Ethics of Artificial Intelligence and Robotics

First published Thu Apr 30, 2020

Artificial intelligence (AI) and robotics are digital technologies that will have significant impact on the development of humanity in the near future. They have raised fundamental questions about what we should do with these systems, what the systems themselves should do, what risks they involve, and how we can control these.

After the Introduction to the field (§1), the main themes (§2) of this article are: Ethical issues that arise with AI systems as objects, i.e., tools made and used by humans. This includes issues of privacy (§2.1) and manipulation (§2.2), opacity (§2.3) and bias (§2.4), human-robot interaction (§2.5), employment (§2.6), and the effects of autonomy (§2.7). Then AI systems as subjects, i.e., ethics for the AI systems themselves in machine ethics (§2.8) and artificial moral agency (§2.9). Finally, the problem of a possible future AI superintelligence leading to a “singularity” (§2.10). We close with a remark on the vision of AI (§3).

For each section within these themes, we provide a general explanation of the ethical issues, outline existing positions and arguments, then analyse how these play out with current technologies and finally, what policy consequences may be drawn.

1. Introduction

1.1 Background of the Field

The ethics of AI and robotics is often focused on “concerns” of various sorts, which is a typical response to new technologies. Many such concerns turn out to be rather quaint (trains are too fast for souls); some are predictably wrong when they suggest that the technology will fundamentally change humans (telephones will destroy personal communication, writing will destroy memory, video cassettes will make going out redundant); some are broadly correct but moderately relevant (digital technology will destroy industries that make photographic film, cassette tapes, or vinyl records); but some are broadly correct and deeply relevant (cars will kill children and fundamentally change the landscape). The task of an article such as this is to analyse the issues and to deflate the non-issues.

Some technologies, like nuclear power, cars, or plastics, have caused ethical and political discussion and significant policy efforts to control the trajectory these technologies, usually only once some damage is done. In addition to such “ethical concerns”, new technologies challenge current norms and conceptual systems, which is of particular interest to philosophy. Finally, once we have understood a technology in its context, we need to shape our societal response, including regulation and law. All these features also exist in the case of new AI and Robotics technologies—plus the more fundamental fear that they may end the era of human control on Earth.

The ethics of AI and robotics has seen significant press coverage in recent years, which supports related research, but also may end up undermining it: the press often talks as if the issues under discussion were just predictions of what future technology will bring, and as though we already know what would be most ethical and how to achieve that. Press coverage thus focuses on risk, security (Brundage et al. 2018, in the Other Internet Resources section below, hereafter [OIR]), and prediction of impact (e.g., on the job market). The result is a discussion of essentially technical problems that focus on how to achieve a desired outcome. Current discussions in policy and industry are also motivated by image and public relations, where the label “ethical” is really not much more than the new “green”, perhaps used for “ethics washing”. For a problem to qualify as a problem for AI ethics would require that we do not readily know what the right thing to do is. In this sense, job loss, theft, or killing with AI is not a problem in ethics, but whether these are permissible under certain circumstances is a problem. This article focuses on the genuine problems of ethics where we do not readily know what the answers are.

A last caveat: The ethics of AI and robotics is a very young field within applied ethics, with significant dynamics, but few well-established issues and no authoritative overviews—though there is a promising outline (European Group on Ethics in Science and New Technologies 2018) and there are beginnings on societal impact (Floridi et al. 2018; Taddeo and Floridi 2018; S. Taylor et al. 2018; Walsh 2018; Bryson 2019; Gibert 2019; Whittlestone et al. 2019), and policy recommendations (AI HLEG 2019 [OIR]; IEEE 2019). So this article cannot merely reproduce what the community has achieved thus far, but must propose an ordering where little order exists.

1.2 AI & Robotics

The notion of “artificial intelligence” (AI) is understood broadly as any kind of artificial computational system that shows intelligent behaviour, i.e., complex behaviour that is conducive to reaching goals. In particular, we do not wish to restrict “intelligence” to what would require intelligence if done by humans, as Minsky had suggested (1985). This means we incorporate a range of machines, including those in “technical AI”, that show only limited abilities in learning or reasoning but excel at the automation of particular tasks, as well as machines in “general AI” that aim to create a generally intelligent agent.

AI somehow gets closer to our skin than other technologies—thus the field of “philosophy of AI”. Perhaps this is because the project of AI is to create machines that have a feature central to how we humans see ourselves, namely as feeling, thinking, intelligent beings. The main purposes of an artificially intelligent agent probably involve sensing, modelling, planning and action, but current AI applications also include perception, text analysis, natural language processing (NLP), logical reasoning, game-playing, decision support systems, data analytics, predictive analytics, as well as autonomous vehicles and other forms of robotics (P. Stone et al. 2016). AI may involve any number of computational techniques to achieve these aims, be that classical symbol-manipulating AI, inspired by natural cognition, or machine learning via neural networks (Goodfellow, Bengio, and Courville 2016; Silver et al. 2018).

Historically, it is worth noting that the term “AI” was used as above ca. 1950–1975, then came into disrepute during the “AI winter”, ca. 1975–1995, and narrowed. As a result, areas such as “machine learning”, “natural language processing” and “data science” were often not labelled as “AI”. Since ca. 2010, the use has broadened again, and at times almost all of computer science and even high-tech is lumped under “AI”. Now it is a name to be proud of, a booming industry with massive capital investment (Shoham et al. 2018), and on the edge of hype again. As Erik Brynjolfsson noted, it may allow us to

virtually eliminate global poverty, massively reduce disease and provide better education to almost everyone on the planet. (quoted in Anderson, Rainie, and Luchsinger 2018)

While AI can be entirely software, robots are physical machines that move. Robots are subject to physical impact, typically through “sensors”, and they exert physical force onto the world, typically through “actuators”, like a gripper or a turning wheel. Accordingly, autonomous cars or planes are robots, and only a minuscule portion of robots is “humanoid” (human-shaped), like in the movies. Some robots use AI, and some do not: Typical industrial robots blindly follow completely defined scripts with minimal sensory input and no learning or reasoning (around 500,000 such new industrial robots are installed each year (IFR 2019 [OIR])). It is probably fair to say that while robotics systems cause more concerns in the general public, AI systems are more likely to have a greater impact on humanity. Also, AI or robotics systems for a narrow set of tasks are less likely to cause new issues than systems that are more flexible and autonomous.

Robotics and AI can thus be seen as covering two overlapping sets of systems: systems that are only AI, systems that are only robotics, and systems that are both. We are interested in all three; the scope of this article is thus not only the intersection, but the union, of both sets.

1.3 A Note on Policy

Policy is only one of the concerns of this article. There is significant public discussion about AI ethics, and there are frequent pronouncements from politicians that the matter requires new policy, which is easier said than done: Actual technology policy is difficult to plan and enforce. It can take many forms, from incentives and funding, infrastructure, taxation, or good-will statements, to regulation by various actors, and the law. Policy for AI will possibly come into conflict with other aims of technology policy or general policy. Governments, parliaments, associations, and industry circles in industrialised countries have produced reports and white papers in recent years, and some have generated good-will slogans (“trusted/responsible/humane/human-centred/good/beneficial AI”), but is that what is needed? For a survey, see Jobin, Ienca, and Vayena (2019) and V. Müller’s list of PT-AI Policy Documents and Institutions.

For people who work in ethics and policy, there might be a tendency to overestimate the impact and threats from a new technology, and to underestimate how far current regulation can reach (e.g., for product liability). On the other hand, there is a tendency for businesses, the military, and some public administrations to “just talk” and do some “ethics washing” in order to preserve a good public image and continue as before. Actually implementing legally binding regulation would challenge existing business models and practices. Actual policy is not just an implementation of ethical theory, but subject to societal power structures—and the agents that do have the power will push against anything that restricts them. There is thus a significant risk that regulation will remain toothless in the face of economical and political power.

