Experimental Philosophy

First published Tue Dec 19, 2017

Experimental philosophy is an interdisciplinary approach that brings together ideas from what had previously been regarded as distinct fields. Specifically, research in experimental philosophy brings together two key elements:

  1. the kinds of questions and theoretical frameworks traditionally associated with philosophy;
  2. the kinds of experimental methods traditionally associated with psychology and cognitive science.

Though experimental philosophy is united by this broad approach, there is a diverse range of projects in experimental philosophy. Some use experimental evidence to support a “negative program” that challenges more traditional methods in analytic philosophy, others use experimental data to support positive claims about traditional questions, and still others explore questions about how people ordinarily think and feel insofar as these questions are important in themselves.

This entry provides a brief introduction to the core aims of contemporary experimental philosophy. It then reviews recent experimental work on the negative program, free will, moral judgment and epistemology. We conclude with a discussion of major objections to the field of experimental philosophy as a whole.

1. Overview

Experimental philosophy is a relatively new approach, usually understood as beginning only in the early years of the 21st century. At the heart of this new approach is the idea of pursuing philosophical questions using methods more typically associated with the social sciences.

Within the broad banner of experimental philosophy research, one finds work using an enormous variety of methods and aims (see, e.g., Schwitzgebel & Rust 2014; Meskin et al. 2013; Bartels & Urminsky 2011). Nonetheless, most research in experimental philosophy makes use of a collection of closely connected methods that in some way involve the study of intuitions. The remainder of this section aims to characterize the different projects experimental philosophers have pursued using these methods and their relevance for broader questions in philosophy.

The practice of exploring intuitions has its origins in a more traditional philosophical approach that long predates the birth of experimental philosophy (see the entry on intuition). Research within this more traditional approach often relies on the idea that we can make progress on one or another topic by looking at intuitions about that topic. For example, within epistemology, it has been suggested that we can make progress on questions about the nature of knowledge by looking at intuitions about whether certain states count as knowledge. Similarly, within moral philosophy, it has been suggested that we can make progress on questions about moral obligation by looking at intuitions about what actions certain agents are obligated to perform. Similar approaches have been advocated in numerous other areas of philosophy.

There is a complex literature within the analytic tradition about how to understand this traditional method. Some argue that the study of intuitions gives us insight into concepts (Jackson 1998), others argue that the study of intuitions gives us a more direct sort of insight into the actual properties or relations those concepts pick out (Sosa 2007), and still others argue that this whole way of conceiving of the project is a mistaken one (e.g., Cappelen 2012).

It is commonplace to divide existing research in experimental philosophy into distinct projects in accordance with their different relationships to this prior tradition. Dividing things up in this way, one arrives at three basic kinds of research in experimental philosophy.

First, some experimental philosophy research has a purely ‘negative’ relationship to this more traditional use of intuitions. Such research aims to provide evidence that the method used in the more traditional work is in some way flawed or unreliable. For example, it has been argued that intuitions differ across demographic factors such as gender or ethnicity, or that they are subject to order effects, or that they can be influenced by incidental emotion (e.g., Weinberg et al. 2001; Buckwalter & Stich 2014; Swain et al. 2008; Cameron et al. 2013). To the extent that intuitions show these effects, it is argued, we should not be relying uncritically on intuition as a method for addressing substantive philosophical questions. This first project is called ‘negative’ in that it is not intended to make progress on the original philosophical question (e.g., about the nature of knowledge) but only to argue against a specific method for addressing that question (appeal to intuition).

This project has triggered a large and multi-faceted literature among philosophers interested in its metaphilosophical implications (Brown 2013b; Cappelen 2012; Deutsch 2015; Weinberg 2007; Weinberg et al. 2010; Williamson 2007). This literature has explored the question as to whether empirical facts about the patterns in people’s intuitions could give us reason to change our philosophical practices. Much of this work is quite closely tied to prior philosophical work about the role of intuition in philosophy more generally.

Second, some research in experimental philosophy aims to make further progress on precisely the sorts of questions that motivated prior work within analytic philosophy. Thus, this research looks at epistemic intuitions as a way of making progress in epistemology, moral intuitions as a way of making progress in moral philosophy, and so forth. Experimental philosophers pursuing this second project have offered various different accounts of the way in which facts about intuitions could yield progress on these philosophical issues, but the most common approach proceeds by advancing some specific hypothesis about the underlying cognitive processes that generate intuitions in a particular domain. The suggestion is then that this hypothesis can help us assess which intuitions in this domain are worthy of our trust and which should simply be dismissed or ignored (Gerken 2017; Leslie 2013; Greene 2008; Nagel 2010).

Work within this second project has inspired a certain amount of metaphilosophical debate, but its main impact on the philosophical literature has been not at the level of metaphilosophy but rather in discussions of individual philosophical questions. Thus, philosophers interested in epistemic contextualism discuss experiments on people’s intuitions about knowledge (DeRose 2011), philosophers interested in incompatibilism discuss experiments on people’s intuitions about free will (Björnsson & Pereboom 2014; Vargas 2013), and philosophers interested in interventionist accounts of causation discuss experiments on people’s intuitions about causation (Woodward 2014). Work in this vein typically does not focus primarily on more abstract theories about the role of intuitions in philosophy. Instead, it draws more on theories about the particular topic under study (theories of knowledge, free will, causation).

The third type of research being conducted in experimental philosophy is not concerned either way with the kind of project pursued in more traditional analytic philosophy; it is just doing something else entirely. Specifically, in many cases, experimental philosophers are not looking at people’s thoughts and feelings about some topic as a way of making progress on questions about that topic; they are instead trying to make progress on questions that are directly about people’s thoughts and feelings themselves. For example, much of the experimental philosophy research in moral psychology is concerned with questions that truly are about moral psychology itself.

