explanation. Dietrich and Markman (2001), on the other hand, argue that the equations offer only descriptions of phenomena rather than explaining them (see also Eliasmith 1996; van Leeuwen 2005). Spivey, despite his devotion to dynamical cognitive science, shares this view. Dynamical systems theory, he thinks, does not explain cognition. Its utility consists in ”modeling how the mind works“ (2007, 33, his emphasis). He continues:

The emergence of mind takes place in the medium of patterns of activation across neuronal cell assemblies in conjunction with the interaction of their attached sensors (eyes, ears, etc.) and effectors (hands, speech apparatus, etc.) with the environment in which they are embedded. Make no mistake about it, that is the stuff of which human minds are made: brains, bodies, and environments. Trajectories through high-dimensional state spaces are merely convenient ways for scientists to describe, visualize, and model what is going on in those brains, bodies, and environments” (2007, 33, his emphasis).

However, as Zednik (2011) has noted (see also Clark 1997 and Bechtel 1998), the differential equations on which dynamical explanations depend contain terms that permit interpretation. This is what turns a piece of pure mathematics into applied mathematics, which routinely is understood as describing causal processes (Sauer 2010). As an instance of applied (rather than pure) mathematics, The Lotka Volterra equations, for instance, do indeed explain the dynamics of predator-prey populations when their terms are taken to refer to predation rate and reproductive rate. The equations reveal how predation affects the size of the prey population, and how depletion in the prey population affects the size of the predator population, and how reproduction restores the prey population. So, Spivey may be right that the “stuff” of minds consists in brains, bodies, and environments, but this does not preclude the differential equations that describe these interactions from being explanatory. They are explanatory because they describe how brains, bodies, and environments interact and the consequences ensuing from these interactions.

5. Constitution

Baking powder is a constituent of a scone, and its presence causes the scone to rise when baked. A hot oven is also a cause of the scone’s rising, but it is not a constituent of the scone. You eat baking powder when you eat a scone, but you do not eat a hot oven. According to computational cognitive science, the constituents of a cognitive system are brain processes, where these processes are performing computations. The causes of cognition will be whatever causes these brain processes—stimulation to the body from the environment, for instance. Many embodied cognition theorists believe that this account of the constituents of cognition is incorrect. The constituents of a cognitive system extend beyond the brain, to include the body and the environment. A difficulty for this view is justifying the claim that the body and world are better construed as constituents of cognition rather than causes. Why are they more like baking powder than a hot oven?

5.1 Constitution Through Coupling

The previous discussion of dynamic cognitive science serves also to illustrate the Constitution theme. As the quotation above from Spivey indicated, dynamically-oriented cognitive scientists regard cognition to be the product of interactions between brain, body, and world. The continuous interactions between these things, Chemero writes, explains why “dynamically-minded cognitive scientists do not assume that an animal must represent the world to interact with it. Instead, they think of the animal and the relevant parts of the environment as together comprising a single, coupled system” (2001, 142). Chemero continues this idea: “It is only for convenience (and from habit) that we think of the organism and environment as separate; in fact, they are best thought of as comprising just one system…the animal and environment are not separate to begin with” (2001, 142).

Chemero’s description of the animal and environment as coupled is ubiquitous in dynamical cognitive science. Coupling is a technical notion. The behaviors of objects are coupled when the differential equations that describe the behavior of one contains a term that refers to the behavior of the other. The equations that apply to the centrifugal governor, for instance, contain terms referring to the height of the flyballs and the size of the steam valve opening. The Lotka Volterra equations contain terms that refer to the number of predators and the number of prey. The co-occurrence of terms in the equations that describe a dynamical system shows that the behavior of the objects to which they refer are co-dependent. They are thus usefully construed as constituents of a single system—a system held together by the interactions of parts whose relationships are captured in coupled differential equations.

In addition to the technical sense of coupling, philosophers often appeal to a looser sense when defending Constitution. Clark, for instance, discusses the process of writing. When writing, “[i]t is not always that fully formed thoughts get committed to paper. Rather, the paper provides a medium in which, this time via some kind of coupled neural-scribbling-reading unfolding, we are enabled to explore ways of thinking that might otherwise be unavailable to us” (2008, 126). Clark’s idea is that the cognitive system that produces writing extends beyond a subject’s brain, to include among its constituents the paper on which words are written. The paper and the acts of reading and writing are literally parts of the cognitive process, no less than neural processes, because of the continuous interactions between all of these things. If it were possible to provide differential equations that describe the production of writing, they would include terms referring to the behaviors of each of these things. Thus, the reasoning that brings us to the conclusion that the components of a centrifugal governor are constituents of a single system, and that predator and prey are constituents of single system, leads also to the conclusion that the constituents of many cognitive systems will include parts of the body and world.