Though very little actual policy has been produced, there are some notable beginnings: The latest EU policy document suggests “trustworthy AI” should be lawful, ethical, and technically robust, and then spells this out as seven requirements: human oversight, technical robustness, privacy and data governance, transparency, fairness, well-being, and accountability (AI HLEG 2019 [OIR]). Much European research now runs under the slogan of “responsible research and innovation” (RRI), and “technology assessment” has been a standard field since the advent of nuclear power. Professional ethics is also a standard field in information technology, and this includes issues that are relevant in this article. Perhaps a “code of ethics” for AI engineers, analogous to the codes of ethics for medical doctors, is an option here (Véliz 2019). What data science itself should do is addressed in (L. Taylor and Purtova 2019). We also expect that much policy will eventually cover specific uses or technologies of AI and robotics, rather than the field as a whole. A useful summary of an ethical framework for AI is given in (European Group on Ethics in Science and New Technologies 2018: 13ff). On general AI policy, see Calo (2018) as well as Crawford and Calo (2016); Stahl, Timmermans, and Mittelstadt (2016); Johnson and Verdicchio (2017); and Giubilini and Savulescu (2018). A more political angle of technology is often discussed in the field of “Science and Technology Studies” (STS). As books like The Ethics of Invention (Jasanoff 2016) show, concerns in STS are often quite similar to those in ethics (Jacobs et al. 2019 [OIR]). In this article, we discuss the policy for each type of issue separately rather than for AI or robotics in general.

2. Main Debates

In this section we outline the ethical issues of human use of AI and robotics systems that can be more or less autonomous—which means we look at issues that arise with certain uses of the technologies which would not arise with others. It must be kept in mind, however, that technologies will always cause some uses to be easier, and thus more frequent, and hinder other uses. The design of technical artefacts thus has ethical relevance for their use (Houkes and Vermaas 2010; Verbeek 2011), so beyond “responsible use”, we also need “responsible design” in this field. The focus on use does not presuppose which ethical approaches are best suited for tackling these issues; they might well be virtue ethics (Vallor 2017) rather than consequentialist or value-based (Floridi et al. 2018). This section is also neutral with respect to the question whether AI systems truly have “intelligence” or other mental properties: It would apply equally well if AI and robotics are merely seen as the current face of automation (cf. Müller forthcoming-b).

2.1 Privacy & Surveillance

There is a general discussion about privacy and surveillance in information technology (e.g., Macnish 2017; Roessler 2017), which mainly concerns the access to private data and data that is personally identifiable. Privacy has several well recognised aspects, e.g., “the right to be let alone”, information privacy, privacy as an aspect of personhood, control over information about oneself, and the right to secrecy (Bennett and Raab 2006). Privacy studies have historically focused on state surveillance by secret services but now include surveillance by other state agents, businesses, and even individuals. The technology has changed significantly in the last decades while regulation has been slow to respond (though there is the Regulation (EU) 2016/679)—the result is a certain anarchy that is exploited by the most powerful players, sometimes in plain sight, sometimes in hiding.

The digital sphere has widened greatly: All data collection and storage is now digital, our lives are increasingly digital, most digital data is connected to a single Internet, and there is more and more sensor technology in use that generates data about non-digital aspects of our lives. AI increases both the possibilities of intelligent data collection and the possibilities for data analysis. This applies to blanket surveillance of whole populations as well as to classic targeted surveillance. In addition, much of the data is traded between agents, usually for a fee.

At the same time, controlling who collects which data, and who has access, is much harder in the digital world than it was in the analogue world of paper and telephone calls. Many new AI technologies amplify the known issues. For example, face recognition in photos and videos allows identification and thus profiling and searching for individuals (Whittaker et al. 2018: 15ff). This continues using other techniques for identification, e.g., “device fingerprinting”, which are commonplace on the Internet (sometimes revealed in the “privacy policy”). The result is that “In this vast ocean of data, there is a frighteningly complete picture of us” (Smolan 2016: 1:01). The result is arguably a scandal that still has not received due public attention.

The data trail we leave behind is how our “free” services are paid for—but we are not told about that data collection and the value of this new raw material, and we are manipulated into leaving ever more such data. For the “big 5” companies (Amazon, Google/Alphabet, Microsoft, Apple, Facebook), the main data-collection part of their business appears to be based on deception, exploiting human weaknesses, furthering procrastination, generating addiction, and manipulation (Harris 2016 [OIR]). The primary focus of social media, gaming, and most of the Internet in this “surveillance economy” is to gain, maintain, and direct attention—and thus data supply. “Surveillance is the business model of the Internet” (Schneier 2015). This surveillance and attention economy is sometimes called “surveillance capitalism” (Zuboff 2019). It has caused many attempts to escape from the grasp of these corporations, e.g., in exercises of “minimalism” (Newport 2019), sometimes through the open source movement, but it appears that present-day citizens have lost the degree of autonomy needed to escape while fully continuing with their life and work. We have lost ownership of our data, if “ownership” is the right relation here. Arguably, we have lost control of our data.

These systems will often reveal facts about us that we ourselves wish to suppress or are not aware of: they know more about us than we know ourselves. Even just observing online behaviour allows insights into our mental states (Burr and Christianini 2019) and manipulation (see below section 2.2). This has led to calls for the protection of “derived data” (Wachter and Mittelstadt 2019). With the last sentence of his bestselling book, Homo Deus, Harari asks about the long-term consequences of AI:

What will happen to society, politics and daily life when non-conscious but highly intelligent algorithms know us better than we know ourselves? (2016: 462)

Robotic devices have not yet played a major role in this area, except for security patrolling, but this will change once they are more common outside of industry environments. Together with the “Internet of things”, the so-called “smart” systems (phone, TV, oven, lamp, virtual assistant, home,…), “smart city” (Sennett 2018), and “smart governance”, they are set to become part of the data-gathering machinery that offers more detailed data, of different types, in real time, with ever more information.

Privacy-preserving techniques that can largely conceal the identity of persons or groups are now a standard staple in data science; they include (relative) anonymisation , access control (plus encryption), and other models where computation is carried out with fully or partially encrypted input data (Stahl and Wright 2018); in the case of “differential privacy”, this is done by adding calibrated noise to encrypt the output of queries (Dwork et al. 2006; Abowd 2017). While requiring more effort and cost, such techniques can avoid many of the privacy issues. Some companies have also seen better privacy as a competitive advantage that can be leveraged and sold at a price.

One of the major practical difficulties is to actually enforce regulation, both on the level of the state and on the level of the individual who has a claim. They must identify the responsible legal entity, prove the action, perhaps prove intent, find a court that declares itself competent … and eventually get the court to actually enforce its decision. Well-established legal protection of rights such as consumer rights, product liability, and other civil liability or protection of intellectual property rights is often missing in digital products, or hard to enforce. This means that companies with a “digital” background are used to testing their products on the consumers without fear of liability while heavily defending their intellectual property rights. This “Internet Libertarianism” is sometimes taken to assume that technical solutions will take care of societal problems by themselves (Mozorov 2013).

2.2 Manipulation of Behaviour

The ethical issues of AI in surveillance go beyond the mere accumulation of data and direction of attention: They include the use of information to manipulate behaviour, online and offline, in a way that undermines autonomous rational choice. Of course, efforts to manipulate behaviour are ancient, but they may gain a new quality when they use AI systems. Given users’ intense interaction with data systems and the deep knowledge about individuals this provides, they are vulnerable to “nudges”, manipulation, and deception. With sufficient prior data, algorithms can be used to target individuals or small groups with just the kind of input that is likely to influence these particular individuals. A ’nudge‘ changes the environment such that it influences behaviour in a predictable way that is positive for the individual, but easy and cheap to avoid (Thaler & Sunstein 2008). There is a slippery slope from here to paternalism and manipulation.

