First published Thu Sep 26, 2019; substantive revision Tue Apr 7, 2020

In the middle of the fifth century BCE, Empedocles of Acragas formulated a philosophical program in hexameter verse that pioneered the influential four-part theory of roots (air, water, earth, and fire) along with two active principles of Love and Strife, which influenced later philosophy, medicine, mysticism, cosmology, and religion. The philosophical system responded to Parmenides’ rejection of change while embracing religious injunctions and magical practices. As a result, Empedocles has occupied a significant position in the history of Presocratic philosophy as a figure moving between mythos and logos, religion and science. Modern debate arises from the lack of consensus on the number of his verse works, their relation to one another, and the coherence of his philosophical system as a whole. This entry will introduce Empedocles, his life and work—traditionally referred to as On Nature and the Purifications—as well as the scholarly debates that continue to dominate study of his philosophical system. It closes with the influence Empedocles had upon his successors. The numbering of the fragments in this article follows that of the Diels-Kranz edition [DK] and Laks and Most 2016; translations are from Laks and Most.

The sixth edition of Diels-Kranz’s Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker remains the gold standard for the fragments of the Presocratic philosophers. In this system of classification, each Presocratic thinker is numbered (roughly) chronologically – Empedocles is DK 31 in the series, for example. Following this number (which we omit in cases where it is clear we are referring to Empedocles), fragments of each philosopher are subdivided into one of three categories: testimonia, or witnesses to the philosopher’s thought, constitute ‘A’ fragments; the actual words of the philosopher fall under the category of ‘B’ fragments; imitations come under ‘C’ fragments. After a fragment’s letter, each also receives a sequential distinguishing number. For example, the first fragment of Empedocles referred to in this article, DK 31 A 1, signals that it arises from the Diels-Kranz edition, focuses on Empedocles, and is testimonium no. 1. In 2016, a new and updated edition of the Presocratic philosophers was published with a facing translation by André Laks and Glenn W. Most. It is now essential to consult this monumental work of scholarship in addition to Diels-Kranz. For this reason, we also include notations from Laks and Most’s edition following Diels-Kranz. Laks and Most follow a different system of notation for the fragments: ‘P’ (= person) fragments include those in which a philosopher’s person is discussed. These give information on a philosopher’s biography, personality, and memorable sayings. ‘D’ (= doctrine) fragments refer to all references to the doctrine of the philosopher, including their own words. Finally, ‘R’ (= reception) fragments preserve later conceptions of the philosopher’s doctrine.

1. Life and Writings

The philosopher Empedocles was a native of the south-central Sicilian polis of Acragas (Agrigento). Although the precise dates of his lifetime are unknown, the sources agree that he was born in the early fifth century BCE; according to Aristotle, he died at sixty years of age (DK 31 A 1 = P 5b). Rich detail on the philosopher’s life survives in particular through a late biography written in Diogenes Laertius’ Lives and Opinions of Eminent Philosophers, which dates to the third century CE. Unfortunately, much of this is a romantic confection, and is often derivative of the verses of Empedocles himself. It is likely that he was born to an aristocratic family; his grandfather kept horses and was remembered as a victor at the Olympic Games. According to the fourth-century BCE sophist Alcidamas’ Physics (A 1 = P 15), Empedocles was a student of Parmenides of Elea, and later became an adherent of Anaxagoras and Pythagoras. This intellectual apprenticeship, while hardly possible on chronological grounds, does accurately reflect the verses’ engagement with Parmenides’ theories of coming to be and passing away, and Empedocles’ familiarity with the Pythagoreans and Anaxagoras is not unlikely. The third-century BCE biographer of eminent philosophers, Hermippus, by contrast, held that he was an emulator of Xenophanes (A 1 = P 14). In Empedocles’ lifetime, Acragas underwent a series of political transformations from tyranny to oligarchy to democracy. The biographical tradition persistently attributes democratic sensibilities to Empedocles: he is said to have championed the people against those advancing inequality or aiming at tyranny (A1 = P 18–19). Further, he was associated with dismantling an oligarchy of the “Thousand” and rejecting an offer of kingship; similarly, his father apparently forestalled a rising tyranny (D.L. 8.72). These anecdotes may explain Empedocles’ reputation as a talented orator in the absence of any prose treatises. In Aristotle’s Sophist, he is credited with rhetoric’s invention (A 1 = R 5). So too, Aristotle’s On the Poets praised his kinship with Homer in the force of his language and metaphor (A 1 = R 1b). Significantly, Gorgias was associated with him as a student (A 1 = P 24). Elsewhere, Empedocles is reported to have been a physician (A 1 = P 24) and a founder of the Sicilian school of medicine. Evidence for this reputation is present already in the late fifth century in the Hippocratic On Ancient Medicine, which critiques Empedocles’ alliance of the study of nature and medicine (A 71 = R 6). Most provocatively, he is said to have brought a dead woman back to life and been worshipped as a god in his own lifetime (A 1 = P 29), narratives clearly embellished from his poetry (B 112.4 = D 4.4). Like his contemporaries, Empedocles supposedly travelled widely, visiting Thurii after its foundation in 445/4, Olympia, and elsewhere in the Peloponnese. His enemies may have taken such an absence as an opportunity to exile the philosopher (A 1 = D.L. 8.67). Reports on his death are confused. We can be sure that he did not make the fiery leap into Aetna, as was widely held in antiquity (Chitwood 1986). It is possible, but that is all, that he died in the Peloponnese (A 1 = P 29.71b–72).

Though his work has not survived intact, Empedocles enjoyed a dynamic afterlife among philosophers and their commentators, as well as physicians and natural scientists. According to Diogenes Laertius, Empedocles composed two poems, On Nature and the Purifications. Various other works were attributed to the philosopher in antiquity, including a hymn to Apollo, a poem on the invasion of Xerxes, medical texts, tragedies, epigrams, and political essays, but there is no unambiguous evidence for these. The interpretation of the extant fragments from On Nature and the Purifications is complicated by the modern scholarly debate on whether they in fact constitute two works, as Diogenes Laertius alleged, or a single philosophical project, as some recent scholars have argued (Osborne 1987, Inwood 2001, Trépanier 2004, Janko 2005). The latter, heterodox position has been fueled further by the recent publication of the Strasbourg papyrus (Martin & Primavesi 1999, Primavesi 2008), which contains a portion of On Nature with lines that had traditionally been assigned to the Purifications. This find unsettles the notion of a physical doctrine separate from a religious one, showing that if there are two works, these were much more closely thematically related than was previously understood. Nevertheless, as the topics of the two parts (if they did belong to a single poem) are sufficiently distinct, we treat them separately here. The first primarily concerns the formation, structure, and history of the physical world as a whole, and the formation of the animals and plants within it; the second concerns morality and purification. For convenience, this article uses the traditional names for the two collections of fragments.