The coupling concept underlies some arguments for extended cognition. When brain processes are coupled to processes in the body or world, either in the technical sense deriving from dyamical systems theory or in the less strict sense involving loops of dependency, the resulting “brain+” is itself a single cognitive system. It is a cognitive system that extends beyond the head because the constituents of the system are not brain-bound.

Adams and Aizawa (2008; 2009; 2010) have objected to coupling-inspired defenses of Constitution, and hence the idea of extended cognition, on the grounds that they commit a coupling-constitution fallacy: “The pattern of reasoning here involves moving from the observation that process X is in some way causally connected (coupled) to a process Y of type j to the conclusion that X is part of the process of type j” (2009, 81). They argue that this reasoning leads to absurd results. For instance, “[i]t is the interaction of the spinning bowling ball with the surface of the alley that leads to all the pins falling. Still, the process of the ball’s spinning does not extend into the surface of the alley or the pins” (2009, 83). Similarly, Adams and Aizawa would claim, the process of cognition does not extend into the paper and scribblings involved in writing.

This response is unlikely to impress supporters of coupling arguments for Constitution. Firstly, coupling arguments require that process X be more than simply causally connected to process Y of type j for X to be part of the j process. Suppose that process Y of type j is the production of a written paragraph on a piece of paper. Let X be the sound of the pencil as it leaves graphite on the surface of the paper. The sound is causally connected to the production of writing, but defenders of Constitution need not regard it as a constituent in the system of that results in the written paragraph. The sound does not contribute to the “loop”—neural events, scribbling, reading—from which the paragraph emerges. So, not just any causal connections suffice for constituency in a process.

Second, Clark and other defenders of Constitution would not claim that the writing process itself occurs in the constituents of the cognitive system that produces writing. Certainly the bowling ball’s spinning does not extend into the floor of the alley, and of course the writing process does not extend into a piece of paper. But the Constitution thesis is not committed to such claims (Shapiro 2019a). Just as one can say that a neuron is a constituent of a brain even if cognition does not take place in a neuron, it might make sense to say that the floor of the alley is a constituent in a system that results in the ball’s spinning even if spinning does not take place in the floor, and the paper is a constituent in a system that produces writing even if the writing process does not take place in the paper. Such conclusions, even if ultimately unwarranted, do not fail for the reasons Adams and Aizawa muster.

5.2 Constitution Through Parity and Wide Computationalism

Apart from coupling arguments, some philosophers, e.g., Clark and Chalmers (1998) and Clark (2008), have defended the idea that cognitive systems include constituents outside the brain by appeal to a parity principle, whereas Wilson (2004) invokes the idea of wide computationalism. The arguments are similar, both seeking to reveal how a functionalist commitment to mental states or processes licenses the possibility of cognitive processes that extend beyond the brain.

The parity principle says “[i]f, as we confront some task, a part of the world functions as a process which, were it done in the head, we would have no hesitation in recognizing as part of the cognitive process, then that part of the world is…part of the cognitive process” (Clark 2008, 222). As illustration, Clark and Chalmers (1998) compare the occurrent beliefs of Otto, who is afflicted with Alzheimer’s disease, to those of Inga, who has a normal biological brain. Otto keeps a notebook containing information of the sort that would be stored in the hippocampus of a normally functioning brain. When Inga wants to visit MoMA, she pulls from her biological memory the information that MoMA is on 53rd St. which prompts her to take a subway to the destination. When Otto has the same desire, he consults his notebook in which is written “MoMA is on 53rd St.”, which in turn induces his trip to that location. By stipulation, the representation of MoMA’s location in Otto’s notebook plays an identical functional role to the representation in Inga’s brain. Hence, by the parity principle, the notebook entry is a memory—an occurrent belief about the location of MoMA. The notebook is thus home to constituents of many of Otto’s cognitive processes.