Many advertisers, marketers, and online sellers will use any legal means at their disposal to maximise profit, including exploitation of behavioural biases, deception, and addiction generation (Costa and Halpern 2019 [OIR]). Such manipulation is the business model in much of the gambling and gaming industries, but it is spreading, e.g., to low-cost airlines. In interface design on web pages or in games, this manipulation uses what is called “dark patterns” (Mathur et al. 2019). At this moment, gambling and the sale of addictive substances are highly regulated, but online manipulation and addiction are not—even though manipulation of online behaviour is becoming a core business model of the Internet.

Furthermore, social media is now the prime location for political propaganda. This influence can be used to steer voting behaviour, as in the Facebook-Cambridge Analytica “scandal” (Woolley and Howard 2017; Bradshaw, Neudert, and Howard 2019) and—if successful—it may harm the autonomy of individuals (Susser, Roessler, and Nissenbaum 2019).

Improved AI “faking” technologies make what once was reliable evidence into unreliable evidence—this has already happened to digital photos, sound recordings, and video. It will soon be quite easy to create (rather than alter) “deep fake” text, photos, and video material with any desired content. Soon, sophisticated real-time interaction with persons over text, phone, or video will be faked, too. So we cannot trust digital interactions while we are at the same time increasingly dependent on such interactions.

One more specific issue is that machine learning techniques in AI rely on training with vast amounts of data. This means there will often be a trade-off between privacy and rights to data vs. technical quality of the product. This influences the consequentialist evaluation of privacy-violating practices.

The policy in this field has its ups and downs: Civil liberties and the protection of individual rights are under intense pressure from businesses’ lobbying, secret services, and other state agencies that depend on surveillance. Privacy protection has diminished massively compared to the pre-digital age when communication was based on letters, analogue telephone communications, and personal conversation and when surveillance operated under significant legal constraints.

While the EU General Data Protection Regulation (Regulation (EU) 2016/679) has strengthened privacy protection, the US and China prefer growth with less regulation (Thompson and Bremmer 2018), likely in the hope that this provides a competitive advantage. It is clear that state and business actors have increased their ability to invade privacy and manipulate people with the help of AI technology and will continue to do so to further their particular interests—unless reined in by policy in the interest of general society.

2.3 Opacity of AI Systems

Opacity and bias are central issues in what is now sometimes called “data ethics” or “big data ethics” (Floridi and Taddeo 2016; Mittelstadt and Floridi 2016). AI systems for automated decision support and “predictive analytics” raise “significant concerns about lack of due process, accountability, community engagement, and auditing” (Whittaker et al. 2018: 18ff). They are part of a power structure in which “we are creating decision-making processes that constrain and limit opportunities for human participation” (Danaher 2016b: 245). At the same time, it will often be impossible for the affected person to know how the system came to this output, i.e., the system is “opaque” to that person. If the system involves machine learning, it will typically be opaque even to the expert, who will not know how a particular pattern was identified, or even what the pattern is. Bias in decision systems and data sets is exacerbated by this opacity. So, at least in cases where there is a desire to remove bias, the analysis of opacity and bias go hand in hand, and political response has to tackle both issues together.

Many AI systems rely on machine learning techniques in (simulated) neural networks that will extract patterns from a given dataset, with or without “correct” solutions provided; i.e., supervised, semi-supervised or unsupervised. With these techniques, the “learning” captures patterns in the data and these are labelled in a way that appears useful to the decision the system makes, while the programmer does not really know which patterns in the data the system has used. In fact, the programs are evolving, so when new data comes in, or new feedback is given (“this was correct”, “this was incorrect”), the patterns used by the learning system change. What this means is that the outcome is not transparent to the user or programmers: it is opaque. Furthermore, the quality of the program depends heavily on the quality of the data provided, following the old slogan “garbage in, garbage out”. So, if the data already involved a bias (e.g., police data about the skin colour of suspects), then the program will reproduce that bias. There are proposals for a standard description of datasets in a “datasheet” that would make the identification of such bias more feasible (Gebru et al. 2018 [OIR]). There is also significant recent literature about the limitations of machine learning systems that are essentially sophisticated data filters (Marcus 2018 [OIR]). Some have argued that the ethical problems of today are the result of technical “shortcuts” AI has taken (Cristianini forthcoming).

There are several technical activities that aim at “explainable AI”, starting with (Van Lent, Fisher, and Mancuso 1999; Lomas et al. 2012) and, more recently, a DARPA programme (Gunning 2017 [OIR]). More broadly, the demand for

a mechanism for elucidating and articulating the power structures, biases, and influences that computational artefacts exercise in society (Diakopoulos 2015: 398)

is sometimes called “algorithmic accountability reporting”. This does not mean that we expect an AI to “explain its reasoning”—doing so would require far more serious moral autonomy than we currently attribute to AI systems (see below §2.10).

The politician Henry Kissinger pointed out that there is a fundamental problem for democratic decision-making if we rely on a system that is supposedly superior to humans, but cannot explain its decisions. He says we may have “generated a potentially dominating technology in search of a guiding philosophy” (Kissinger 2018). Danaher (2016b) calls this problem “the threat of algocracy” (adopting the previous use of ‘algocracy’ from Aneesh 2002 [OIR], 2006). In a similar vein, Cave (2019) stresses that we need a broader societal move towards more “democratic” decision-making to avoid AI being a force that leads to a Kafka-style impenetrable suppression system in public administration and elsewhere. The political angle of this discussion has been stressed by O’Neil in her influential book Weapons of Math Destruction (2016), and by Yeung and Lodge (2019).

In the EU, some of these issues have been taken into account with the (Regulation (EU) 2016/679), which foresees that consumers, when faced with a decision based on data processing, will have a legal “right to explanation”—how far this goes and to what extent it can be enforced is disputed (Goodman and Flaxman 2017; Wachter, Mittelstadt, and Floridi 2016; Wachter, Mittelstadt, and Russell 2017). Zerilli et al. (2019) argue that there may be a double standard here, where we demand a high level of explanation for machine-based decisions despite humans sometimes not reaching that standard themselves.

2.4 Bias in Decision Systems

Automated AI decision support systems and “predictive analytics” operate on data and produce a decision as “output”. This output may range from the relatively trivial to the highly significant: “this restaurant matches your preferences”, “the patient in this X-ray has completed bone growth”, “application to credit card declined”, “donor organ will be given to another patient”, “bail is denied”, or “target identified and engaged”. Data analysis is often used in “predictive analytics” in business, healthcare, and other fields, to foresee future developments—since prediction is easier, it will also become a cheaper commodity. One use of prediction is in “predictive policing” (NIJ 2014 [OIR]), which many fear might lead to an erosion of public liberties (Ferguson 2017) because it can take away power from the people whose behaviour is predicted. It appears, however, that many of the worries about policing depend on futuristic scenarios where law enforcement foresees and punishes planned actions, rather than waiting until a crime has been committed (like in the 2002 film “Minority Report”). One concern is that these systems might perpetuate bias that was already in the data used to set up the system, e.g., by increasing police patrols in an area and discovering more crime in that area. Actual “predictive policing” or “intelligence led policing” techniques mainly concern the question of where and when police forces will be needed most. Also, police officers can be provided with more data, offering them more control and facilitating better decisions, in workflow support software (e.g., “ArcGIS”). Whether this is problematic depends on the appropriate level of trust in the technical quality of these systems, and on the evaluation of aims of the police work itself. Perhaps a recent paper title points in the right direction here: “AI ethics in predictive policing: From models of threat to an ethics of care” (Asaro 2019).

Bias typically surfaces when unfair judgments are made because the individual making the judgment is influenced by a characteristic that is actually irrelevant to the matter at hand, typically a discriminatory preconception about members of a group. So, one form of bias is a learned cognitive feature of a person, often not made explicit. The person concerned may not be aware of having that bias—they may even be honestly and explicitly opposed to a bias they are found to have (e.g., through priming, cf. Graham and Lowery 2004). On fairness vs. bias in machine learning, see Binns (2018).