Research in this third vein tends to be highly interdisciplinary. Thus, work on any particular topic within this third vein tends to be at least relatively continuous with work on that same topic in other disciplines (psychology, neuroscience, linguistics, etc.), and the impact of such work is often felt just as much in those other disciplines as in philosophy specifically.

The distinction between these projects has proven helpful within metaphilosophical work on the significance of experimental philosophy, but it should be noted that the metaphilosophical distinction between these three projects does not correspond in any straightforward way to the distinctions between the different concrete research programs experimental philosophers pursue (on free will intuitions, on moral intuitions, on epistemic intuitions, etc.). Each of these concrete research programs can be relevant to a number of different projects, and indeed, it often happens that a single paper reports a result that seems relevant to more than one of these projects. Thus, as we review the actual experimental research coming out of experimental philosophy, we will need to turn away from the metaphilosophical distinction between projects and turn instead to distinctions between concrete research topics.

2. Research in Experimental Philosophy

The best way to get a sense of what experimental philosophy is all about is not just to consider it in the abstract but to look in detail at a few ongoing research programs in the field. Accordingly, we proceed in this section by reviewing existing research in four specific areas: the negative program, free will, the impact of moral judgment, and epistemology.

We focus on these four areas because they have received an especially large amount of attention within the existing experimental philosophy of literature. We should note, however, that experimental philosophers have explored an enormous range of different questions, and work in these four specific areas comprises only a relatively small percentage of the experimental philosophy literature as a whole.

2.1 The Negative Program

In the Theaetetus, Socrates asks, “Herein lies the difficulty which I can never solve to my satisfaction—What is knowledge?” (146a). The subsequent philosophical discussion often proceeds by setting out various hypotheses, e.g., that knowledge is true belief, and considering possible counterexamples to the hypothesis. So, for instance, Socrates argues that knowledge isn’t simply true belief because a skilled lawyer can persuade a person to have a belief that is true, but that belief wouldn’t actually be knowledge [see the entry on the Theaetetus]. Socrates typically expects, and receives, agreement from his interlocutor. Nor does Socrates ask his interlocutor, “What is your conception of knowledge” or “What counts as knowledge for Athenians?” Rather, he seems to expect a global answer about what knowledge is. In addition, he seems to expect that knowledge has a single nature, as suggested by his telling Theaetetus, “I want you… to give one single account of the many branches of knowledge” (148d).

Work in the negative program of experimental philosophy uses empirical work to challenge this traditional philosophical project. Two somewhat different challenges have been developed.

2.1.1 The argument from diversity

One challenge arises from the prospect of systematic diversity in how different populations of people think about philosophical questions. The possibility of such diversity had been raised before (e.g., Stich 1990), but experimental philosophers have sought to provide evidence of such diversity. For instance, an early study reported differences between East Asian students and Western students on famous cases from epistemology (Weinberg et al. 2001). Another early study provided evidence for cultural differences in judgments about reference. East Asians were more likely than Westerners to have descriptivist judgments about the reference of proper names (Machery et al. 2004). Some studies have also found gender differences in intuitions about philosophical cases (see, e.g., Buckwalter & Stich 2014; Friesdorf et al. 2015). In addition, there are systematic individual differences in philosophical intuition; for example, people who are more extraverted are more inclined to compatibilism about responsibility (Feltz & Cokely 2009).

This apparent diversity in intuitions about philosophical matters has been used to challenge the use of intuitions in philosophy to tell us about the nature of things like knowledge and reference. If intuitions about knowledge turn out to exhibit diversity between populations, then this looks to put pressure on a traditional philosophical project. In rough form, the worry arises from the following claims:

  • D1. The philosophical tradition uses intuitions regarding philosophically important categories or kinds like knowledge in an effort to determine the nature of those categories
  • D2. Knowledge (like many other philosophical categories) has a single nature. It’s not the case that knowledge is one thing in Athens and another thing in Sparta.
  • D3. Intuitions about philosophical categories systematically vary between populations (by culture, for instance)
  • D4. The diversity in intuition cannot be dismissed by privileging the intuitions of one population.

Each of these claims has been challenged. Some argue that philosophers do not—or should not—rely on intuitions (thus rejecting D1) (see section 3.1); others hold, contra D4, that certain populations (e.g., professional philosophers) are specially positioned to have reliable intuitions (see section 3.2).

Another way to defuse the challenge is to argue (contra D2) that we needn’t suppose that knowledge has a single nature, but instead allow for a kind of pluralism. For instance, “knowledge” might pick out different epistemic notions in different communities. A pluralist might allow, or even celebrate, this diversity. Even if other communities have different epistemic values than we do, this need not undermine our valuing knowledge, as it is construed in our community (e.g., Sosa 2009: 109; also Lycan 2006). For a pluralist, empirical demonstrations of diversity needn’t undermine traditional philosophical methods, but might instead reveal important epistemic features that we have missed.

A more conservative response to the challenge, which leaves traditional philosophy largely untouched, is to question whether there really is diversity between populations in intuitions about philosophical categories. One way to develop this response is to claim that participants in different populations might simply interpret the scenarios in different ways; in that case, we could explain their different answers by saying that they are responding to different questions (e.g., Sosa 2009).