In a similar vein, Wilson (2004) discusses a person who wishes to solve a multiplication problem involving two large numbers. Calculating the product “in the head” is a possibility, but solving the problem with the aid of pencil and paper would be much easier. In the latter case, Wilson claims that the brain “offloads” onto the paper some of the work that it would otherwise have to do on its own. Crucial to Wilson’s argument is the idea that solving the multiplication problem is a computational process and that computational processes are not confined to particular spatial regions. When the multiplication problem is solved “in the head” the computational processes occur within the brain alone. But some of the steps in the computation could as well take place outside the head, on a piece of paper, in which case a computational process might partly occur outside the head. There is, then, a parity in the two processes, whether the particular computations are internal or external to the agent. To the extent that this is plausible, one can find additional support for Constitution.

Most criticism of extended cognition has been aimed at Clark and Chalmers’s original proposal, although because Wilson’s position is similar, it is as much victim to these criticisms insofar as they succeed. Among the most vocal critics are Adams and Aizawa (2001; 2008; 2009; 2010), who argue that extended cognitive systems like those involving Otto and his notebook or a person doing multiplication with a paper and pencil, cannot actually be cognitive because they fail to satisfy two “marks” of the cognitive. The first mark is that “cognitive states must involve intrinsic, non-derived content” (Adams and Aizawa 2001, 48). The second is that cognitive systems must display processes of sufficient uniformity to fall within the domain of a single science (Adams and Aizawa 2010).

The intrinsic content criterion assumes a distinction between content that is derived from human thought, as the content of the word ‘martini’ is derived from thoughts about martinis, and content that arises “on its own” without having to depend on some other contentful state for its origin. The thought martini, for instance, presumably does not (or need not) derive from other contentful states but arises from some naturalistic process involving relationships between brain states and martinis (relationships that it is the business of a naturalistic theory of content to specify). Words, maps, signs, and so on possess derived, non-intrinsic content whereas thoughts have intrinsic, non-derived, original content. Granting this distinction and its importance for identifying genuinely cognitive states and processes, Adams and Aizawa dismiss the plausibility of extended cognition on the grounds that things like notebook entries and numerals written on paper do not have intrinsic content.

Clark (2010) responds to this objection, in part pressing Adams and Aizawa to clarify how much intrinsic content must be present in a system for the system to qualify as cognitive. After all, brains, if anything, are cognitive systems but not all activity occurring in a brain involves states or processes with intrinsic content. Accordingly, Clark wonders, why should the fact that some elements of the Otto+notebook system, because they lack intrinsic content, preclude the system from counting as cognitive?

Adams and Adams propose in response that “if you have a process that involves no intrinsic content, then the condition rules that the process is non-cognitive” (2010, 70). However, this response leaves open whether Otto+notebook constitutes a cognitive system. Because Otto’s brain does indeed contain states and processes that “involve” intrinsic content—states and processes by which the notebook entries are read and understood and used to guide behavior—Clark can readily accept Adams and Aizawa’s stipulation. Some of the Otto+notebook system involves intrinsic content, some does not, and the cognitive system as a whole incorporates both these elements.

The second mark of the mental that Adams and Aizawa take to preclude systems like Otto+notebook from counting as cognitive raises issues concerning the identification of scientific domains. If one supposes, reasonably enough, that the objects, processes, properties, etc. that fall into the domain of a particular science do so in virtue of sharing particular features, then one should expect the same for the domain of cognitive science. The parts, properties, and activities taking place in brains do seem to share important features, features that explain how it is possible to identify brains in newly discovered species, how they differ from igneous rocks, and so on. But now suppose that cognitive systems can be extended in ways that Clark, Chalmers and Wilson have argued. Such systems would now contain constituents that could not possibly fit into the domain of a single science. Extended systems might include notebooks, or pencil and paper, or tools of just about any sort. “[F]or this reason,” Adams and Aizawa argue, “a would-be brain-tool science would have to cover more than just a multiplicity of causal processes. It would have to cover a genuine motley” (2010, 76).

Rupert (2004) shares a similar concern, noting that the processes by which Otto and Inga locate MoMA differ so considerably that it makes no sense to treat them as of a kind—as within the domain of a single science. Additionally, Rupert argues, there is no good reason to regard the various implements that combine with brain activity to be constituents of a cognitive system rather than simply tools that cognitive systems use to ease the processing they require to complete some task. Instead of insisting that cognitive systems extend, Rupert asks, why not regard them as seeking ways to embed themselves among tools that make their jobs easier? An axe does not become part of a person when she uses it to chop down a tree, why does a notebook become part of cognitive system when a brain uses it to locate MoMA? A sensible conservatism, Rupert thinks, speaks in favor of seeing cognitive systems as embedded in environments that allow ready use of tools to reduce their workloads, rather than as constituted, in part, by such tools. The hypothesis that cognitive systems use tools “is significantly less radical” (2004, 7) than the hypothesis that tools are constituents of cognitive systems and would seem to provide adequate explanations for all the phenomena that initially motivated the idea of extended cognition.