2. On Nature

On Nature is a bold and ambitious work. It is addressed variously to the Muse, Calliope; Empedocles’ disciple, Pausanias; and perhaps also to the wider community of Acragas (Obbink 1993). The poem’s authority stems from its appeal to the divine for inspiration. Empedocles’ Muse does not, however, forestall the labor that the addressee must invest in being cognitively receptive to the message of the work (B3 = D44; B 4 = D 47). As in traditional didactic verse, Empedocles cultivates a “master-pupil” relationship and promises Pausanias a mortal intelligence to soar beyond all others (B 2 = D 42). On Nature contains an ontology of matter, barring complete destruction or generation, and a cosmogony, motivated by the aggregation and separation of Empedocles’ four basic elements through the power of Love and Strife. Following this, the poem passes to zoogony and biology, as well as reflections on cognition and perception.

2.1 Roots and Forces

On Nature is based on the claim that everything is composed of four roots; these are moved by two opposing forces, Love and Strife.

  • Hear first of all the four roots of all things:
  • Zeus the gleaming, Hera who gives life, Aidoneus,
  • And Nêstis, who moistens with her tears the mortal fountain. (B6 = D 57)

Since the roots are identified by the names of deities—and not by the traditional names for the elements fire, earth, air, and water—there are rival interpretations of which deity is to be identified with which root. Nevertheless, there is general agreement that the passage refers to fire, earth, air (= aither, the upper, atmospheric air, rather than the air that we breathe here on earth) and water (cf. B 109 = D 207). Aristotle credits Empedocles with being the first to distinguish clearly these four elements (Metaphysics. 985a31–3). However, the fact that the roots have divinities’ names indicates that each has an active nature and is not just inert matter (Rowett 2016). These roots and forces are eternal and equally balanced, although the influence of Love and of Strife waxes and wanes (B 6 and B 17.14–20 = D 57 and D 73.245–51).

In fragment 17 of Diels-Kranz, apparently speaking of the physical world as a whole, Empedocles states his fundamental thesis about the relation of roots and forces:

  • Twofold is what I shall say: for at one time they [i.e., the elements] grew to be only one
  • Out of many, at another time again they separate to be many out of one.
  • And double is the birth of mortal things, double their death.
  • For the one [i.e., birth] is both born and destroyed by the coming together of all things,
  • While the other inversely, when they are separated, is nourished and flies apart (?).
  • And these [scil. the elements] incessantly exchange their places continually,
  • Sometimes by Love all coming together into one,
  • Sometimes again each one carried off by the hatred of Strife.
  • <Thus insofar as they have learned to grow as one out of many,>
  • And inversely, the one separating again, they end up being many,
  • To that extent they become, and they do not have a steadfast lifetime;
  • But insofar as they incessantly exchange their places continually,
  • To that extent they always are, immobile in a circle. (B 17.1–13 = D 73)

Immediately one is struck by the comprehensive symmetry of this scheme. It seems to address coming-to-be and passing-away, birth and death, and it does so with an elegant balance. The four roots come together and blend, under the agency of Love, and they are driven apart by Strife. At the same time, elements have an active drive toward homogenization on the principal of affinity (Primavesi 2016). While this passage describes periods when one of the forces is dominant, it also describes a cycle. One force does not finally triumph over the other; rather, their periods of dominance succeed one another in continual alternation.

Empedocles argues that these roots and forces do not pass away nor is anything added to them. They are the permanent constituents of the cyclic drama just described:

  • For these are all equal and identical in age,
  • But each one presides over a different honor, each one has its own character,
  • And by turns they dominate while the time revolves.
  • And besides these, nothing at all is added nor is lacking;
  • For if they perished entirely, they would no longer be.
  • And this whole here, what could increase it, and coming from where?
  • And how could it be completely destroyed, since nothing is empty of these?
  • But these are themselves, but running the ones through the others
  • They become now this, now that, and each time are continually similar. (B 17.27–35 = D 73.258–266)

We find similar terminology in Parmenides’ poem when he argues that the All is one and that it does not come to be:

  • And was not, nor will it be at some time, since it is now, together, whole
  • One, continuous. For what birth could you seek for it?
  • How, from what could it have grown? (B 8.5–7 = D 8.10–12).

Of course, a notorious consequence of Parmenides’ argument is the impossibility of plurality and of the world of change that we experience. By contrast, Empedocles argues for a plurality of permanent entities, i.e., the roots and forces. By incorporating plurality into his account, he can explain the changing world of our experience as the combination and disaggregation of the enduring roots under the influence of the enduring forces.

2.2 Cosmogony

Cosmogony is due to the interplay of the four roots and the two forces. Each of the roots has its specific nature. Some—like fire and water—are traditionally seen as antagonistic; others—like fire and air—are seen as compatible. However, Empedocles did not think the specific natures of the roots could cause them to organize themselves into a cosmos. Hence, he introduces Love and Strife. Love works by bringing together roots of different types into harmony. It does so by instilling attraction among the different types of roots for one another; without Love, these roots would not naturally cohere. While it is true that Love then pulls what is similar apart from what is similar, it does not do so by causing repulsion for one another in similar roots. By contrast, Strife aggregates similar roots together by instilling repulsion among different types of roots for one another. The work of Strife is to replace the attraction among different types of roots instilled by Love with repulsion. During the history of a cosmos, these forces are in contention, present together in waxing and waning strengths, throughout the coming to be of the cosmos and its creatures and in their passing away.