Apart from the social phenomenon of learned bias, the human cognitive system is generally prone to have various kinds of “cognitive biases”, e.g., the “confirmation bias”: humans tend to interpret information as confirming what they already believe. This second form of bias is often said to impede performance in rational judgment (Kahnemann 2011)—though at least some cognitive biases generate an evolutionary advantage, e.g., economical use of resources for intuitive judgment. There is a question whether AI systems could or should have such cognitive bias.

A third form of bias is present in data when it exhibits systematic error, e.g., “statistical bias”. Strictly, any given dataset will only be unbiased for a single kind of issue, so the mere creation of a dataset involves the danger that it may be used for a different kind of issue, and then turn out to be biased for that kind. Machine learning on the basis of such data would then not only fail to recognise the bias, but codify and automate the “historical bias”. Such historical bias was discovered in an automated recruitment screening system at Amazon (discontinued early 2017) that discriminated against women—presumably because the company had a history of discriminating against women in the hiring process. The “Correctional Offender Management Profiling for Alternative Sanctions” (COMPAS), a system to predict whether a defendant would re-offend, was found to be as successful (65.2% accuracy) as a group of random humans (Dressel and Farid 2018) and to produce more false positives and less false negatives for black defendants. The problem with such systems is thus bias plus humans placing excessive trust in the systems. The political dimensions of such automated systems in the USA are investigated in Eubanks (2018).

There are significant technical efforts to detect and remove bias from AI systems, but it is fair to say that these are in early stages: see UK Institute for Ethical AI & Machine Learning (Brownsword, Scotford, and Yeung 2017; Yeung and Lodge 2019). It appears that technological fixes have their limits in that they need a mathematical notion of fairness, which is hard to come by (Whittaker et al. 2018: 24ff; Selbst et al. 2019), as is a formal notion of “race” (see Benthall and Haynes 2019). An institutional proposal is in (Veale and Binns 2017).

2.5 Human-Robot Interaction

Human-robot interaction (HRI) is an academic fields in its own right, which now pays significant attention to ethical matters, the dynamics of perception from both sides, and both the different interests present in and the intricacy of the social context, including co-working (e.g., Arnold and Scheutz 2017). Useful surveys for the ethics of robotics include Calo, Froomkin, and Kerr (2016); Royakkers and van Est (2016); Tzafestas (2016); a standard collection of papers is Lin, Abney, and Jenkins (2017).

While AI can be used to manipulate humans into believing and doing things (see section 2.2), it can also be used to drive robots that are problematic if their processes or appearance involve deception, threaten human dignity, or violate the Kantian requirement of “respect for humanity”. Humans very easily attribute mental properties to objects, and empathise with them, especially when the outer appearance of these objects is similar to that of living beings. This can be used to deceive humans (or animals) into attributing more intellectual or even emotional significance to robots or AI systems than they deserve. Some parts of humanoid robotics are problematic in this regard (e.g., Hiroshi Ishiguro’s remote-controlled Geminoids), and there are cases that have been clearly deceptive for public-relations purposes (e.g. on the abilities of Hanson Robotics’ “Sophia”). Of course, some fairly basic constraints of business ethics and law apply to robots, too: product safety and liability, or non-deception in advertisement. It appears that these existing constraints take care of many concerns that are raised. There are cases, however, where human-human interaction has aspects that appear specifically human in ways that can perhaps not be replaced by robots: care, love, and sex.

2.5.1 Example (a) Care Robots

The use of robots in health care for humans is currently at the level of concept studies in real environments, but it may become a usable technology in a few years, and has raised a number of concerns for a dystopian future of de-humanised care (A. Sharkey and N. Sharkey 2011; Robert Sparrow 2016). Current systems include robots that support human carers/caregivers (e.g., in lifting patients, or transporting material), robots that enable patients to do certain things by themselves (e.g., eat with a robotic arm), but also robots that are given to patients as company and comfort (e.g., the “Paro” robot seal). For an overview, see van Wynsberghe (2016); Nørskov (2017); Fosch-Villaronga and Albo-Canals (2019), for a survey of users Draper et al. (2014).

One reason why the issue of care has come to the fore is that people have argued that we will need robots in ageing societies. This argument makes problematic assumptions, namely that with longer lifespan people will need more care, and that it will not be possible to attract more humans to caring professions. It may also show a bias about age (Jecker forthcoming). Most importantly, it ignores the nature of automation, which is not simply about replacing humans, but about allowing humans to work more efficiently. It is not very clear that there really is an issue here since the discussion mostly focuses on the fear of robots de-humanising care, but the actual and foreseeable robots in care are assistive robots for classic automation of technical tasks. They are thus “care robots” only in a behavioural sense of performing tasks in care environments, not in the sense that a human “cares” for the patients. It appears that the success of “being cared for” relies on this intentional sense of “care”, which foreseeable robots cannot provide. If anything, the risk of robots in care is the absence of such intentional care—because less human carers may be needed. Interestingly, caring for something, even a virtual agent, can be good for the carer themselves (Lee et al. 2019). A system that pretends to care would be deceptive and thus problematic—unless the deception is countered by sufficiently large utility gain (Coeckelbergh 2016). Some robots that pretend to “care” on a basic level are available (Paro seal) and others are in the making. Perhaps feeling cared for by a machine, to some extent, is progress for come patients.

2.5.2 Example (b) Sex Robots

It has been argued by several tech optimists that humans will likely be interested in sex and companionship with robots and be comfortable with the idea (Levy 2007). Given the variation of human sexual preferences, including sex toys and sex dolls, this seems very likely: The question is whether such devices should be manufactured and promoted, and whether there should be limits in this touchy area. It seems to have moved into the mainstream of “robot philosophy” in recent times (Sullins 2012; Danaher and McArthur 2017; N. Sharkey et al. 2017 [OIR]; Bendel 2018; Devlin 2018).

Humans have long had deep emotional attachments to objects, so perhaps companionship or even love with a predictable android is attractive, especially to people who struggle with actual humans, and already prefer dogs, cats, birds, a computer or a tamagotchi. Danaher (2019b) argues against (Nyholm and Frank 2017) that these can be true friendships, and is thus a valuable goal. It certainly looks like such friendship might increase overall utility, even if lacking in depth. In these discussions there is an issue of deception, since a robot cannot (at present) mean what it says, or have feelings for a human. It is well known that humans are prone to attribute feelings and thoughts to entities that behave as if they had sentience,even to clearly inanimate objects that show no behaviour at all. Also, paying for deception seems to be an elementary part of the traditional sex industry.

Finally, there are concerns that have often accompanied matters of sex, namely consent (Frank and Nyholm 2017), aesthetic concerns, and the worry that humans may be “corrupted” by certain experiences. Old fashioned though this may seem, human behaviour is influenced by experience, and it is likely that pornography or sex robots support the perception of other humans as mere objects of desire, or even recipients of abuse, and thus ruin a deeper sexual and erotic experience. In this vein, the “Campaign Against Sex Robots” argues that these devices are a continuation of slavery and prostitution (Richardson 2016).

2.6 Automation and Employment

It seems clear that AI and robotics will lead to significant gains in productivity and thus overall wealth. The attempt to increase productivity has often been a feature of the economy, though the emphasis on “growth” is a modern phenomenon (Harari 2016: 240). However, productivity gains through automation typically mean that fewer humans are required for the same output. This does not necessarily imply a loss of overall employment, however, because available wealth increases and that can increase demand sufficiently to counteract the productivity gain. In the long run, higher productivity in industrial societies has led to more wealth overall. Major labour market disruptions have occurred in the past, e.g., farming employed over 60% of the workforce in Europe and North-America in 1800, while by 2010 it employed ca. 5% in the EU, and even less in the wealthiest countries (European Commission 2013). In the 20 years between 1950 and 1970 the number of hired agricultural workers in the UK was reduced by 50% (Zayed and Loft 2019). Some of these disruptions lead to more labour-intensive industries moving to places with lower labour cost. This is an ongoing process.