More importantly, a growing body of empirical evidence has called into question the claim that there really are large differences in philosophical intuitions across populations. Some of the original findings of culture differences have not replicated (e.g., Nagel et al. 2013; Kim & Yuan 2015); similarly, many of the original findings of gender differences haven’t replicated (e.g., Seyedsayamdost 2015; Adleberg et al. 2015). These findings provide strong reason to believe that some of the effects suggested by early experimental philosophy studies do not, in fact, exist at all. Moreover, experimental philosophers have also uncovered robust cross-cultural uniformity. For instance, one recent cross-cultural study examined intuitions about Gettier cases across four very different cultures (Brazil, India, Japan, and the USA), with participants in all groups tending to deny knowledge to the protagonist in Gettier cases (Machery et al. 2015). This suggests that there might be a universal “core folk epistemology” (Machery et al. 2015). In any case, these kinds of results suggest that there is less diversity than had been suggested.

2.1.2 The argument from sensitivity

The foregoing argument is based on diversity between populations. But experimental philosophers in the negative program have also used intra-individual diversity to undermine traditional philosophical methods (Swain et al. 2008; Sinnott-Armstrong 2008; Weinberg 2016). Experimental philosophers have found that people’s judgments about philosophical cases are sensitive to various kinds of contextual factors that seem to be philosophically irrelevant. The same person will give different responses depending on apparently irrelevant factors of presentation. People’s judgments about cases are affected by the induction of irrelevant emotions (Cameron et al. 2013), the order in which cases are presented (Petrinovich and O’Neill 1996; Swain et al. 2008; Wright 2010), and the way an outcome is described (e.g., Petrinovich and O’Neill 1996; Schwitzgebel & Cushman 2015).

Sensitivity to contextual factors has been used to challenge the philosophical use of intuition in a way that is somewhat distinct from the diversity argument. The challenge begins with the same assumption about the role of intuitions in philosophy, but then draws on somewhat different considerations:

  • S1. The philosophical tradition uses intuitions regarding philosophically important categories or kinds like knowledge in an effort to determine the nature of those categories
  • S2. A person’s judgments about philosophical cases are sensitive to contextual factors like the order of presentation.
  • S3. Sensitivity to these factors is epistemically inappropriate
  • S4. This inappropriate sensitivity cannot be dismissed by privileging the intuitions of one population (e.g., philosophers)
  • S5. We can’t tell, from the armchair, which of our judgments are inappropriately sensitive in this way.

This set of claims presents a challenge because it seems that even philosophers are susceptible to these epistemically inapt influences, and we can’t tell which of our intuitions are to be trusted. Thus, philosophers are on shaky epistemic ground when they rely on their intuitions to try to glean philosophical truths.

Obviously, the argument from sensitivity is developed in different ways depending on the category in question and the evidence of sensitivity, but it’s useful to see how the general claims (S1–S5) might be questioned. (See section 3.1 for the rejection of intuition in philosophy (S1) and section 3.2 for a defense of privileged populations [contra S4]).

Although there are replicable effects on the influence of contextual factors, pace S2 many of these effects seem too small to threaten the practice of relying on intuitions (see, e.g., Demaree-Cotton 2016; May 2014). The effect might amount to the difference between 2.2 and 2.5 on a 7 point scale. It’s hard to see how such a difference threatens the practice of relying on the operative intuitions.

In some cases, contextual factors have more pronounced effects, and do lead to changes in participants’ verdict about a case. For instance, judgments about certain moral dilemmas and judgments about certain epistemic cases are changed depending on previously seen cases (e.g., Petrinovich & O’Neill 1996; Swain et al. 2008). However, it’s possible that participants respond differently to a case because the contextual differences actually provide an epistemically appropriate basis for changing one’s judgment. For instance, in the order effect studies, seeing one case can provide evidence about the appropriate response on another case (Horne & Livengood 2016). On this view, we can grant that participants change their judgment, but deny that they are doing so in a way that is epistemically inappropriate.

Finally, even if people’s judgments do change in epistemically inappropriate ways, people might be able to recognize which judgments are especially trustworthy. For instance, only some thought experiments are susceptible to order effects, and it turns out that for these thought experiments, people have lower confidence in their responses (e.g., Wright 2010; Zamzow & Nichols 2009). This suggests (contra D5) that there might be an internal resource—confidence—that can be used to discern which judgments are epistemically unstable.

2.2 Free Will and Moral Responsibility

Research in experimental philosophy has explored many aspects of lay beliefs regarding free will. Experimental philosophers have designed improved scales for measuring belief in free will (Nadelhoffer et al. 2014; Deery et al. 2015), they have investigated the role of the desire to punish in attributing free will (Clark et al. 2014), and they have examined the impact of the belief in free will on moral behavior (Baumeister et al. 2009). But the most intensively studied issue concerns intuitions about whether free will is compatible with determinism.

Experimental philosophers have argued that the philosophical defense of incompatibilism depends on intuitions (e.g., Nahmias et al., 2006). The question about whether incompatibilism is true depends on a wide variety of factors, but experimental philosophers have argued that one factor that plausibly matters is the alleged intuitiveness of the thought that determinism is incompatible with free will (Murray & Nahmias 2014, but see Sommers 2010). This then generates a question that invites an empirical inquiry: is incompatibilism intuitive? (Nahmias et al. 2006).

One of the first experimental studies on free will found that people seemed to have compatibilist intuitions. Participants were presented with a scenario describing a deterministic universe, and then asked whether a person in the scenario was free and morally responsible (Nahmias et al. 2006). In one case, participants were asked to imagine a future scenario in which there is a supercomputer that is capable of predicting all future human behavior when provided with a complete description of the universe along with the laws of nature. In this scenario, a man robs a bank, and participants are asked whether the man is morally responsible for his action. Somewhat surprisingly, most participants gave compatibilist answers, saying that the person was morally blameworthy. This basic finding held across a number of scenarios.