While all commentators take the passage at B17.1–13 (=D 73.233–244) as fundamental, their interpretations vary, sometimes widely. In the traditional sort of interpretation (see O’Brien 1969, Wright 1981) this passage speaks about a two-part symmetrical cosmic cycle, which endlessly repeats itself. We can trace the history of one cycle, beginning with the point at which all the roots are united, completely intermingled and motionless under the total domination of Love, an image reminiscent of Parmenides’ spherical “what-is”. Then Strife enters and begins to separate the roots out, until finally all are completely separated into distinct, self-contained masses of fire, air, earth and water. At this point, Love begins to unite the roots until, once again, they are completely intermingled and another cycle begins. In each half of the cycle, as the separation or unification proceeds, there is a cosmogony (generation of a cosmos or ordered world) and a zoogony (generation of animals). In the first half-cycle, under the increasing influence of Strife, a cosmos and then animals come to be. In the second half, under the increasing influence of Love, again a cosmos and animals come to be. We will start with the traditional interpretations which hold that there are double cosmogonies and then look at the second strain of interpretations where there is only one cosmogony.

Empedocles posits a stage in which Love is totally dominant and all things are unified into a Sphere (B 27 and 29 = D 89 and 92). Since this spherical unity includes the roots, they are presumably thoroughly intermingled with one another (for an alternative view, Sedley 2016). The Sphere is the initial stage in the formation of the cosmos; it is not itself a cosmos. At this point, Strife begins to insinuate itself into the Sphere (B 30 and 31 = D 94 and 95). The outcome is the separation of the roots into a cosmos (A 49 = D 99a–b). The latter requires a separation of roots into identifiable masses of earth, air, water, and fire (B 38 = D 122), even though there might still be some (much diminished) presence of each root within each of the four masses. The roots of earth, water, air and fire would predominate in the respective masses, making them identifiable as such. The mass of earth is at the center; water more or less surrounds the earth. Air forms the next layer. From fire at the periphery, the sun comes to be as a distinct entity. This geocentric formation is what the ancients usually recognized to be our cosmos. Since it is Strife that separates the roots, the cosmogony so described is presumably dependent on Strife’s influence.

Empedocles also describes a time when Strife has separated the roots. This separation is total and is the opposite pole from the Sphere, which is a total mixture under the influence of Love.

  • When Strife has reached the deepest depth
  • Of the vortex, and Love has come to be in the center of the whirl,
  • Under her dominion all these [i.e., the elements] come together to be only one,
  • Each one coming from a different place, not brusquely, but willingly (B 35.20–23 = D 75.3–6)

First of all, this somewhat mysterious description suggests that the means by which Strife separates the roots from the beginning is a vortex. Heavier elements like earth settle in the middle and lighter ones like fire are pushed to the periphery. This reference to the vortex also implies that dominance by Strife is characterized by the whirling motion of the cosmos as we know it. In addition, this fragment suggests the end of the rule of Strife and the beginning of the rule of Love, as this principle begins to insinuate itself into the elements. The latter part of this passage describes the unifying effect of Love.

At this point, we can start to consider the difference between traditional and non-traditional interpretations of Empedocles’ cycle. While in traditional interpretations the separation by Strife, as described above in Fr. 30 and 31 (= D 94 and 95), produces at first a cosmos, the continuing influence of Strife gradually increases the separation. Eventually, when Strife is totally dominant as described in B35 (= D75), the roots are so thoroughly separated into their respective places, each constituting a mass totally on its own, with no presence in it of any portion of any of the other roots, that the cosmos and all its movements are destroyed. These interpretations then hold that there is another cosmogony in the reverse progress from complete separation to complete unity, under the influence of Love. Certainly, the symmetry of the fundamental principle might suggest a second cosmogony. However, we do not find in the remains of Empedocles’ poem a description of another cosmogony, one taking place under the influence of Love. Of course, that we do not find one does not mean that it did not exist, given the fragmentary nature of the text. In fact, Aristotle suggests in a number of places (De Caelo II 13, 295a29; De Generatione et Corruptione II 7, 334a5) that Empedocles was committed to such a second cosmogony. But he says Empedocles shied away from holding to such a cosmogony because it is not reasonable to posit a cosmos coming to be from elements already separated—as though cosmogony can only happen through the separation of elements out of a previously blended condition of them all (De Caelo, III 2, 301a14).

Such issues lend weight to a second strain of interpretation (see Long 1974, Bollack 1965–1969), which still reads the fundamental principle of B 17 (= D 73) as referring to alternating periods of domination by Love and Strife. However, they hold that there is only one cosmogony and one zoogony. In the vortex, Strife dominates in order to separate the roots into their respective places, shattering Love’s Sphere. Strife’s creation of separate elements allows for their recombination by Love to form a cosmos. As described above, this would be a condition in which some portions of each of the other roots become intermingled. Love asserts her influence, forming the cosmos (consisting of a world-order with continental land-masses, oceans, rivers, winds, sun, moon, seasons, planets, stars, etc.). From the mixture of roots in due proportions, there arise various forms of animal life. Ultimately, both animals and cosmos perish as Love totally reunifies the roots. Thus, finally, the Sphere is restored and the cosmos ends. On this interpretation there is a single cosmogony generated by the increasing power of Love and a single zoogony under alternating dominance by Love and Strife. The idea of a single cosmogony and zoogony is attractive, in part, because it echoes other Presocratic philosophers.

The discovery and publication of twelfth-century Byzantine scholia on Aristotle’s Physics and On Generation and Corruption (Rashed 2001, 2014) that preserve an elaborate cosmic time line for Love and Strife’s rule has further divided scholarly opinion. The scholia record an increase of Love’s power for sixty units of time; a perfect Sphere for forty units; and a rule of Strife lasting sixty units. Primavesi (2016) has linked this ratio to Pythagorean number philosophy through the structure of a double tetractys. Nonetheless, the authenticity of the scholia’s time line in relation to Empedocles’ philosophical system remains contested (Osborne 2005).