From Clark’s perspective, however, there is nothing motley, as Adams and Aizawa claim, about the brain+ tool systems that he believes constitute a legitimate kind for scientific investigation. Moreover, the processes by which Otto and Inga locate MoMA are not, as Rupert insists, vastly different. Once one steps back from the physical particularities of the constituents of extended cognitive systems and focuses just on the functional, computational, roles they play, such systems are identical, or very similar, to wholly brain-bound cognitive systems.

Similarly, Clark would deny Rupert’s claim that the hypothesis of embedded cognition can equally well save the phenomena that the hypothesis of extended cognition was intended to capture and do so while requiring less revision of existing ideas about how cognitive systems operate. A brain, Clark claims, is “’cognitively impartial’: It does not care how and where key operations are performed” (2008, 136). Rupert’s conservatism in fact reflects a misunderstanding—it conceives of brains as having the function of cognizing, which is true in a sense, but more accurate would be a description of the brain’s function as directing the construction of cognizing systems—some (many?) of which include constituents outside the brain proper (see also Wilson and Clark 2009).

Finally, Shapiro (2019b; 2019c) has suggested that the parity and wide-computationalist defenses of Constitution do not sit well with other commitments of embodied cognition. As mentioned, such defenses rest on a functionalist theory of cognition (for more on functionalism, see the entry on functionalism). Functionalism may well justify the claim that states and processes outside the brain can be identical to states and processes internal to a brain (can stand in a relation of parity towards them), which in turn grounds the possibility that cognitive systems can contain non-neural constituents. But, Shapiro argues, this strategy for defending extended cognition seems contrary to the central theme of embodied cognition. Motivating the embodied turn in cognitive science is the idea that bodies are somehow essential to cognition. But the parity and wide-computational arguments for extended cognition entail just the opposite—important for cognition are computational processes, and because computational processes are “hardware neutral”, one need not consider the specifics of bodies in order to describe them. Thus, it appears, arguments in favor of extended cognition succeed to the extent that bodies, qua bodies, do not matter to cognition.

6. The Reach of Embodied Cognition

In addition to the usual cognitive terrain—language, perception, memory, categorization—that embodied cognition encompasses, researchers have recruited the concepts and methods of embodied cognition for the purpose of investigating other psychological domains. In particular, embodied cognition finds application in the fields of social cognition and moral cognition.

6.1 Social Cognition

Social cognition is the ability to understand and interact with other agents. A wide variety of cognitive capacities are involved in social cognition, such as attention, memory, affective cognition, and metacognition (Fiske and Taylor 2013). Traditionally, however, the philosophical discussion of social cognition has narrowly conceived of it in terms of mentalizing (also called theory of mind or mindreading). Mentalizing refers to the attribution of mental states, often restricted to propositional attitudes, and typically for the purpose of explaining and predicting others’ behavior. Thus, although social cognition is enabled by and involves numerous and diverse cognitive processes, many philosophers have tended to think of it simply as involving the attribution of propositional attitudes in order to predict and explain behavior. For canonical expressions of this view of social cognition, see Davies and Stone (1995a) and (1995b). More recently, philosophers have begun to conceive of social cognition more broadly. See Andrews, Spaulding, and Westra (2020) for a survey of Pluralistic Folk Psychology.

Embodied cognition theorists have rejected this narrow construal of social cognition. Though they do not deny that neurotypical adult humans have the capacity to attribute beliefs and desires and to explain and predict behavior, they argue that this is a specialized and rarely used skill in our ordinary social interactions (Gallagher 2020; Gallagher 2008; Hutto and Ratcliffe 2007). Most social interactions require only basic underlying social cognitive capacities that are known as primary and secondary intersubjectivity (Trevarthen 1979).

Primary intersubjectivity is the pre-theoretical, non-conceptual, embodied understanding of others that underlies and supports the higher-level cognitive skills involved in mentalizing. It is “the innate or early developing capacity to interact with others manifested at the level of perceptual experience—we see or more generally perceive in the other person’s bodily movements, facial gestures, eye direction, and so on, what they intend and what they feel” (Gallagher 2005, 204). Primary intersubjectivity is present from birth, but it continues to serve as the basis for our social cognition in adulthood. It manifests as the capacity for facial imitation, the capacity to detect and track eye movement, detect intentional behavior, and “read” emotions from actions and expressive movements of others. Primary intersubjectivity consists in informational sensitivity and appropriate responsiveness to specific features of one’s environment. It does not, embodied cognition theorists argue, involve representing and theorizing about those features. It simply requires certain practical abilities that have been shaped by selective pressures, e.g., sensitivity to certain bodily cues and facial expressions.