In these early studies on intuitions about free will and moral responsibility, the description of determinism focused on the fact that in a deterministic universe, every event is in principle predictable from the past and the laws. In addition, the scenarios involved particular agents in our world doing bad things. Later studies emphasized the causal nature of determinism—that what happens at a given point is completely caused by what happened previously—and stressed that what happens in a deterministic universe is inevitable given the past. Even with this description of determinism, participants still tend to say that a specific concrete individual in such a universe who commits a heinous crime is free and responsible (Nichols & Knobe 2007; Roskies & Nichols 2008). However, when asked a more abstract question about whether it is possible in general for people in such a deterministic universe to be free and responsible, participants tend to say that morally responsibility is not possible in a deterministic universe. This incompatibilist response was also found in a cross cultural sample with participants from India, Hong Kong, Colombia, and the United States (Sarkissian et al. 2010). In addition to the abstract nature of the question, another important element seems to be whether one is considering an alternate deterministic universe or contemplating the possibility that our own universe is deterministic. When led to consider our own universe as deterministic, participants were more likely to say that people would still be morally responsible (Roskies & Nichols 2008).

Thus, it seems like people give compatibilist responses under some conditions and incompatibilist responses under others. One reaction to this apparent inconsistency is to treat one set of responses as defective. Some experimental philosophers maintain that it’s the incompatibilist responses that don’t reflect people’s true judgments. The best developed version of this view maintains people aren’t affirming incompatibilist responses at all (Nahmias & Murray 2011; Murray & Nahmias 2014). Instead, when people deny free will and responsibility it’s because they misunderstand the description of determinism. In particular, people mistakenly interpret the description of determinism to mean that our mental states lack causal efficacy, that the production of our behavior “bypasses” our mental states. That is, on this view, people wrongly think that determinism means that a person will behave as she does regardless of what she thinks, wants, or intends (Murray & Nahmias 2014).

Of course, if people’s mental states have no impact on their behavior, that is an excellent reason to think that people aren’t morally responsible for their behaviors. So, if people interpret determinism to mean bypassing, it is perfectly rational for them to infer the lack of free will and responsibility from bypassing. However, it seems to be a flat-out confusion to interpret determinism as bypassing. Even if determinism is true, our behavior might be caused (not bypassed) by our mental states. Thus, if people give incompatibilist responses because they confuse determinism with bypassing, then people’s responses don’t reflect a real commitment to incompatibilism.

Surprisingly, people do make bypassing judgments when given a description of causal determinism. For instance, when presented with a description of a determinist universe, many participants agreed that in that universe, “what a person wants has no effect on what they end up doing” (Murray & Nahmias 2014). This suggests that people go through the following confused process: determinism means bypassing, and bypassing means no free will. If that’s right, then the incompatibilist response really is a confusion. However, another explanation is that people think that determinism means no free will, and it’s the denial of free will that leads to the bypassing judgments. The idea would be roughly that if we don’t have free will, then in some way our mental states don’t lead to our behavior in the way we had thought. Some experimental philosophers have used statistical causal modeling to try to tease these two possibilities apart, arguing that it’s the latter explanation that is the right one (Björnsson 2014; Rose & Nichols 2013). That is, people take determinism to entail that there is no free will, and it is this judgment that there is no free will that leads to the bypassing judgment.

Thus, there is some reason to think that incompatibilist responses do reflect many people’s intuitions. What about the compatibilist responses? Some experimental philosophers maintain that it is these judgments that are distorted. On one view, the distortion is caused by emotional reactions (e.g., Nichols & Knobe 2007). However, a meta-analysis indicates that there is very little evidence that emotions play a critical role in generating compatibilist judgments (Feltz & Cova 2014). A different argument for demoting compatibilist judgments holds that many people who affirm free will in deterministic scenarios lack any sensitivity to compatibilist considerations, but instead will affirm free will even under fatalistic conditions in which it is explicitly stipulated that John’s behavior is inevitable “regardless of the past events in John’s life and the laws of nature”. (This view is dubbed “free will no matter what”; Feltz & Millan 2015.) One line of argument based on these results is that if people’s attributions of free will are so insensitive, it can hardly be said that people appreciate the consistency of free will and determinism. However, subsequent studies found that in these fatalistic scenarios, subjects who affirmed free will still tended to think that the source of the action was in the agent, in harmony with “source compatibilism” (Andow & Cova 2016).

Thus, the state of the evidence currently suggests that people do have both incompatibilist and compatibilist intuitions. Future empirical work might uncover more clearly what factors and processes draws people in one direction or the other. There are also open questions about whether the role of different psychological mechanisms in intuitions about free will has implications for philosophical questions for whether we are truly free and responsible.

2.3 Impact of Moral Judgment

It is common to distinguish between two kinds of judgments that people make about morally significant situations. On one hand, people can make straightforwardly moral judgments (e.g., judgments about moral wrongness, about obligation, about blameworthiness). On the other, they can make judgments that might be morally relevant but that still appear to be in some important sense non-moral judgments (about whether the agent acted intentionally, whether she caused certain outcomes, whether she knew what she was doing). A question now arises as to how to understand the relationship between these two different kinds of judgments.

One possible view would be that the relationship is entirely unidirectional. Thus, it might be thought that (a) people’s moral judgments depend on prior non-moral judgments, but (b) people’s non-moral judgments do not depend on prior moral judgments. We can illustrate this view with the example of the relationship between people’s moral judgments and their intentional action judgments. It seems clear that people’s moral judgments about whether an agent is deserving of blame might depend on prior non-moral judgments about whether this agent acted intentionally. However, one might think that things do not go in the opposite direction. It is not as though your non-moral judgment that the agent acted intentionally could depend on a prior moral judgment that her action was wrong.

Although this view might seem intuitively compelling, a series of studies in experimental philosophy have called it into question. These studies suggest that people’s moral judgments can impact their judgments even about what might appear to be entirely non-moral questions. Such results have been obtained for a wide variety of different apparently non-moral judgments.