Classic automation replaced human muscle, whereas digital automation replaces human thought or information-processing—and unlike physical machines, digital automation is very cheap to duplicate (Bostrom and Yudkowsky 2014). It may thus mean a more radical change on the labour market. So, the main question is: will the effects be different this time? Will the creation of new jobs and wealth keep up with the destruction of jobs? And even if it is not different, what are the transition costs, and who bears them? Do we need to make societal adjustments for a fair distribution of costs and benefits of digital automation?

Responses to the issue of unemployment from AI have ranged from the alarmed (Frey and Osborne 2013; Westlake 2014) to the neutral (Metcalf, Keller, and Boyd 2016 [OIR]; Calo 2018; Frey 2019) to the optimistic (Brynjolfsson and McAfee 2016; Harari 2016; Danaher 2019a). In principle, the labour market effect of automation seems to be fairly well understood as involving two channels:

(i) the nature of interactions between differently skilled workers and new technologies affecting labour demand and (ii) the equilibrium effects of technological progress through consequent changes in labour supply and product markets. (Goos 2018: 362)

What currently seems to happen in the labour market as a result of AI and robotics automation is “job polarisation” or the “dumbbell” shape (Goos, Manning, and Salomons 2009): The highly skilled technical jobs are in demand and highly paid, the low skilled service jobs are in demand and badly paid, but the mid-qualification jobs in factories and offices, i.e., the majority of jobs, are under pressure and reduced because they are relatively predictable, and most likely to be automated (Baldwin 2019).

Perhaps enormous productivity gains will allow the “age of leisure” to be realised, something (Keynes 1930) had predicted to occur around 2030, assuming a growth rate of 1% per annum. Actually, we have already reached the level he anticipated for 2030, but we are still working—consuming more and inventing ever more levels of organisation. Harari explains how this economic development allowed humanity to overcome hunger, disease, and war—and now we aim for immortality and eternal bliss through AI, thus his title Homo Deus (Harari 2016: 75).

In general terms, the issue of unemployment is an issue of how goods in a society should be justly distributed. A standard view is that distributive justice should be rationally decided from behind a “veil of ignorance” (Rawls 1971), i.e., as if one does not know what position in a society one would actually be taking (labourer or industrialist, etc.). Rawls thought the chosen principles would then support basic liberties and a distribution that is of greatest benefit to the least-advantaged members of society. It would appear that the AI economy has three features that make such justice unlikely: First, it operates in a largely unregulated environment where responsibility is often hard to allocate. Second, it operates in markets that have a “winner takes all” feature where monopolies develop quickly. Third, the “new economy” of the digital service industries is based on intangible assets, also called “capitalism without capital” (Haskel and Westlake 2017). This means that it is difficult to control multinational digital corporations that do not rely on a physical plant in a particular location. These three features seem to suggest that if we leave the distribution of wealth to free market forces, the result would be a heavily unjust distribution: And this is indeed a development that we can already see.

One interesting question that has not received too much attention is whether the development of AI is environmentally sustainable: Like all computing systems, AI systems produce waste that is very hard to recycle and they consume vast amounts of energy, especially for the training of machine learning systems (and even for the “mining” of cryptocurrency). Again, it appears that some actors in this space offload such costs to the general society.

2.7 Autonomous Systems

There are several notions of autonomy in the discussion of autonomous systems. A stronger notion is involved in philosophical debates where autonomy is the basis for responsibility and personhood (Christman 2003 [2018]). In this context, responsibility implies autonomy, but not inversely, so there can be systems that have degrees of technical autonomy without raising issues of responsibility. The weaker, more technical, notion of autonomy in robotics is relative and gradual: A system is said to be autonomous with respect to human control to a certain degree (Müller 2012). There is a parallel here to the issues of bias and opacity in AI since autonomy also concerns a power-relation: who is in control, and who is responsible?

Generally speaking, one question is the degree to which autonomous robots raise issues our present conceptual schemes must adapt to, or whether they just require technical adjustments. In most jurisdictions, there is a sophisticated system of civil and criminal liability to resolve such issues. Technical standards, e.g., for the safe use of machinery in medical environments, will likely need to be adjusted. There is already a field of “verifiable AI” for such safety-critical systems and for “security applications”. Bodies like the IEEE (The Institute of Electrical and Electronics Engineers) and the BSI (British Standards Institution) have produced “standards”, particularly on more technical sub-problems, such as data security and transparency. Among the many autonomous systems on land, on water, under water, in air or space, we discuss two samples: autonomous vehicles and autonomous weapons.

2.7.1 Example (a) Autonomous Vehicles

Autonomous vehicles hold the promise to reduce the very significant damage that human driving currently causes—approximately 1 million humans being killed per year, many more injured, the environment polluted, earth sealed with concrete and tarmac, cities full of parked cars, etc. However, there seem to be questions on how autonomous vehicles should behave, and how responsibility and risk should be distributed in the complicated system the vehicles operates in. (There is also significant disagreement over how long the development of fully autonomous, or “level 5” cars (SAE International 2018) will actually take.)

There is some discussion of “trolley problems” in this context. In the classic “trolley problems” (Thomson 1976; Woollard and Howard-Snyder 2016: section 2) various dilemmas are presented. The simplest version is that of a trolley train on a track that is heading towards five people and will kill them, unless the train is diverted onto a side track, but on that track there is one person, who will be killed if the train takes that side track. The example goes back to a remark in (Foot 1967: 6), who discusses a number of dilemma cases where tolerated and intended consequences of an action differ. “Trolley problems” are not supposed to describe actual ethical problems or to be solved with a “right” choice. Rather, they are thought-experiments where choice is artificially constrained to a small finite number of distinct one-off options and where the agent has perfect knowledge. These problems are used as a theoretical tool to investigate ethical intuitions and theories—especially the difference between actively doing vs. allowing something to happen, intended vs. tolerated consequences, and consequentialist vs. other normative approaches (Kamm 2016). This type of problem has reminded many of the problems encountered in actual driving and in autonomous driving (Lin 2016). It is doubtful, however, that an actual driver or autonomous car will ever have to solve trolley problems (but see Keeling 2020). While autonomous car trolley problems have received a lot of media attention (Awad et al. 2018), they do not seem to offer anything new to either ethical theory or to the programming of autonomous vehicles.

The more common ethical problems in driving, such as speeding, risky overtaking, not keeping a safe distance, etc. are classic problems of pursuing personal interest vs. the common good. The vast majority of these are covered by legal regulations on driving. Programming the car to drive “by the rules” rather than “by the interest of the passengers” or “to achieve maximum utility” is thus deflated to a standard problem of programming ethical machines (see section 2.9). There are probably additional discretionary rules of politeness and interesting questions on when to break the rules (Lin 2016), but again this seems to be more a case of applying standard considerations (rules vs. utility) to the case of autonomous vehicles.

Notable policy efforts in this field include the report (German Federal Ministry of Transport and Digital Infrastructure 2017), which stresses that safety is the primary objective. Rule 10 states

In the case of automated and connected driving systems, the accountability that was previously the sole preserve of the individual shifts from the motorist to the manufacturers and operators of the technological systems and to the bodies responsible for taking infrastructure, policy and legal decisions.

(See section 2.10.1 below). The resulting German and EU laws on licensing automated driving are much more restrictive than their US counterparts where “testing on consumers” is a strategy used by some companies—without informed consent of the consumers or their possible victims.