2.3 Zoogony

So far we have concentrated primarily on the coming to be of the cosmos. However, the interplay of forces and roots also explains the coming to be and destruction of animals:

  • But they, when light mixed with aether in a human (?)…
  • Or in the race of savage beasts or of bushes
  • Or of birds, then … to be born;
  • But when they are separated apart, this in turn they call “unfortunate destiny”,
  • As is licit (themis), and I myself too apply it [i.e., this term] in the same way. (B 9 = D54)

Empedocles uses a striking image to illustrate how roots are mixed to produce animals:

  • As when painters color many-hued sacrificial offerings,
  • Both men, by reason of their skill, very expert in their art,
  • They grasp many-colored pigments in their hands,
  • Then, having mixed them in harmony, the ones more, the others less,
  • Out of these they compose forms similar to all things,
  • Creating trees, men, and women,
  • Wild beasts and birds, water-nourished fish,
  • And long-lived gods, the greatest in honors:
  • In this way may your mind not succumb to the error that it is from elsewhere [scil. than from the four elementary roots]
  • That comes the source of all the innumerable mortal things whose existence is evident,
  • But know this exactly, once you have heard the word of a god. (B 23 = D 60)

Although this analogy seems to describe the way Love combines different roots, as we shall see Empedocles associated zoogony with the influence of both forces. We can distinguish two sets of fragments that tell of the way that living beings come to be. The first set tells about fantastic events and creatures; the second about natural-sounding events and creatures.

Let us start with the fantastic. Empedocles says that there was a time when separate limbs wandered around on their own:

  • From it [scil. the earth] blossomed many faces without necks,
  • Naked arms wandered about, bereft of shoulders,
  • And eyes roamed about alone, deprived of brows. (B 57 = D 157).

The wandering and straying suggest aimless and disorderly movements (and so, some influence of Strife). Then, however, these separate limbs combined in random ways to make fantastic creatures:

  • Many grew double of face and double of chest,
  • Races of man-prowed cattle, while others sprang up inversely,
  • Creatures of cattle-headed men, mixed here from men,
  • There creatures of women fitted with shadowy genitals. (B 61 = D 156)

In these fragments there is a change from separateness to combination and cooperation (Sedley 2016). Combination and cooperation are, of course, the work of Love. Whether this phase also produced non-fantastic creatures, e.g., ox-headed oxen, is not clear. Aristotle seemed to think it did, because he says some of these combinations were fitted to survive (Physics. II 8, 198b29).

In the second set of fragments we find an explanation of the way that present day creatures come to be.

  • Come then: how fire, separating off, drew upward the nocturnal saplings
  • Of much-weeping men and women—
  • Hear this. For my tale is not aimless nor ignorant.
  • First, complete [or: rough] outlines sprang up from the earth
  • Possessing a share of both, of water as of heat.
  • These fire sent upward, wishing to reach what was similar to it;
  • As yet they displayed neither the lovely framework of limbs
  • Nor the voice and the organ that is native to men. (B 62 = D 157)

This phase produces the earliest human forms, which are autochthonous, and they have yet to show entirely human features. Ultimately, from these there developed men and women as we know them today (B 63–65 = D 164, 162, 171, 172). At this point, sexual reproduction becomes the focus of Empedocles’ account. Still, this first phase begins with separation of elements, as the first lines of the fragment show, and so it involves some influence of Strife.

It has been proposed that the move from discrete necks, arms, and eyes to the existing, compound bodies of humans and animals is an anticipation of a kind of evolution through natural selection (Sedley 2016). That is, single-limbed organisms joined together with one another to produce temporary compounds that survived on the basis of their success in the environment, and eventually came to reproduce themselves.

In the traditional interpretations, these fragments describe two zoogonies, one under the increasingly dominant influence of Love and the other under the dominant influence of Strife. So, the living beings produced by the work of Love belong to the era when Love rules and those brought into existence by Strife belong to the era when Strife rules. By contrast, in the second strain of interpretation, there is only one zoogony, which takes place under the increasing influence of Love, although Strife is still present. Thus, there are not two zoogonies happening in distinct cosmic cycles; rather there are fluctuations of Love and Strife within the progress from total domination by Strife to that by Love. This question has been affected by a surprising discovery. In 1994, at the Bibliothèque Nationale et Universitaire of Strasbourg, a papyrus was identified as containing extensive fragments of Empedocles’ poem; some of this material was hitherto unknown to modern readers. In the wake of this discovery, some scholars have argued the newly found material added weight to the traditional reading. For instance, Trépanier (2003) argues that ensemble d (see Martin and Primavesi 1999: 144–149) strengthens previous evidence for a kind of zoogony taking place under the influence of Strife, which is fully distinct from the kind of zoogony under the influence of Love. In turn, distinct zoogonies imply distinct cosmogonies.

However, the double zoogony implies that animals or their parts will come to be through a process of separation. Since zoogony under increasing Love is shown to be a kind of assembly of parts that leads to viable creatures, by parity of reasoning, zoogony under increasing Strife should be a sundering of wholes that leads to viable creatures or to the sort of parts that are condemned to further disintegration. The task, then, for the traditionalists is to find in the manuscript passages that clearly show a sundering that produces viable creatures or parts thereof. In turn, the sundering must clearly belong to a stage in which Strife is not just dominant—after all, their opponents recognize a fluctuation in the influence of Love and Strife—but is achieving complete separation. While the traditionalists have presented passages from the manuscript that they claim to be such evidence, the claims have not gone unchallenged (see Balaudé 2010 and Laks 2001). At this point in the continuing scholarly debate perhaps it is not too bold to say that the new material presents some—not uncontested—evidence for a double zoogony.

The question of the sequence of these stages is, perhaps, not as important as the fact that, on any view, Empedocles is proposing a way of explaining living beings by competing principles of Love and Strife. While each of the four roots has its particular quality, these qualities alone are not enough to explain how a cosmos, and its creatures, come to be. Besides the interaction of fire, air, earth, and water, there must be other forces at work in order to have the world we live in. Thus, the four roots, with the particular qualities, are not so naturally antagonistic as to defy combination but are capable both of repelling one another and of coming together. On the one hand, a lot of our world is the effect of disintegration because the roots prove to be antagonistic due to Strife; on the other, they also come together by harmonizing their particular qualities due to Love. When harmony is a creative force, how Love achieves combination comes to the fore. The explanation of harmonizing what could be antagonistic achieves an important depth in the idea of a proportional mixture of roots. Empedocles says that flesh and blood are composed of approximately equal parts of earth, fire, water, and aither (B 98 = D 190). Another proportion of elements produces bone (B 96 = D 192). Thus, a proper balance harmonizes the roots and banishes antagonism. However we read the cycles of Love and Strife, then, this harmony of potentially opposing roots is only a phase. In the sphere of Love, the proportion that produces the variety of creatures gives way to a homogenizing blend of roots.