  • When an agent knows that she will bring about an outcome but is not specifically trying to bring it about, people are more inclined to say that she brought it about intentionally when it is morally bad than when it is morally good (Knobe 2003).
  • When an agent correctly believes that an outcome will arise but is only correct in this belief as the result of a coincidence, people are more inclined to say that she has knowledge when the outcome is morally bad than when it is morally good (Beebe & Shea 2013; Buckwalter 2014).
  • When an agent has a lot of positive emotion and a high opinion of her life, people are less inclined to say that she is truly happy when her life is morally bad than when it is morally good (Phillips, Nyholm & Liao 2014).
  • When a number of different factors are each individually necessary for an outcome to arise, people are more inclined to regard one of the factors as a cause when it is morally bad than when it is morally good (Alicke 1992; Hitchcock & Knobe 2009).

Effects of moral judgment have also been observed on numerous other judgments, including everything from action individuation (Ulatowski, 2012) to attributions of weakness of will (May & Holton 2012) to the semantics of gradable adjectives (Egré & Cova 2015).

These findings might be philosophically relevant at two different levels. On one hand, each individual effect might be relevant to philosophical work that aims to understand the corresponding concept or property. Thus, the findings about intentional action judgments might be relevant to philosophical work about intentional action, those about happiness judgments might be relevant to philosophical work about happiness, and so forth. At the same time, the general finding that moral judgment has this pervasive influence might be relevant to philosophical work that focuses on the human mind and the way people make sense of the world. For example, these findings could help us to understand the nature of folk psychology or the relationship between our ordinary folk theories and more systematic scientific theories.

To make progress on these two issues, research has focused on trying to understand why these effects arise. That is, researchers have aimed to provide hypotheses about the precise cognitive processes that give rise to the patterns observed in people’s judgments. These hypotheses then, in turn, have implications for philosophical questions both about specific concepts and properties and about the human mind.

Existing research has led to a proliferation of hypotheses, drawing on theoretical frameworks from a variety of fields (see Cova 2016 for a review of seventeen hypotheses about the intentional action effect). Still, although there are numerous distinct specific hypotheses, it seems that the basic approaches can be grouped into four broad families.

First, it might be that the effect is not truly driven by moral judgment. Existing studies show that people make different judgments depending on whether the agent is doing something helpful or harmful, but of course, there are many differences between helpful and harmful actions other than their moral status. For example, a number of researchers have argued that the effect is in fact driven by people’s beliefs about the mental states of the agents in the vignettes (Sloman, Fernbach & Ewing 2012; Sripada & Konrath 2011). Agents will tend to have different sorts of mental states when they are doing something helpful than when they are doing something harmful, and it might be that this difference in mental states is driving all of the observed effects.

Second, it might be that the effect is indeed driven by moral judgment but that it is the result of an error. On this view, moral considerations do not play any real role in the concepts at work here (people’s concepts of intentional action, of happiness, etc.). Rather, people’s judgments are being biased or distorted by some further process which gets in the way of their ability to correctly apply their own concepts. For example, some researchers have argued that the effect is due to a process of motivated cognition (Alicke, Rose & Bloom 2011). People believe the agent to be blameworthy and want to justify that belief. This desire to justify blame then distorts their judgments about what might seem to be purely factual matters.

Third, it might be that the effect is driven by moral judgment and doesn’t involve an error but nonetheless simply reflects a fact about how people use words, rather than a fact about their application of the corresponding concepts. Researchers often make inferences from facts about how people use certain words (‘intentionally,’ ‘happy,’ ‘knows’) about how people apply the corresponding concepts (the concept of intentional action, of happiness, of knowledge). However, it is also possible for factors to influence the use of our words without influencing the use of these concepts, and some researchers have suggested that this is the process at work in the present effects. For example, it has been suggested that these effects arise as a result of conversational pragmatics, with people trying to avoid the pragmatic implicatures that would be generated by making certain claims that are in fact literally true (Adams & Steadman 2004). Alternatively, it has been suggested that the relevant words (e.g., ‘intentionally’) are actually associated with more than one different concept and that the impact of morality arises not because morality plays a role in any of these concepts but rather because it plays a role in the way people resolve the ambiguity of the word itself (Nichols & Ulatowski 2007). On these sorts of views, people are not necessarily making a mistake when their use of language is impacted by moral judgment, but all the same, moral judgment is not playing a role in their more basic capacities to make sense of the world.

Fourth, it might be that moral judgment actually plays a role in people’s basic capacities to apply the relevant concepts. For example, it has been argued that the concept of happiness is itself a value-laden concept (Phillips et al. 2014). Similarly, it has been suggested the concepts of intentional action and causation make use of a form of counterfactual thinking in which moral judgments play a key role (Icard, Kominsky & Knobe 2017; Phillips, Luguri & Knobe 2015). On this last view, the effects observed in these experiments point to a genuine role for moral judgment in the most basic capacities underlying people’s application of the relevant concepts.

Debates between these rival views remain ongoing. Within the more recent literature, discussion of these questions has become increasingly interdisciplinary, with many of the key contributions turning to methods from cognitive neuroscience, developmental psychology, or computational cognitive science.

2.4 Epistemology

Within experimental work in epistemology, the primary focus of research has been on the patterns of people’s ordinary attributions of knowledge. As we’ve seen (section 2.1), evidence on epistemic intuitions plays a prominent role in the negative program. But work in experimental epistemology has not been dominated by any one single issue or question. Rather, it has been divided among a number of different strands of research, which have each been pursued separately.