2.7.2 Example (b) Autonomous Weapons

The notion of automated weapons is fairly old:

For example, instead of fielding simple guided missiles or remotely piloted vehicles, we might launch completely autonomous land, sea, and air vehicles capable of complex, far-ranging reconnaissance and attack missions. (DARPA 1983: 1)

This proposal was ridiculed as “fantasy” at the time (Dreyfus, Dreyfus, and Athanasiou 1986: ix), but it is now a reality, at least for more easily identifiable targets (missiles, planes, ships, tanks, etc.), but not for human combatants. The main arguments against (lethal) autonomous weapon systems (AWS or LAWS), are that they support extrajudicial killings, take responsibility away from humans, and make wars or killings more likely—for a detailed list of issues see Lin, Bekey, and Abney (2008: 73–86).

It appears that lowering the hurdle to use such systems (autonomous vehicles, “fire-and-forget” missiles, or drones loaded with explosives) and reducing the probability of being held accountable would increase the probability of their use. The crucial asymmetry where one side can kill with impunity, and thus has few reasons not to do so, already exists in conventional drone wars with remote controlled weapons (e.g., US in Pakistan). It is easy to imagine a small drone that searches, identifies, and kills an individual human—or perhaps a type of human. These are the kinds of cases brought forward by the Campaign to Stop Killer Robots and other activist groups. Some seem to be equivalent to saying that autonomous weapons are indeed weapons …, and weapons kill, but we still make them in gigantic numbers. On the matter of accountability, autonomous weapons might make identification and prosecution of the responsible agents more difficult—but this is not clear, given the digital records that one can keep, at least in a conventional war. The difficulty of allocating punishment is sometimes called the “retribution gap” (Danaher 2016a).

Another question is whether using autonomous weapons in war would make wars worse, or make wars less bad. If robots reduce war crimes and crimes in war, the answer may well be positive and has been used as an argument in favour of these weapons (Arkin 2009; Müller 2016a) but also as an argument against them (Amoroso and Tamburrini 2018). Arguably the main threat is not the use of such weapons in conventional warfare, but in asymmetric conflicts or by non-state agents, including criminals.

It has also been said that autonomous weapons cannot conform to International Humanitarian Law, which requires observance of the principles of distinction (between combatants and civilians), proportionality (of force), and military necessity (of force) in military conflict (A. Sharkey 2019). It is true that the distinction between combatants and non-combatants is hard, but the distinction between civilian and military ships is easy—so all this says is that we should not construct and use such weapons if they do violate Humanitarian Law. Additional concerns have been raised that being killed by an autonomous weapon threatens human dignity, but even the defenders of a ban on these weapons seem to say that these are not good arguments:

There are other weapons, and other technologies, that also compromise human dignity. Given this, and the ambiguities inherent in the concept, it is wiser to draw on several types of objections in arguments against AWS, and not to rely exclusively on human dignity. (A. Sharkey 2019)

A lot has been made of keeping humans “in the loop” or “on the loop” in the military guidance on weapons—these ways of spelling out “meaningful control” are discussed in (Santoni de Sio and van den Hoven 2018). There have been discussions about the difficulties of allocating responsibility for the killings of an autonomous weapon, and a “responsibility gap” has been suggested (esp. Rob Sparrow 2007), meaning that neither the human nor the machine may be responsible. On the other hand, we do not assume that for every event there is someone responsible for that event, and the real issue may well be the distribution of risk (Simpson and Müller 2016). Risk analysis (Hansson 2013) indicates it is crucial to identify who is exposed to risk, who is a potential beneficiary, and who makes the decisions (Hansson 2018: 1822–1824).

2.8 Machine Ethics

Machine ethics is ethics for machines, for “ethical machines”, for machines as subjects, rather than for the human use of machines as objects. It is often not very clear whether this is supposed to cover all of AI ethics or to be a part of it (Floridi and Saunders 2004; Moor 2006; Anderson and Anderson 2011; Wallach and Asaro 2017). Sometimes it looks as though there is the (dubious) inference at play here that if machines act in ethically relevant ways, then we need a machine ethics. Accordingly, some use a broader notion:

machine ethics is concerned with ensuring that the behavior of machines toward human users, and perhaps other machines as well, is ethically acceptable. (Anderson and Anderson 2007: 15)

This might include mere matters of product safety, for example. Other authors sound rather ambitious but use a narrower notion:

AI reasoning should be able to take into account societal values, moral and ethical considerations; weigh the respective priorities of values held by different stakeholders in various multicultural contexts; explain its reasoning; and guarantee transparency. (Dignum 2018: 1, 2)

Some of the discussion in machine ethics makes the very substantial assumption that machines can, in some sense, be ethical agents responsible for their actions, or “autonomous moral agents” (see van Wynsberghe and Robbins 2019). The basic idea of machine ethics is now finding its way into actual robotics where the assumption that these machines are artificial moral agents in any substantial sense is usually not made (Winfield et al. 2019). It is sometimes observed that a robot that is programmed to follow ethical rules can very easily be modified to follow unethical rules (Vanderelst and Winfield 2018).

The idea that machine ethics might take the form of “laws” has famously been investigated by Isaac Asimov, who proposed “three laws of robotics” (Asimov 1942):

First Law—A robot may not injure a human being or, through inaction, allow a human being to come to harm. Second Law—A robot must obey the orders given it by human beings except where such orders would conflict with the First Law. Third Law—A robot must protect its own existence as long as such protection does not conflict with the First or Second Laws.

Asimov then showed in a number of stories how conflicts between these three laws will make it problematic to use them despite their hierarchical organisation.

It is not clear that there is a consistent notion of “machine ethics” since weaker versions are in danger of reducing “having an ethics” to notions that would not normally be considered sufficient (e.g., without “reflection” or even without “action”); stronger notions that move towards artificial moral agents may describe a—currently—empty set.

2.9 Artificial Moral Agents

If one takes machine ethics to concern moral agents, in some substantial sense, then these agents can be called “artificial moral agents”, having rights and responsibilities. However, the discussion about artificial entities challenges a number of common notions in ethics and it can be very useful to understand these in abstraction from the human case (cf. Misselhorn 2020; Powers and Ganascia forthcoming).

Several authors use “artificial moral agent” in a less demanding sense, borrowing from the use of “agent” in software engineering in which case matters of responsibility and rights will not arise (Allen, Varner, and Zinser 2000). James Moor (2006) distinguishes four types of machine agents: ethical impact agents (e.g., robot jockeys), implicit ethical agents (e.g., safe autopilot), explicit ethical agents (e.g., using formal methods to estimate utility), and full ethical agents (who “can make explicit ethical judgments and generally is competent to reasonably justify them. An average adult human is a full ethical agent”.) Several ways to achieve “explicit” or “full” ethical agents have been proposed, via programming it in (operational morality), via “developing” the ethics itself (functional morality), and finally full-blown morality with full intelligence and sentience (Allen, Smit, and Wallach 2005; Moor 2006). Programmed agents are sometimes not considered “full” agents because they are “competent without comprehension”, just like the neurons in a brain (Dennett 2017; Hakli and Mäkelä 2019).

In some discussions, the notion of “moral patient” plays a role: Ethical agents have responsibilities while ethical patients have rights because harm to them matters. It seems clear that some entities are patients without being agents, e.g., simple animals that can feel pain but cannot make justified choices. On the other hand, it is normally understood that all agents will also be patients (e.g., in a Kantian framework). Usually, being a person is supposed to be what makes an entity a responsible agent, someone who can have duties and be the object of ethical concerns. Such personhood is typically a deep notion associated with phenomenal consciousness, intention and free will (Frankfurt 1971; Strawson 1998). Torrance (2011) suggests “artificial (or machine) ethics could be defined as designing machines that do things that, when done by humans, are indicative of the possession of ‘ethical status’ in those humans” (2011: 116)—which he takes to be “ethical productivity and ethical receptivity” (2011: 117)—his expressions for moral agents and patients.