These fragments seem related to ancient medicine, with its theory of the proper mixture of hot and cold, dry and wet as constituting the healthy condition of the body (recall that we are told that Empedocles was a physician as well as a philosopher and poet). However, the extant fragments do not show any detailed connection with medical explanations. The equal proportion in the mixture of blood does seem related to another kind of explanation. Blood has a central role to play in Empedocles’ account of biological processes, to which we now turn; among other things, it is that whereby men think (B 105 = D 240). It appears that the equal mixture allows discrimination of all things (since, of course, all things are made up of the four elements in differing proportions).

2.4 Perception/Cognition

It is not clear that Empedocles makes a distinction between perception and cognition. Certainly the tradition in antiquity, exemplified by Aristotle, attributes to him only an account of perception, which is based on the following:

  • For it is by earth that we see earth, by water water,
  • By aether divine aether, and by fire destructive fire,
  • And fondness by fondness, and strife by baleful strife. (B 109 = D 207)

If we take “see” (opôpamen) to mean sense perception, then this characterization suggests that such perception is by the likeness of external elements to internal elements. Then, since roots and principles in the perceiver are related to the roots and principles in the perceived object, the passage suggests that elements in one correspond to elements in the other. This passage, of course, does not make clear how this correspondence results in the perception of color and shape. Still, Empedocles is able to explain, by way of “effluences” how the elements in the perceived object affect the elements in the perceiver. Everything gives off effluences (B 89 = D 208). These are tiny particles that flow out from objects continually. One can then grasp one half of the correspondence; effluences from the perceived object flow to the perceiver, in particular to the perceptual organ. Then, effluences of fire would make contact with the fire in the eye. On this basis, since fire, e.g., is white, one can construct an account of the way that fire, and the other roots, are responsible for color perception. However, these sorts of explanation do not encompass the perception of Love and Strife, which seems to depend on deduction (B 17.21 = D 73.252).

In view of such difficulties, some have argued that B 109 (= D 207) implies a more general notion than sense perception. If opôpamen includes understanding and knowledge (as it seems to in the case of Love and Strife), then Empedocles is not talking about the meeting of external and internal elements. Rather, he implies a more abstract operation in which we acquire an intellectual grasp of the roots and the forces and do not just perceive them (see Kamtekar 2009). However, two recent studies that focus on the perception of color imply that B 109 (= D207) describes sense perception (Ierodiakonou 2005 and Kalderon 2015: 1–16).

Whether B 109 is about sense perception or not, in another passage (B 84 = D 215) Empedocles focuses on the senses when he talks about the way the eye functions (trans. Rashed 2007):

  • Just as when someone, before taking to the road, constructs a lamp for himself,
  • A flame of gleaming fire in a stormy night,
  • Fitting, as protection against all winds, lantern casings
  • That scatter the breath of the buffeting winds,
  • While the light, finer as it is, leaping through to the outside,
  • Shines on the threshold with its unimpaired beams,
  • Thus, after Aphrodite had fitted the ogygian fire enclosed in membranes with pegs of love,
  • She poured round-eyed Korê in filmy veils
  • These kept off the depth of water flowing round about them,
  • But allowed the fire to pass through to the outside, in that it is finer, where they had been bored through with marvellous funnels.

In the lantern, the flame is shielded by a linen screen, but the light still goes through the linen. So the eye has a membrane through which the flame within the eye goes out. This account of the eye refers to another important Empedoclean idea: the surface of the eye has passages through which the effluent fire goes out. Still, effluences go in the other direction, as well, from the objects. This possibility suggests another important Empedoclean idea. In a well-known passage of Plato’s Meno where Socrates is supposed to be giving Empedocles’ theory of perception, effluences come from the object of perception to the organ of perception. In this account there is also a way to distinguish the different kinds of perception. Different sized effluences from the object fit similarly shaped openings or pores in the different organs. Then colors are effluences from objects fitted to the pores of the eye (A 92 = D 209). So, perception of color is based on a correspondence between the shape of the pores in the eye and the shape of the particles that flow from the perceived object.

Empedocles’ portrayal of the functions of the mind also seems based on the philosophy of affinity. Its materialist basis is clear from Empedocles’ contention that the blood around the heart is uniquely suited to cognition:

  • Nourished in the seas of back-springing blood,
  • Where above all is located what humans call thought:
  • For the blood around the heart is for humans their thought. (B 105 = D 240).

As in Parmenides’ account of thought as a “mixture of much-wandering limbs” (B 16 = D 51), so too in Empedocles thinking appears to result from the blended ratio (Palmer 2019)—in this case, of the mixture of earth, water, air, and fire (A 86 = D 237). It has been suggested that the roughly even distribution of the four elements in blood is what makes it so suited to cognition (Long 1966). Though both cognition and sense perception operate on the basis of affinity, their relationship to one another is less clear. According to the traditional interpretation, cognition does not seem to rely upon the senses. Nor is there a single “command center” in the blood around the heart, where effluences from the sensory organs are relayed to. Instead, cognition operates as a sense in its own right. This materialist account of cognition has lately been called into question (Curd 2016). As Empedocles is committed to the idea that all things have a share of thought (B 110 = D 257), then this must include things that have no blood. For humans, pericardial blood might then serve as a command center for sensory data, for evaluation and judgment.