One important topic has been the role of stakes in people’s knowledge attributions. Suppose that Keith considers some available evidence and then concludes (correctly) that the bank will be open on Saturday. Now consider two cases. In the low-stakes case, it is not especially important whether the bank actually is open. By contrast, in the high-stakes case, Keith’s whole financial future depends on whether the bank is open or not. The key question now is whether this difference in stakes has any impact on whether it is correct to say: “Keith knows that the bank will be open”.

Within the non-experimental literature, philosophers have appealed to a wide variety of arguments to help resolve this question. Although many of these arguments do not directly involve people’s intuitions about cases (Brown 2013a; see also Fantl & McGrath 2009; Hawthorne 2004), some specifically rely on the empirical claim that people would be more willing to attribute knowledge when the stakes are low than when the stakes are high (DeRose 1992). Among philosophers who accept this empirical claim, there has been considerable debate about precisely how to explain the purported impact of stakes (DeRose 1992; Hawthorne 2004; Rysiew 2001; Stanley 2005).

Surprisingly, a number of early findings from the experimental epistemology literature suggested that people’s ordinary knowledge attributions actually don’t depend on stakes. For example, people seem to say that Keith knows the bank will be open on Saturday not only in the low-stakes case but also in the high-stakes case (Buckwalter 2010; Feltz & Zarpentine 2010; May et al. 2010). This experimental finding threatens to undermine the entire debate within the non-experimental epistemology literature. After all, if there is no effect of stakes, then there is no question as to how to understand this effect.

Subsequent experimental work in this area has therefore focused on the question as to whether the stakes effect even exists at all. Some have criticized the early experiments that did not find an effect (DeRose 2011). Others have shown that although the effect does not emerge in the experimental paradigms used by those early experiments, it does emerge in other paradigms (Pinillos 2012; Sripada & Stanley 2012; but see Buckwalter & Schaffer 2015, for a critique). Regardless of how these debates are resolved, recent experimental work seems to have established, at a very minimum, that the pattern of people’s epistemic intuitions is not quite the way it was assumed to be within the previous non-experimental literature.

A second question concerns the relationship between knowledge and belief. Clearly, a mental state can only count as knowledge if it satisfies certain conditions that go beyond anything that would be required for the state to count as belief. Thus, there can be cases in which a person believes that p but does not know that p. A question arises, however, as to whether the converse also holds. That is, a question arises as to whether a mental state must satisfy certain conditions to count as a belief that go beyond what would be required for it to count as knowledge. Can there be cases in which a person knows that p but does not believe that p?

Strikingly, a series of studies suggest that people do attribute knowledge in certain cases in which they would not be willing to attribute belief (Myers-Schulz & Schwitzgebel 2013; see also Murray et al. 2013; Rose & Schaffer 2013; Buckwalter et al. 2015; Shields 2016). In one study, participants were given a vignette about a student taking a history test who faces the question: “What year did Queen Elizabeth die?” She has reviewed this date many times, but at that one moment, she is flustered by the pressure and can’t recall the answer. She therefore decides just to guess, and she writes down ‘1603.’ In fact, this is the correct answer. When given this vignette, experimental participants tended to say that (a) the student knows that Queen Elizabeth died in 1603 but to deny that (b) she believes that Queen Elizabeth died in 1603 (Myers-Schulz & Schwitzgebel 2013, drawing on a vignette from Radford). Similar effects have been obtained for numerous other cases (Murray et al. 2013; Rose & Schaffer 2013; Buckwalter et al. 2015; Shields 2016).

Research in this area aims to understand why this effect arises and what implications it has for epistemology. One view is that people’s concept of belief truly does involve certain conditions that are not required by their concept of knowledge (Myers-Schulz & Schwitzgebel 2013). An alternative view is that there is more than one sense of ‘belief,’ such that knowledge requires the mental state picked out by one of the senses but not the other. Within work that adopts this latter approach, there have been a number of more specific suggestions about how to spell out the difference between the two senses and what relation each has to the ordinary concept of knowledge (Rose & Schaffer 2013; Buckwalter et al. 2015).

Experimental epistemology has also explored numerous other issues. A series of studies indicate that people actually do attribute knowledge in ‘fake barn’ cases (Colaço et al. 2014; Turri 2017). Others show that judgments about whether a person’s mental state counts as knowledge depend on whether that person’s evidence comes from facts about an object itself or from statistical base rates (Friedman & Turri 2015). Still others have explored issues at the intersection of formal semantics and epistemology, exploring the impact of specific linguistic factors on knowledge attributions (Schaffer & Szabó 2014).

2.5 Other Topics

We have been focusing in on four specific areas in which there have been especially prominent contributions from experimental philosophy, but we should emphasize that it is not as though the majority of experimental philosophy research falls into one or another of these areas. On the contrary, research in experimental philosophy is highly diverse, and it has actually been getting steadily more heterogeneous in recent years.

First, experimental philosophers have been pursuing an ever more diverse array of topics. On one hand, there has been a surge of experimental research using more formal, mathematical tools, including work on causation using Bayes nets (e.g., Livengood & Rose 2016). and work in formal semantics on everything from gradable adjectives to conditionals to epistemic modals (Liao & Meskin 2017; Cariani & Rips 2017; Khoo 2015). On the other, there has been a proliferation of work addressing core topics in the humanities, including art, religion and even questions at the intersection of experimental philosophy and the history of philosophy (De Cruz & De Smedt 2016; Liao et al. 2014; Nichols 2015).

Secondly one finds an ever-growing diversity of experimental methods. There are still plenty of studies that proceed by giving participants vignettes and asking for their intuitions, but in contemporary experimental philosophy, one also finds studies using corpora (Reuter 2011), reaction times (Philips & Cushman 2017), neuroimaging (Greene et al. 2001), even studies that look at whether ethics professors actually behave ethically (Schwitzgebel & Rust 2014).