2.9.1 Responsibility for Robots

There is broad consensus that accountability, liability, and the rule of law are basic requirements that must be upheld in the face of new technologies (European Group on Ethics in Science and New Technologies 2018, 18), but the issue in the case of robots is how this can be done and how responsibility can be allocated. If the robots act, will they themselves be responsible, liable, or accountable for their actions? Or should the distribution of risk perhaps take precedence over discussions of responsibility?

Traditional distribution of responsibility already occurs: A car maker is responsible for the technical safety of the car, a driver is responsible for driving, a mechanic is responsible for proper maintenance, the public authorities are responsible for the technical conditions of the roads, etc. In general

The effects of decisions or actions based on AI are often the result of countless interactions among many actors, including designers, developers, users, software, and hardware.… With distributed agency comes distributed responsibility. (Taddeo and Floridi 2018: 751).

How this distribution might occur is not a problem that is specific to AI, but it gains particular urgency in this context (Nyholm 2018a, 2018b). In classical control engineering, distributed control is often achieved through a control hierarchy plus control loops across these hierarchies.

2.9.2 Rights for Robots

Some authors have indicated that it should be seriously considered whether current robots must be allocated rights (Gunkel 2018a, 2018b; Danaher forthcoming; Turner 2019). This position seems to rely largely on criticism of the opponents and on the empirical observation that robots and other non-persons are sometimes treated as having rights. In this vein, a “relational turn” has been proposed: If we relate to robots as though they had rights, then we might be well-advised not to search whether they “really” do have such rights (Coeckelbergh 2010, 2012, 2018). This raises the question how far such anti-realism or quasi-realism can go, and what it means then to say that “robots have rights” in a human-centred approach (Gerdes 2016). On the other side of the debate, Bryson has insisted that robots should not enjoy rights (Bryson 2010), though she considers it a possibility (Gunkel and Bryson 2014).

There is a wholly separate issue whether robots (or other AI systems) should be given the status of “legal entities” or “legal persons” in a sense natural persons, but also states, businesses, or organisations are “entities”, namely they can have legal rights and duties. The European Parliament has considered allocating such status to robots in order to deal with civil liability (EU Parliament 2016; Bertolini and Aiello 2018), but not criminal liability—which is reserved for natural persons. It would also be possible to assign only a certain subset of rights and duties to robots. It has been said that “such legislative action would be morally unnecessary and legally troublesome” because it would not serve the interest of humans (Bryson, Diamantis, and Grant 2017: 273). In environmental ethics there is a long-standing discussion about the legal rights for natural objects like trees (C. D. Stone 1972).

It has also been said that the reasons for developing robots with rights, or artificial moral patients, in the future are ethically doubtful (van Wynsberghe and Robbins 2019). In the community of “artificial consciousness” researchers there is a significant concern whether it would be ethical to create such consciousness since creating it would presumably imply ethical obligations to a sentient being, e.g., not to harm it and not to end its existence by switching it off—some authors have called for a “moratorium on synthetic phenomenology” (Bentley et al. 2018: 28f).

2.10 Singularity

2.10.1 Singularity and Superintelligence

In some quarters, the aim of current AI is thought to be an “artificial general intelligence” (AGI), contrasted to a technical or “narrow” AI. AGI is usually distinguished from traditional notions of AI as a general purpose system, and from Searle’s notion of “strong AI”:

computers given the right programs can be literally said to understand and have other cognitive states. (Searle 1980: 417)

The idea of singularity is that if the trajectory of artificial intelligence reaches up to systems that have a human level of intelligence, then these systems would themselves have the ability to develop AI systems that surpass the human level of intelligence, i.e., they are “superintelligent” (see below). Such superintelligent AI systems would quickly self-improve or develop even more intelligent systems. This sharp turn of events after reaching superintelligent AI is the “singularity” from which the development of AI is out of human control and hard to predict (Kurzweil 2005: 487).

The fear that “the robots we created will take over the world” had captured human imagination even before there were computers (e.g., Butler 1863) and is the central theme in Čapek’s famous play that introduced the word “robot” (Čapek 1920). This fear was first formulated as a possible trajectory of existing AI into an “intelligence explosion” by Irvin Good:

Let an ultraintelligent machine be defined as a machine that can far surpass all the intellectual activities of any man however clever. Since the design of machines is one of these intellectual activities, an ultraintelligent machine could design even better machines; there would then unquestionably be an “intelligence explosion”, and the intelligence of man would be left far behind. Thus the first ultraintelligent machine is the last invention that man need ever make, provided that the machine is docile enough to tell us how to keep it under control. (Good 1965: 33)

The optimistic argument from acceleration to singularity is spelled out by Kurzweil (1999, 2005, 2012) who essentially points out that computing power has been increasing exponentially, i.e., doubling ca. every 2 years since 1970 in accordance with “Moore’s Law” on the number of transistors, and will continue to do so for some time in the future. He predicted in (Kurzweil 1999) that by 2010 supercomputers will reach human computation capacity, by 2030 “mind uploading” will be possible, and by 2045 the “singularity” will occur. Kurzweil talks about an increase in computing power that can be purchased at a given cost—but of course in recent years the funds available to AI companies have also increased enormously: Amodei and Hernandez (2018 [OIR]) thus estimate that in the years 2012–2018 the actual computing power available to train a particular AI system doubled every 3.4 months, resulting in an 300,000x increase—not the 7x increase that doubling every two years would have created.

A common version of this argument (Chalmers 2010) talks about an increase in “intelligence” of the AI system (rather than raw computing power), but the crucial point of “singularity” remains the one where further development of AI is taken over by AI systems and accelerates beyond human level. Bostrom (2014) explains in some detail what would happen at that point and what the risks for humanity are. The discussion is summarised in Eden et al. (2012); Armstrong (2014); Shanahan (2015). There are possible paths to superintelligence other than computing power increase, e.g., the complete emulation of the human brain on a computer (Kurzweil 2012; Sandberg 2013), biological paths, or networks and organisations (Bostrom 2014: 22–51).

Despite obvious weaknesses in the identification of “intelligence” with processing power, Kurzweil seems right that humans tend to underestimate the power of exponential growth. Mini-test: If you walked in steps in such a way that each step is double the previous, starting with a step of one metre, how far would you get with 30 steps? (answer: almost 3 times further than the Earth’s only permanent natural satellite.) Indeed, most progress in AI is readily attributable to the availability of processors that are faster by degrees of magnitude, larger storage, and higher investment (Müller 2018). The actual acceleration and its speeds are discussed in (Müller and Bostrom 2016; Bostrom, Dafoe, and Flynn forthcoming); Sandberg (2019) argues that progress will continue for some time.

The participants in this debate are united by being technophiles in the sense that they expect technology to develop rapidly and bring broadly welcome changes—but beyond that, they divide into those who focus on benefits (e.g., Kurzweil) and those who focus on risks (e.g., Bostrom). Both camps sympathise with “transhuman” views of survival for humankind in a different physical form, e.g., uploaded on a computer (Moravec 1990, 1998; Bostrom 2003a, 2003c). They also consider the prospects of “human enhancement” in various respects, including intelligence—often called “IA” (intelligence augmentation). It may be that future AI will be used for human enhancement, or will contribute further to the dissolution of the neatly defined human single person. Robin Hanson provides detailed speculation about what will happen economically in case human “brain emulation” enables truly intelligent robots or “ems” (Hanson 2016).

The argument from superintelligence to risk requires the assumption that superintelligence does not imply benevolence—contrary to Kantian traditions in ethics that have argued higher levels of rationality or intelligence would go along with a better understanding of what is moral and better ability to act morally (Gewirth 1978; Chalmers 2010: 36f). Arguments for risk from superintelligence say that rationality and morality are entirely independent dimensions—this is sometimes explicitly argued for as an “orthogonality thesis” (Bostrom 2012; Armstrong 2013; Bostrom 2014: 105–109).