However we interpret the process of cognition, it is clear that thought has the potential to dramatically alter an individual’s constitution:

  • For if, leaning upon your firm organs of thought (prapides),
  • With pure efforts you gaze upon them benevolently,
  • They [i.e., the elements] will all be present to you throughout your lifetime
  • And many other good things will come to you from them. For these things themselves
  • Are what makes each thing grow in one’s character, according to each person’s nature.
  • But if you covet different things, such as those that among men are
  • Countless miseries that blunt their thoughts,
  • Certainly they will abandon you quickly, as the time revolves,
  • In their desire to rejoin the race that is theirs.
  • For know that all things feel (phronesis) and have their share of thought (noema). (B 110 = D 257)

Acceptance of Empedocles’ philosophical program is envisioned as being dependent upon his physicalist doctrine of the mixture of elements. Its adoption by the addressee relies on a constitution that is receptive to truth. Still, one remains capable of growing in wisdom (Sassi 2016). Alternatively, the disciple will increasingly become cognitively corrupted, “blunted”. The philosopher Theophrastus reports that Empedocles attributed individual temperaments to the more or less favorable mixture of the elements within blood, which was responsible for intelligent, slothful, and impetuous individuals (B 86 = D 237).

It is likely not coincidental that the balance of elements in blood that is productive of thought approximates the elemental balance also found within the Sphere under the influence of Love. This would suggest that cognition is to be associated with Love. But the failure of perfect cognition should be linked to the imperfections of the mixture of the elements in blood, and this must be due to the co-presence of Strife (Long 1966).

3. Purifications

The title of Empedocles’ hexameter poem, Purifications, is not likely to be original; still, the title provides a valuable guide to its contents. Purification or cleansing (καθαρμός) could be performed both prior to pollution (to ward it off) and after it was incurred (to dissolve its power). Ritual and symbolic washing with water or blood were lustral, as was abstinence from select harmful practices. Seers held that the purification of the body could remove disease; at the same time, Pythagoreans and Orphic mystics apparently understood purification as the emancipation of the soul from the body. Musaeus and Epimenides also had Purifications attached to their names. Any one or indeed all of these associations may have attracted the title to Empedocles’ work.

Apart from the relatively rare explicit citations from the Purifications, scholars have been hard pressed to identify what fragments come from this work as opposed to On Nature, and in general adhere to “ritual” themes as the deciding factor. Additionally, the internal audience appears to be not a single individual as Pausanias, but the people of Acragas in general, and so second-person plural addresses are often taken as evidence for the Purifications. At the start, Empedocles declares his divinity and his powers of prophecy and healing to his fellow citizens. In what follows the fragments of the Purifications disclose an ancient decree and an “oracle of Necessity” of transmigration for fallen daemons, “spirits”, as punishment for their alliance with Strife through bloodshed and perjury (B 115 = D 10 and 11). After becoming polluted, the daemon is successively rejected by the elements and banished from the divine for 30,000 seasons. Empedocles reveals that he too is a participant in this cosmic peripatetic. Incarnation has the potential to expiate the crime of the daemon, and by moving through a series of lives as plants, animals, and finally, humans, he returns to the banquets of the gods. But in order to achieve this enlightened state, the daemon must adhere to a rigid ethical program, refusing meat, beans, and the bay leaf, and heterosexual sex as well. These injunctions constitute a radical indictment of traditional Greek religion.

Transmigration is governed by the four roots under the influence of Love and Strife, aligning the Purifications with the physical doctrine of On Nature. Here, however, the ramifications of matter, attraction, and repulsion are paramount for humans. Strife sets off the initial collapse of divine unity, creating the daemons who descend into the cycle of incarnations. Their return to the worship of Love permits an eventual restoration to the divine. Empedocles gives a vivid portrayal of her peaceful worship by early humans; this near Golden Age is in stark contrast to those fragments that inveigh against traditional sacrifices and the eating of meat in language evocative of Agamemnon’s sacrifice of Iphigenia and Thyestes’ cannibal feast of his children. Worship of Love allows for a return to the divine. At last the daemons arise as gods; released from exile, they enjoy a blessed life (B 146 and 147 = D 39 and 40).

3.1 Transmigration

Transmigration is central to the philosophical program of the Purifications. The doctrine already had adherents in the followers of Orphism and among the Pythagoreans, and Empedocles no doubt drew upon this prominent south Italian and Sicilian tradition in advocating for his own cycle of incarnations (Kingsley 1995, Palmer 2019). One part of the cycle begins under the total domination of Love through the Sphere, with Strife exiled from the four roots. After these have become blended, Strife “leaps” into action, becoming the motivator of the pollution by those gods who perjure a sacred decree governed by Necessity. This triggers a chain reaction of banishment and wandering for the newly fallen daemons in a fragment traditionally taken as part of the Purifications (O’Brien 2001):

  • There is an oracle of Necessity, an ancient decree of the gods,
  • Eternal, sealed by broad oaths:
  • Whenever by crimes some one [scil. of them] pollutes his limbs, by murder
  • <…> whoever commits a fault by perjuring himself on oath,
  • The divinities (daimones) who have received as lot a long life,
  • Must wander thrice ten thousand seasons far from the blessed ones,
  • Growing during this time in the different forms of mortal beings,
  • Exchanging the painful paths of life.
  • For the force of the aether chases them toward the sea,
  • The sea spits them out toward earth’s surface, the earth toward the rays
  • Of the bright sun, and he [i.e., the sun] hurls them into the eddies of the aether.
  • Each one receives them from another, but all hate them.
  • Of them, I too am now one, an exile from the divine and a wanderer,
  • I who relied on insane Strife. (B 115 = D 10)

The daemon’s fate reworks a passage from Hesiod’s Theogony (775–806) that recounts the prerogatives of the goddess Styx, who, after strife and quarrels have emerged, punishes the gods’ perjury with an exile of nine years. Yet, as in On Nature, the four roots are crucial—air, water, earth, and fire play a key role in the cycle of incarnation, successively expelling the daemon from their spheres of influence. Details on the beginning of the cycle remain frustratingly unclear. At what stage in the rising influence of Strife the gods pollute themselves is ambiguous, as are the precise conditions under which the gods become daemons. As in epic and tragedy, there may be “dual motivation”: Strife provokes transmigration, but the daemon remains accountable for its crimes.