Around one year of age, neurotypical children develop the capacity for secondary intersubjectivity. This development enables a subject to move from one-on-one, immediate intersubjectivity to shared attention. At this stage, children learn to follow gazes, point, and communicate with others about objects of shared attention. According to embodied cognition, the cognitive skills acquired through secondary intersubjectivity are not rich, meta-cognitive representations about other minds. Rather, children learn practical skills when getting others to attend to an object and when learning to attend to objects others are attending to. This allows for a richer understanding of other agents, but it is still meant to be a behavioral, embodied understanding rather than a representation of others’ propositional attitudes (Gallagher 2005, 207).

Although primary and secondary intersubjectivity are described in developmental terms, according to embodied cognition these intersubjective practices constitute our primary mode of social cognition even as adults (Fuchs 2012; Gallagher 2008). For example, Hutto claims, “Our primary worldly engagements are nonrepresentational and do not take the form of intellectual activity” (2008, 51). One can see in Hutto’s description of social cognition a tendency toward the Replacement theme insofar as he seeks to minimize or reject completely a role for representation in the human capacity for understanding others’ behavior. Mentalizing, it is argued, is a late developing, rarely used, specialized skill. Primary and secondary intersubjectivity are fundamental insofar as they are sufficient for navigating most typical social interactions and insofar as they enable the development of higher-level social cognition, like mentalizing. Although, see Spaulding (2010) for a critique of these arguments.

Mirror neurons may be an important mechanism of social cognition on this kind of view. Mirror neurons are neurons that activate both endogenously in producing a behavior and exogenously in observing that very same behavior. For instance, neurons in the premotor cortex and inferior parietal lobule activate when a subject uses, say, a whole-handed grasp to pick up a bottle. These very same neurons selectively activate when a subject observes a target using a whole-handed grasp to pick up an object. Neuroscientists have discovered similar patterns of activation in neurons in various parts of the brain, leading to the proposal that there are mirror neuron systems for action, fear, anger, pain, disgust, etc. Though the interpretation of these findings is subject to a great deal of controversy (Hickok 2009), many theorists propose that mirror neurons are a basic mechanism of social cognition (Gallese 2009; Goldman 2009; Goldman and de Vignemont 2009; Iacoboni 2009). The rationale is that mirror neurons explain how a subject understands a target’s mental states without needing complicated, high-level inferences about behavior and mental states. In observation mode, the subject’s brain activates as if the subject is doing, feeling, or experiencing what the target is doing, feeling, or experiencing. Thus, the observation of the target’s behavior is automatically meaningful to the subject. Mirror neurons are a possible mechanism for embodied social cognition. If the findings and interpretations are upheld, they substantiate the claim that we can understand and interact with others without engaging in mentalizing. For a survey of the reasons to be cautious about these interpretations of mirror neurons, see Spaulding (2011; 2013).

6.2 Moral Cognition

Embodied moral cognition takes moral sentimentalism as a starting point. Moral sentimentalism is the view that our emotions and desires are, in some way, fundamental to morality, moral knowledge, and moral judgments. A particular version of moral sentimentalism holds that emotions, moral attitudes, and moral judgments are generated by our “gut reactions,” and any moral reasoning that occurs is typically post-hoc rationalization of those gut reactions (Haidt 2001; Nichols 2004; Prinz 2004). Embodied moral cognition takes inspiration from this kind of moral sentimentalism. It holds that many of our moral judgments stem from our embodied, affective states rather than abstract reasoning.

Various sources of empirical evidence support this kind of view. Consider, for example, pathological cases, such as psychopaths or individuals with damage to the ventromedial prefrontal cortex (vmPFC). Such individuals are impaired in making moral judgments. Psychopaths feel little compunction about behaving immorally and sometimes have a hard time differentiating moral from conventional norms (Hare 1999). Individuals with damage to the vmPFC retain knowledge of abstract moral principles but struggle in making specific, everyday moral decisions (Damasio 1994). In both cases, individuals lack the physiological responses that accompany neurotypical moral decision-making. Lacking these “somatic markers” that guide moral judgments, these individuals behave in impulsive, selfish, and immoral ways (Damasio 1994). Embodied cognition would predict this connection between physiological responses (like increased heartrate and palm sweating) and moral decision-making.