Finally, and perhaps most noticeably, there is an increasingly close connection between research in experimental philosophy and research in psychology. For example, the experimental research program on intuitions about trolley problems has been dominated by contributions from psychology (e.g., Cushman et al. 2006; Wiegmann et al. 2012), but there have also been important contributions from philosophers (e.g., Mikhail 2011; Kahane & Shackel 2008). Conversely, there have been numerous recent papers in psychology that aim to contribute to research programs that originated in experimental philosophy (Samland & Waldmann 2016; Feldman & Chandrashekar forthcoming; Starmans & Friedman 2012).

3. Challenges to Experimental Philosophy

As is the case with any healthy research area, there is lots of dispute about issues within experimental philosophy. There are disagreements about particular studies, the implications of different kinds of results, and so on. But there are also broad challenges to the very idea that experimental philosophy research could prove helpful in addressing the philosophical questions. We focus here on three of the most prominent of these challenges.

3.1 Disputing the Role of Intuitions in Philosophy

As we’ve seen, much work in experimental philosophy presupposes that intuitions play an important role in philosophical inquiry. Work in the negative program characteristically starts with the assumption that intuitions play a central role in the philosophical tradition. Outside of the negative program, experimental philosophers want to understand what people’s intuitions are about philosophical matters and why they have these intuitions. Several philosophers, however, challenge the role of intuitions in philosophy in ways that also pose a challenge to the philosophical significance of much experimental philosophy.

3.1.1 Philosophers don’t rely on intuitions

One way to reject the role of intuitions is simply to deny that philosophers use intuitions as justification for their views (Williamson 2007; Cappelen 2012; Deutsch 2009, 2010, 2015). According to such “intuition deniers”, the experimental investigation of intuitions is thoroughly irrelevant to philosophy (e.g., Cappelen 2012: 1; for discussion, Nado 2016). Obviously if this is right, then the negative program is arguing against a thoroughly mistaken conception of philosophy.

Although work in metaphilosophy often assumes that philosophers use intuitions as evidence, this is exactly what is challenged by intuition deniers. It is granted on all sides that philosophers sometimes mention intuitions, but according to the intuition deniers, intuitions are not integral to the philosophical work. In particular, intuition deniers maintain that a careful inspection of philosophical practice reveals that philosophers don’t rely on intuitions to justify philosophical views; rather, philosophers rely on arguments (see, e.g., Cappelen 2012: 170; Deutsch 2009: 451).

There have been several responses to the intuition deniers, but perhaps the most prominent response to is that the arguments of intuition deniers depend on an implausibly strong conception of the notion of intuition (e.g., Chalmers 2014; Devitt 2015; Weinberg 2014). Once we focus on a less demanding notion of intuition, it’s plausible that philosophers often rely on intuitions as evidence for philosophical theses (Devitt 2015). Indeed, some have argued that for classic examples like Gettier cases, it’s hard to see how the argument works if it doesn’t rely on intuitions (see, e.g., Brown 2017; Sytsma & Livengood 2015: 92–93) Experimental philosophers have also argued against intuition deniers on experimental grounds, noting that a recent study found that over 50% of philosophers agree with the statement “intuitions are useful for justifying philosophical claims” (Kuntz & Kuntz 2011; see Sytsma & Livengood 2015: 91).

3.1.2 Philosophers shouldn’t rely on intuitions

A rather different way to challenge the study of intuitions in experimental philosophy is to deny that the study of intuitions is an apt subject matter for philosophical inquiry. On this view, we can grant that it’s a fact that philosophers rely on intuitions, but it’s a lamentable fact. The use of intuitions in philosophy is misguided for reasons that have nothing in particular to do with experimental philosophy—the appeal to intuitions is a relic, which should be rejected because it doesn’t actually answer the philosophical questions. This conclusion threatens positive applications of experimental philosophy (see, e.g., sections 2.2–2.4), but is of course, perfectly consistent with the conclusion urged by the negative program in experimental philosophy (section 2.1).

One influential argument against the use of intuitions builds on the rejection of descriptivist theories of reference, according to which concepts refer to kinds via a set of associated descriptions. In place of descriptivism, some maintain that concepts refer in virtue of the function of the concept (e.g., Millikan 2000). Other views maintain that concepts refer in virtue of a causal chain connecting the concept to the kind (Putnam 1973). On these anti-descriptivist views, people can have wildly mistaken intuitions regarding the application of their concepts. As a result, probing lay intuitions might be an ineffective way to investigate the kinds of things to which our concepts refer (e.g., Fischer 2015; Kornblith 2002).

Anti-descriptivism itself doesn’t entail that appeal to intuitions is philosophically irrelevant. Indeed, some of the most influential arguments against descriptivist theories of reference seem to depend on intuitions (Devitt 2015). However, some argue that rather than relying on intuitions about kinds, we should investigate the kinds themselves. So, if the concept knowledge picks out a natural kind, we can consult the distribution and characteristics of knowledge as it is instantiated in the world. Using intuitions to understand knowledge would be like using intuitions to understand gold. The way we come to understand the nature of gold is to examine samples of gold rather than people’s intuitions about gold. Similarly, the way to understand knowledge is to examine samples of knowledge as it presents in animals, rather than people’s intuitions about knowledge (Kornblith 2002). To examine knowledge by intuitions is at best inefficient, and at worst a complete distraction from the task of understanding what knowledge is. This objection is primarily directed at traditional forms of conceptual analysis, but insofar as experimental philosophy focuses on intuitions, it is in the same leaky boat (Kornblith 2013: 197).