Punishment arises through exile from the gods and a long wandering; the daemon is hated by all and reliant on Strife. Neither Zeus nor Hades will receive it (B 142 = D 12). The fate of mortals in general is grim:

  • Alas! Wretched race of mortals, miserable race!
  • From such kinds of strife and from such groans you are born! (B 124 = D 17)

The persona loquens laments, “I wept and wailed when I saw an unaccustomed place” (B118 = D 14), and finds himself, “Far from what honor and from what abundance of bliss”… (B 119 = D 15). Transmigration as part of the ritual of purification mandates partaking in a world of suffering in which all life is fated to be born, become corrupt, and die. This reasserts the doctrine in On Nature that all things are mortal except for the four roots and Love and Strife, which combine and break down matter. Empedocles narrates his own dissolutions and recombination,

  • For as for me, once I was already both a youth and a girl
  • a bush and a bird, and a sea-leaping, voyaging fish. (B 117 = D 13)

The wandering of the daemon forms a “ladder” of transmigration, in a cycle ascending from animal to plant to human. This hierarchy of incarnation is further subdivided, with laurel at the highest plant rung; lions at the highest animal one; and seers, poets, doctors, and leaders of men for humans (B 127, 146 = D 36, 39). Theoretically, the cycle applies to all living creatures. This consideration necessitates the injunction against bloodshed and meat-eating:

  • Will you not desist from evil-sounding murder? Do you not see
  • That you are devouring each other in the carelessness of your mind? (B 136 = D 28)

Humans unaware of the cycle of transmigration commit murder by eating flesh. The verb in Greek for “devouring” (δάπτοντες) is used of wild animals, highlighting the dehumanizing effect of being carnivorous. The legal language of the gods’ oath returns in the human sphere, where all humans are bound by the injunction against killing (B 135 = D 27a). The hexameter verse form is used to spectacular effect in Empedocles’ equation of ritual animal sacrifice to human sacrifice familiar from Agamemnon’s slaughter of Iphigenia:

  • The father, lifting up his own son who has changed shape,
  • Cuts his throat, with a prayer—fool that he is! The others are at a loss
  • While they sacrifice the suppliant; but he [scil. the father], deaf to the shouts,
  • Has cut the throat and prepared an evil meal in his house.
  • In the same way, a son seizes his father and children their mother,
  • And ripping out their life they devour the flesh of their dear ones. (B 137 = D 29)

The gnomic wisdom that “not to be born is best” is modified by Empedocles in light of his prior transgressions:

  • Alas, that the pitiless day did not destroy me earlier,
  • Before I contrived terrible deeds of feeding around my lips. (B 139 = D 34)

This fragment finds an almost exact parallel in On Nature, again pointing to the fundamental unity of what have been perceived as physical and ritual doctrines. Vegetarianism becomes an antidote to the cannibalism inherent in meat-eating, and the extant fragments show similar injunctions against bay leaves (B 140 = D 32) and beans (B 141 = D 31).

At an earlier stage in the cycle with Love more powerful, humans enjoyed a kind of Golden Age of prosperity and peace. Under her influence, humans and animals are harmonious: beasts and birds become tame and gentle (B 130 = D 26). For these humans, the worship of Love rejects blood sacrifice for honey, myrrh, perfume, and votives (B 128 = D 25). Early human history thus models the ethical norms that must be recovered in Empedocles’ modernity in order to become pure and advance in the cycle of incarnations. The focus upon ethics in the Purifications is a radical shift from prior Presocratic discourse (Barnes 1979). Abstaining from meat, bay, beans, and heterosexual congress may place the cycle in the realm of human manipulation, and the Purifications thus has a didactic message with the potential to accelerate the daemon’s path from human to divine being. More speculatively, it has been suggested that the motion of the cycle itself can be changed on the basis of human action (Osborne 2005), though this has not gone unchallenged (Picot & Berg 2015).

3.2 Gods and daemons

The prominence of the divine is made clear in the fragments of the Purifications. In an introduction or an introductory section, Empedocles asks the Muse, Calliope, to aid his inspired discourse about the “blessed gods” (B 131 = D 7). Who are these figures? According to Hippolytus, Empedocles’ gods include the four elements—Zeus, Hera, Aidoneus, and Nestis—and the two powers, Love and Strife (Refutation of All Heresies 7.29). Each plays a crucial role in the cycle of transmigration outlined in the poem: Strife governs the exile of the daemon; the elements hate and successively reject it; and the worship of Love creates the conditions for the daemon’s restoration. This restoration to godhood further expands the pantheon to include gods who enjoy a shared hearth and banqueting, the absence of human misery, and freedom from destruction (B 147 = D 40). They are subject to the divine “oracle of Necessity” mandating against bloodshed and they fall into the cycle of transmigration after foreswearing it, becoming daemons like Empedocles.

Daemons constitute a sub-category of gods “who have received as lot a long life” (B 115 = D 10), and by qualifying their immortality Empedocles adapts their traditional association with fate and a protecting spirit for humans as is evident in, for example, Hesiod (Erg. 122, 314). The cycle constantly renews the body of the daemon; in one fragment, a female subject is described as “enveloping in an unfamiliar cloak of flesh” (B 126 = D 19) a figure regularly interpreted as the daemon. At the same time, the fragments take for granted some set of stable qualities that are incrementally purified. In the absence of any Empedoclean discussion of the soul or an incorporeal carrier, scholars continue to debate the material makeup of the daemon, with arguments for it as embodied Love (Kahn 1960); incorporeal imprints of the Sphere (Therme 2010); or compounds of the roots (Trépanier 2014). Presumably, unlike the roots and Love and Strife, these “long-lived” gods will be subject to dissolution under the total reigns of Love or Strife (B 21 = D 77a).

Daemons occupy transient forms, incarnating into plant life, animals, and humans. Empedocles relates that they wander in these for thirty thousand seasons. Their exile on earth is well-expressed by Empedocles in his affirmation that while the daemon transmigrates, it neither reaches the abode of Zeus nor the palace of Hades (B 142 = D 12). It is a period of suffering and loss, underscoring the importance of the escape that is the daemon’s return to godhood. Incarnation appears to form a “ladder”. The highest order of plants is the laurel, and of animals, the lion. Empedocles states of humans:

  • At the end they become seers, hymn singers, doctors,
  • And leaders for humans on the earth,
  • And then they blossom up as gods, the greatest in honors. (B 146 = D 39)

Since antiquity, these figures have been interpreted as ethically ideal types, as closely allied with Love. If this is correct, then the daemons have become purified of Strife at this end point in the cycle. An alternative suggestion is that an alliance with Love and purification is unnecessary and that “time served” is sufficient to graduate a daemon to godhood (Picot-Berg 2015).