Psychologists and neuroscientists have observed the influence of embodied cues on moral judgments in neurotypical individuals, as well. For instance, experimentally manipulated perception of one’s heartrate seems to influence one’s moral judgments, with perceptions of faster heartrates leading to feelings of higher moral distress and more just moral judgments (Gu, Zhong, and Page-Gould 2013). Relatedly, there is some evidence that eliciting a feeling of disgust leads to harsher moral judgments (Schnall et al. 2008). Perceptions of cleanliness seem to lead to less severe moral judgments (Schnall, Benton, and Harvey 2008). In each of these cases, perception of embodied cues seems to mediate moral judgments. Moral sentimentalists have observed that many people have strong aversive reactions to harmless actions that violate taboos, such as consensual protected sex between adult siblings, cleaning a toilet with the national flag, eating one’s pet that had been run over, etc. In these cases, the strong negative affective response precedes the moral judgment, and often people have a difficult time articulating why they think these victimless, harmless actions are morally wrong (Strejcek and Zhong 2014; Haidt 2001; Haidt, Koller, and Dias 1993; Cushman, Young, and Hauser 2006). From the perspective of embodied cognition, this ordering confirms the notion that we make moral judgments on the basis of embodied cues.

Dual process theories of moral psychology reject the moral sentimentalism claim that all moral judgments are made in the same way. Dual process theories maintain that we have two systems of moral decision-making: a system for Utilitarian reasoning that is driven by affect-less, abstract deliberation, and system for Deontological reasoning that is driven by automatic, intuitive, emotional heuristics like gut feelings (Greene 2014). Dual process theories are meant to explain the seemingly inconsistent moral intuitions ordinary folks have about moral dilemmas. For example, in a standard trolley case where an out-of-control trolley is heading toward five innocent, unaware individuals on the track ahead, most people have the intuition that we ought to throw the switch so that the trolley goes onto a spur of the track, thereby killing one person on the spur but saving five lives. However, in the footbridge variation of the trolley problem where saving the five lives requires pushing an individual off a footbridge to derail the trolley, most people have the intuition that we should not do this even though the consequences are the same as in the standard trolley dilemma. The dual process theory holds that in the former case, our reasoning is guided by a System 2 type of abstract reasoning. However, in the latter case, our moral reasoning is guided by an aversive physiological response triggered by imagining pushing an individual off a footbridge. The dual process view partially vindicates the moral sentimentalist position insofar as it posits a distinctive System 1 type of moral reasoning that is based on embodied gut instincts. However, it maintains that there is a separate system operating on different inputs and processes for more abstract moral reasoning.

Recently, theorists have challenged dual process theories’ strict dichotomy between reason and emotion (Huebner 2015; Maibom 2010; Woodward 2016). On the one hand, brain areas that are associated with emotions like fear, anger, and disgust are implicated in complex learning and inferential processing. On the other hand, individuals who are clearly impaired in moral decision-making—psychopaths and those with damaged vmPFC—also suffer deficits in other kinds of learning and inferential processing. Abstract reasoning is not, as it turns out, cut off from affective processes. Somatic markers, affective cues, and physiological responses are central to reasoning, learning, and decision-making. For the proponent of embodied moral cognition, this serves as further confirmation of the idea that all cognition, including moral cognition, is deeply shaped by embodied cues. Though see May (2018), May and Kumar (2018) and Railton (2017) for a moral rationalist take on these findings.

7. Conclusion

This article aims to convey a sense of the breadth of topics that fall within the field of embodied cognition, as well as the numerous controversies that have been of special philosophical interest. As with any nascent research program, there remain questions about how embodied cognition relates to its forebears, in particular computational cognitive science and ecological psychology. Some of the hardest philosophical questions arising within embodied cognition, such as those concerning representation, explanation, and the very meaning of ‘mind’, are of a sort that any theory of mind must address. Apart from philosophical challenges to the conceptual integrity of embodied cognition there loom psychological concerns about the replicability of some of the most-cited findings within embodied cognition; although, in fairness, worries about replicability have recently arisen in many areas of psychology (Goldhill 2019; Lakens 2014; Maxwell, Lau, and Howard 2015; Rabelo et al. 2015). Whatever the future of embodied cognition, careful study of its aims, methods, conceptual foundations, and motivations will doubtless enrich the philosophy of psychology.


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