The claim that philosophers shouldn’t rely on intuitions constitutes a broad attack on conceptual analysis, in both its traditional and experimental guises. Not surprisingly, there have been several defenses of the importance of intuitions for doing philosophy. For instance, some philosophers argue that in order even to pick out the kind of interest, we need to rely on our intuitive sense of what belongs in the category (e.g., Goldman 2015). To determine the characteristics of knowledge, we need to have a way of picking out which items are genuine members of the kind, and for this we must rely on our intuitive understanding of knowledge. In addition, if we reject outright the appeal to what intuitively belongs to a category, it’s hard to make sense of the intelligibility of eliminativism (e.g., Bermúdez 2006: 305), since eliminativists typically argue that there is a mismatch between intuitive notions of, e.g., free will, and the kinds of things in the world. To give up on the significance of characterizing our intuitive commitments is to preemptively exclude eliminativist views, which have long been regarded as of central philosophical interest.

3.2 Defending Privileged Intuitions Rather Than Those of Ordinary Experimental Participants

A second objection would be that even if intuitions do matter, we should not be concerned with just any old kind of intuition. Rather, our concern should be with a distinctive class of intuitions. For example, research in philosophy has traditionally been conducted by trained philosophers who spent years thinking about difficult problems. There is good reason to suspect that the intuitions generated by this type of process will have a special sort of epistemic status, and perhaps these sorts of intuitions can play a legitimate role in philosophy. By contrast, the intuitions explored within experimental philosophy research tend to be those of ordinary folks, with no prior background in philosophy, and one might think that intuitions of this latter type have no real philosophical significance.

One way of spelling out this concern is in terms of what has come to be known as the expertise objection. The key contention here is that trained philosophers have a distinctive type of expertise. Thus, if we want to understand the process at the core of traditional philosophical practice, we need to study people who have this type of expertise. It is no good just looking at the judgments of people who have never taken a single philosophy course. A number of philosophers have developed objections along more or less these lines though with important differences (Williamson 2007; Ludwig 2007).

This is an important objection, and to address it, experimental philosophers launched a major effort to study the intuitions of trained philosophers. The results show that trained philosophers still show order effects (Schwitzgebel & Cushman 2012), actor/observer effects (Tobia et al. 2013), and effects of temperament (Schulz, Cokely, & Feltz 2011). Thus, existing work provides at least some evidence against the claim that trained philosophers have a distinctive expertise that allows them to escape the sorts of biases that plague the judgments of ordinary folks.

Of course, there are numerous ways of defending the objection against this type of response. It could be argued that although philosophers do not have an ability to avoid biases of the type studied within experimental philosophy, their judgments do differ from those of ordinary folks in some other important respect. Similarly, it could be argued that what gives certain intuitions their privileged epistemic state is not the fact that they come from a particular type of person (trained philosophers) but rather the fact that they are the product of a particular way of approaching the question (sustained reflection) (see, e.g., Kauppinen 2007).

3.3 But is it Philosophy?

Finally, it might be objected that experimental philosophy simply isn’t philosophy at all. On this view, there are certain properties that differentiate work in philosophy from work in other disciplines. Research in experimental philosophy lacks these properties and is therefore best understood as falling outside the philosophical tradition entirely. Note that this last objection is not concerned with the question as to whether experimental philosophy has any value but rather with the question as to whether it should be considered part of a particular discipline. As one recent paper puts it,

… what is at issue is not whether there is room for such empirical study, but whether there is room for it now as a branch of philosophy. (Sorell forthcoming: 6)

In actual practice, debate over this objection has tended to focus on questions in the history of philosophy. Clearly, numerous philosophers from Aristotle through Nietzsche were deeply concerned with empirical questions about human nature, so it might seem that the default view, at least in the absence of any counterarguments, should be that work on these issues can indeed count as philosophy. The key question, then, is whether there are any legitimate counterarguments.

One possible argument would be that although the people we now regard as philosophers did work on these issues, this aspect of their work should not be regarded as falling within the discipline of philosophy. Anthony Appiah questions this gambit:

You would have a difficult time explaining to most of the canonical philosophers that this part of the work was echt philosophy and that part of their work was not. Trying to separate out the “metaphysical” from the “psychological” elements in this corpus is like trying to peel a raspberry. (Appiah 2008: 13)

According to this response, there is a well-established practice within the history of philosophy of exploring empirical and psychological questions, and it is actually the idea of carefully separating the psychological from the philosophical that should be regarded as a departure from philosophical tradition.

More recent work on these issues has been concerned especially with the early modern period. It has been noted that some of the most prominent philosophers in this period actually conducted experimental studies (Sytsma & Livengood 2015), and some explicitly referred to themselves as ‘experimental philosophers’ (Anstey & Vanzo 2016). Though contemporary experimental philosophy obviously differs in certain respects from these historical antecedents, one might argue that the work of contemporary experimental philosophers is best understood as a continuation of this broad historical tradition.

On the other side, it has been argued that this historical continuity picture fails to take account of a change in the use of the word ‘philosophy’ (Sorell forthcoming). In the Renaissance, physics was referred to as ‘philosophy,’ but we would not say that all research in contemporary physics belongs in the discipline of philosophy. Similarly, even if work on the psychology of moral judgment was historically classified as philosophy, one might think that it should not be regarded today as falling into the discipline of philosophy but rather into a distinct discipline.

Certainly, partisans on both sides of this debate should agree that the boundaries of a discipline can change over time, but this point cuts both ways. Just as the boundaries of a discipline may have changed in the past, they can change in the future. It will therefore be interesting to see how the boundaries of the discipline of philosophy evolve over the course of the next few decades and how this evolution impacts the status of experimental philosophy.


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We’d like to thank Jonathan Weinberg, the editors, and an anonymous referee for helpful comments on some of this material.

Copyright © 2017 by
Joshua Knobe
Shaun Nichols

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