Criticism of the singularity narrative has been raised from various angles. Kurzweil and Bostrom seem to assume that intelligence is a one-dimensional property and that the set of intelligent agents is totally-ordered in the mathematical sense—but neither discusses intelligence at any length in their books. Generally, it is fair to say that despite some efforts, the assumptions made in the powerful narrative of superintelligence and singularity have not been investigated in detail. One question is whether such a singularity will ever occur—it may be conceptually impossible, practically impossible or may just not happen because of contingent events, including people actively preventing it. Philosophically, the interesting question is whether singularity is just a “myth” (Floridi 2016; Ganascia 2017), and not on the trajectory of actual AI research. This is something that practitioners often assume (e.g., Brooks 2017 [OIR]). They may do so because they fear the public relations backlash, because they overestimate the practical problems, or because they have good reasons to think that superintelligence is an unlikely outcome of current AI research (Müller forthcoming-a). This discussion raises the question whether the concern about “singularity” is just a narrative about fictional AI based on human fears. But even if one does find negative reasons compelling and the singularity not likely to occur, there is still a significant possibility that one may turn out to be wrong. Philosophy is not on the “secure path of a science” (Kant 1791: B15), and maybe AI and robotics aren’t either (Müller 2020). So, it appears that discussing the very high-impact risk of singularity has justification even if one thinks the probability of such singularity ever occurring is very low.

2.10.2 Existential Risk from Superintelligence

Thinking about superintelligence in the long term raises the question whether superintelligence may lead to the extinction of the human species, which is called an “existential risk” (or XRisk): The superintelligent systems may well have preferences that conflict with the existence of humans on Earth, and may thus decide to end that existence—and given their superior intelligence, they will have the power to do so (or they may happen to end it because they do not really care).

Thinking in the long term is the crucial feature of this literature. Whether the singularity (or another catastrophic event) occurs in 30 or 300 or 3000 years does not really matter (Baum et al. 2019). Perhaps there is even an astronomical pattern such that an intelligent species is bound to discover AI at some point, and thus bring about its own demise. Such a “great filter” would contribute to the explanation of the “Fermi paradox” why there is no sign of life in the known universe despite the high probability of it emerging. It would be bad news if we found out that the “great filter” is ahead of us, rather than an obstacle that Earth has already passed. These issues are sometimes taken more narrowly to be about human extinction (Bostrom 2013), or more broadly as concerning any large risk for the species (Rees 2018)—of which AI is only one (Häggström 2016; Ord 2020). Bostrom also uses the category of “global catastrophic risk” for risks that are sufficiently high up the two dimensions of “scope” and “severity” (Bostrom and Ćirković 2011; Bostrom 2013).

These discussions of risk are usually not connected to the general problem of ethics under risk (e.g., Hansson 2013, 2018). The long-term view has its own methodological challenges but has produced a wide discussion: (Tegmark 2017) focuses on AI and human life “3.0” after singularity while Russell, Dewey, and Tegmark (2015) and Bostrom, Dafoe, and Flynn (forthcoming) survey longer-term policy issues in ethical AI. Several collections of papers have investigated the risks of artificial general intelligence (AGI) and the factors that might make this development more or less risk-laden (Müller 2016b; Callaghan et al. 2017; Yampolskiy 2018), including the development of non-agent AI (Drexler 2019).

2.10.3 Controlling Superintelligence?

In a narrow sense, the “control problem” is how we humans can remain in control of an AI system once it is superintelligent (Bostrom 2014: 127ff). In a wider sense, it is the problem of how we can make sure an AI system will turn out to be positive according to human perception (Russell 2019); this is sometimes called “value alignment”. How easy or hard it is to control a superintelligence depends significantly on the speed of “take-off” to a superintelligent system. This has led to particular attention to systems with self-improvement, such as AlphaZero (Silver et al. 2018).

One aspect of this problem is that we might decide a certain feature is desirable, but then find out that it has unforeseen consequences that are so negative that we would not desire that feature after all. This is the ancient problem of King Midas who wished that all he touched would turn into gold. This problem has been discussed on the occasion of various examples, such as the “paperclip maximiser” (Bostrom 2003b), or the program to optimise chess performance (Omohundro 2014).

Discussions about superintelligence include speculation about omniscient beings, the radical changes on a “latter day”, and the promise of immortality through transcendence of our current bodily form—so sometimes they have clear religious undertones (Capurro 1993; Geraci 2008, 2010; O’Connell 2017: 160ff). These issues also pose a well-known problem of epistemology: Can we know the ways of the omniscient (Danaher 2015)? The usual opponents have already shown up: A characteristic response of an atheist is

People worry that computers will get too smart and take over the world, but the real problem is that they’re too stupid and they’ve already taken over the world (Domingos 2015)

The new nihilists explain that a “techno-hypnosis” through information technologies has now become our main method of distraction from the loss of meaning (Gertz 2018). Both opponents would thus say we need an ethics for the “small” problems that occur with actual AI and robotics (sections 2.1 through 2.9 above), and that there is less need for the “big ethics” of existential risk from AI (section 2.10).

3. Closing

The singularity thus raises the problem of the concept of AI again. It is remarkable how imagination or “vision” has played a central role since the very beginning of the discipline at the “Dartmouth Summer Research Project” (McCarthy et al. 1955 [OIR]; Simon and Newell 1958). And the evaluation of this vision is subject to dramatic change: In a few decades, we went from the slogans “AI is impossible” (Dreyfus 1972) and “AI is just automation” (Lighthill 1973) to “AI will solve all problems” (Kurzweil 1999) and “AI may kill us all” (Bostrom 2014). This created media attention and public relations efforts, but it also raises the problem of how much of this “philosophy and ethics of AI” is really about AI rather than about an imagined technology. As we said at the outset, AI and robotics have raised fundamental questions about what we should do with these systems, what the systems themselves should do, and what risks they have in the long term. They also challenge the human view of humanity as the intelligent and dominant species on Earth. We have seen issues that have been raised and will have to watch technological and social developments closely to catch the new issues early on, develop a philosophical analysis, and learn for traditional problems of philosophy.


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Early drafts of this article were discussed with colleagues at the IDEA Centre of the University of Leeds, some friends, and my PhD students Michael Cannon, Zach Gudmunsen, Gabriela Arriagada-Bruneau and Charlotte Stix. Later drafts were made publicly available on the Internet and publicised via Twitter and e-mail to all (then) cited authors that I could locate. These later drafts were presented to audiences at the INBOTS Project Meeting (Reykjavik 2019), the Computer Science Department Colloquium (Leeds 2019), the European Robotics Forum (Bucharest 2019), the AI Lunch and the Philosophy & Ethics group (Eindhoven 2019)—many thanks for their comments.

I am grateful for detailed written comments by John Danaher, Martin Gibert, Elizabeth O’Neill, Sven Nyholm, Etienne B. Roesch, Emma Ruttkamp-Bloem, Tom Powers, Steve Taylor, and Alan Winfield. I am grateful for further useful comments by Colin Allen, Susan Anderson, Christof Wolf-Brenner, Rafael Capurro, Mark Coeckelbergh, Yazmin Morlet Corti, Erez Firt, Vasilis Galanos, Anne Gerdes, Olle Häggström, Geoff Keeling, Karabo Maiyane, Brent Mittelstadt, Britt Östlund, Steve Petersen, Brian Pickering, Zoë Porter, Amanda Sharkey, Melissa Terras, Stuart Russell, Jan F Veneman, Jeffrey White, and Xinyi Wu.

Parts of the work on this article have been supported by the European Commission under the INBOTS project (H2020 grant no. 780073).

Copyright © 2020 by
Vincent C. Müller <>

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