Perhaps the most important question mark surrounds the issue of the position of the daemon in the wider cosmic alternation of Love and Strife. The fragments give no unequivocal direction on integrating transmigration into the ultimate dissolution of the elements under Strife or their complete mixture under Love. Nor do scholars yet agree on a methodology for approaching this issue (Marciano 2001). Much earlier scholarship rejected the compatibility of the cosmic and daemonic cycles (Diels 1898). A related solution has been to suggest that the cycle of the daemon is a mythological mirror of the physical cycles of Love and Strife (Primavesi 2008). More often, interpreters attempted to unite the cycles of transmigration within the broader movements toward the one and the many. This suggests that there is no eternal paradise for the daemon after attaining godhood again.

4. Relation of On Nature to Purifications

The relation between On Nature and Purifications is the subject of varied speculations. Once it was thought that the first was a scientific work and the latter a religious one. Since these categories were understood to be antithetical, there could be no relation at all between them; Empedocles had just written two incompatible poems. More recently, as the usefulness of such a rigid dichotomy seemed less plausible, commentators have seen the teaching about nature as continuous with Purifications. Both, after all, give a prominent place to Love and Strife. Nature, then, is ruled by the very same principles that are the key to understanding the drama of the ethical life, as Empedocles represents that. Understanding how nature works, one will want to side with Love and not Strife—especially, one will want to avoid the shedding of blood, that whereby we think and perceive, the very principle of conscious life. This sort of approach sees a complementarity between the natural philosophy and the religious narrative. However, in light of the Strasbourg manuscript, some have argued for a tighter unity. Martin and Primavesi, for instance, focus on a part of ensemble a which describes the moment when Strife dominates in the vortex and Love comes to be in its center. This description mirrors the same event described in B 35 (= D 75), except that, besides roots being united by Love, there are also persons of some sort being united in Love. According to the authors, these persons are the incarnated daimones of Purifications; in turn, these daimones, whose punishment through incarnation is coming to an end, are also particles of Love. The dissolution of composite beings under Strife, then, liberates these particles of Love from their cycle of incarnation and they unite in Love at its advent in the center of the whirl (Martin & Primavesi 1999: 83–86, 90–95). Such interpretations might imply that there are not two poems but one. Nevertheless, the way textual support has been marshaled for these sorts of readings has not gone uncriticized (see Laks 2002, Bollack 2005). A third interpretation has recently been proposed, which views the differences in emphasis between the works as not necessarily establishing two separate texts, but two ‘levels’ of teaching: esoteric and exoteric (Curd 2005). On this reading, Empedocles is in fact addressing two audiences, one general, represented by the people of Acragas and the second-person plural, and one specialized group of intimates, represented by the appeals to Pausanias and the use of the second-person singular. The general audience is instructed in public lectures on the necessity of purifying themselves and the means to do so. By contrast, the inner circle receives a detailed explanation of the cosmos’ inner workings, a more rigorous account of Empedocles’ daemonology, and unique powers.

5. Influence

As a testament to the success of Empedocles’ philosophy in its afterlife, the philosopher boasts the largest number of preserved Presocratic fragments. His popularity soon after his death is assured by a reference to him in the Hippocratic Ancient Medicine, in which the author protests that:

Some doctors and experts (sophistae) say that it is impossible for anyone to know medicine who does not know what a human being is […]. But what they are talking about belongs to philosophy (philosophiē), like Empedocles and other people who have written about nature—what a human being is from the beginning, how he came about at first and what things he is constituted of. (A 71 = R 6)

Part of this success must be attributed to Empedocles’ reputation as a poet rivaling Homer for his inspired use of expression and metaphor (A 1 = R 1b).

Yet Empedocles’ philosophical theories too excited great interest in his successors. Plato regularly refers to him by name, and in the Symposium he puts in the mouth of the comic poet Aristophanes a re-worked version of the origin of the human that lampoons Empedoclean Love and Strife and Empedocles’ interpretation of the evolutionary development of the human species: a former spherical unity is split into two and then only comes together through the influence of erotic Love (O’Brien 2002). Aristotle was similarly influenced by him; he mentions no philosopher with greater frequency except Plato. His critiques range from Empedocles’ treatment of the generation of elements (R 8a), to the problems of Love and Strife as motive principles (A 42 = R 12 and 13), to the motionlessness of the earth (R 14), to the growth of plants and animals (A 70 = R 17), to the generation of animal organisms (R 19). His successor, Theophrastus, devotes a long, agonistic section of his On Sensations to attacking Empedocles’ interpretations of sight, sound, smell, and thought (A 86 = R 25). Timon of Phlius’ Silloi ridiculed his use of elements (A 1 = R 37). Empedocles remained a touchstone among the Stoics and Epicureans as well: a pupil of Epicurus’, Hermarchus, wrote an Against Empedocles in twenty-two books (Obbink 1988), while in his De Rerum Natura, Lucretius offers fulsome—though not unqualified—praise of the Agrigentine, who “scarcely seems to have been born of human stock” (A 21.21 = R 31.733; complete translation of the entire work is in Rouse 1924). Chrysippus is said to have interpreted passages of his poetry (R 40a–b) and the Stoics were associated with the element of fire that Empedocles may have given some prominence to (A 31 = R 41). Sallust composed an entire Empedoclea, which Cicero commended to his brother (A 27 = R 36). Thanks to this robust early tradition, rich exegesis on Empedocles continued in commentaries written on these authors and by the early Christians until well into late antiquity. Empedocles’ immortal hold on his readers continues. Friedrich Hölderlin’s unfinished drafts of Der Tod des Empedokles continue to inspire modern analysis (Foti 2006), and Nietzsche’s “stillbirth” tragedy on Empedocles has been well-treated recently (Most 2005), as has Matthew Arnold’s “Empedocles on Etna” (Kenny 2005).


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Other Internet Resources


This is a completely rewritten and updated version of the entry on the Empedocles. See the link to the previous version in the Other Internet Resources, which was written by one of the co-authors of the present version.

Copyright © 2020 by
K. Scarlett Kingsley <kkingsley@agnesscott.edu>
Richard Parry

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