Feminist Perspectives on the Self

First published Mon Jun 28, 1999; substantive revision Wed Feb 19, 2020

The topic of the self has long been salient in feminist philosophy, for it is pivotal to questions about personal identity, the body, sociality, and agency that feminism must address. Simone de Beauvoir’s provocative declaration, “He is the Subject, he is the Absolute—she is the Other”, signals the central importance of the self for feminism. To be the Other is to be a non-subject, a non-agent—in short, a mere thing. Women’s selfhood has been systematically subordinated or even outright denied by law, customary practice, and cultural stereotypes. Throughout history, women have been identified either as inferior versions of men or as their direct opposite, characterized through their perceived differences from men; in both cases, women have been denigrated on the basis of these views. Since women have been cast as lesser forms of the masculine individual, the paradigm of the self that has gained ascendancy in Western philosophy and U.S. popular culture is derived from a masculine prototype. Feminists contend that the experiences of predominantly white and heterosexual, mostly economically advantaged men who have wielded social, economic, and political power and who have dominated the arts, literature, the media, and scholarship have been taken as universal and ideal. As a result, feminists have argued that the self is not only a metaphysical issue for philosophy, but one that is also ethical, epistemological, social, and political.

Responding to this state of affairs, feminist philosophical work on the self has taken three main tacks: (1) critiques of dominant modern, Western views of the self, (2) reclamations of feminine identities, and (3) reconceptualizations of the self as (a) a dynamic, relational individual beholden to unconscious desires and social bonds and (b) intersectional and even heterogeneous. The feminist reconceptualizations of the self have challenged standard philosophical models for their biases and shifted the discipline toward recognizing selfhood as a relational, multilayered phenomenon. This entry will survey both critical and constructive feminist approaches to the self.

1. Critique of Classical Approaches to Selfhood

Modern philosophy in the West championed the individual. Extending into contemporary moral and political thought is the idea that the self is a free, rational chooser and actor—an autonomous agent. Two views of the self dominate this milieu: a Kantian ethical subject and a utilitarian “homo economicus”. Nevertheless, these two views differ in their emphasis. The Kantian ethical subject uses reason to transcend cultural norms and personal preferences in order to discover absolute truth, whereas homo economicus uses reason to rank desires in a coherent order and to figure out how to maximize desire satisfaction with the instrumental rationality of the marketplace. Both of these conceptions of the self minimize the personal and ethical import of unchosen circumstances, interpersonal relationships, and biosocial forces. They isolate the individual from its relationships and environment, as well as reinforcing a modern binary that divides the social sphere into autonomous agents and dependents. For the Kantian ethical subject, emotional and social bonds imperil objectivity and undermine rational commitment to duty. For homo economicus, it makes no difference which forces shape one’s desires, provided they do not result from coercion or fraud, and one’s ties to other people are to be factored into one’s calculations along with the rest of one’s desires. For these prevailing conceptions of the self, structural domination and subordination are thought not to penetrate the “inner citadel” of selfhood. The multiple, sometimes fractious sources of social identity constituted at the intersections of one’s gender, sexual orientation, race, class, age, ethnicity, ability, and so forth, are ignored. Likewise, these conceptions deny the complexity of the intrapsychic world of unconscious fantasies, fears, and desires, and they overlook the ways in which such dynamics intrude upon conscious life. The modern philosophical construct of the rational subject projects a self that is not prey to ambivalence, anxiety and depression, obsession, prejudice, hatred, or violence. A disembodied mind, the body is peripheral—a source of desires for homo economicus to weigh and a distracting temptation to the Kantian ethical subject. Age, looks, sexuality, biological composition, and physical competencies are considered extraneous to the self.

Yet, as valuable as rational analysis and free choice undoubtedly are, some feminists argue that these capacities do not operate apart from the phenomenon we call the self. As such, feminist philosophers have charged that dominant views of the self as rational and independent are fundamentally misleading. Although represented as genderless, raceless, ageless, and classless, feminists argue that the Kantian subject and homo economicus mask a white, healthy, youthfully middle-aged, middle- or upper-class, heterosexual, cisgender male citizen. On the Kantian view, he is an impartial judge deliberating about applying universal principles, while on the utilitarian view, he is a self-interested bargainer wheeling and dealing in the marketplace.

It is no accident that law and commerce are both public domains from which women have historically been excluded. It is no accident, either, that the philosophers who originated these views of the self typically endorsed this exclusion. Deeming women emotional and unprincipled, these thinkers advocated confining women to the private domestic sphere where their voices could be neutralized and even transformed into virtues, in the role of empathetic, supportive wife, vulnerable sexual partner, and nurturing mother. Associated with bodies rather than minds, women were tasked with the maintenance of their own bodies and those of others in a gendered division of labor (Rawlinson 2016). The division of values along binary gendered lines has historically been associated with the valorization of the masculine and the stigmatization of the feminine. The masculine realm of rational selfhood is a realm of moral decency, principled respect for duties, and prudent good sense. However, femininity has been associated with a sentimental attachment to loved ones that spawns favoritism and compromises principles. Likewise, femininity is associated with immersion in the unpredictable domestic exigencies of the private sphere, while the masculinized self appears as a sturdy fortress of integrity in the public domain of dutiful citizenship. The self is essentially masculine, and the masculine self is essentially good and wise.

Some feminist philosophers modify and defend these conceptions of the self, taking issue only with women’s historical exclusion from them and claiming they should be extended to include women. However, the decontextualized individualism and abstraction of reason from other capacities inherent in these two dominant views trouble many feminist philosophers and have led them to seek alternative perspectives on the self. Many claim that the misogynist heritage of the Kantian subject and homo economicus cannot be remedied simply by advocating equal selves for women. Rather, these very conceptions of the self are gendered. In Western culture, the mind and reason are coded masculine, whereas the body and emotion are coded feminine (Irigaray 1985b; Lloyd 1984). To identify the self with the rational mind is, then, to masculinize the self according to entrenched stereotypes. Far from being apolitical, this conception of the self perpetuates neoliberal inequalities by teaching women to value economic success and social independence in a way that requires the continual exploitation of other, less privileged, women (Oksala 2016; Arruzza, Bhattacharya, and Fraser 2019).

The philosophical preeminence of the masculine over the feminine rests on untenable assumptions about the transparency of the self, the immunity of the self to social influences, and the reliability of reason to correct distorted moral judgment. People grow up in social environments saturated with culturally normative prejudice and implicit bias, even in communities where overt forms of bigotry are strictly proscribed (Meyers 1994). Although official norms uphold the values of equality and tolerance, cultures continue to transmit camouflaged messages of the inferiority of historically subordinated social groups through stereotypes and other imagery. These deeply ingrained schemas commonly structure attitudes, perceptions, behavioral habits, judgment, and compassion or empathy despite the individual’s conscious good will (Fischer 2014; Sullivan 2001 and 2015; Valian 1998; Collins 1990). As Kate Manne elaborates, misogynist norms skew empathy in favor of men in what she calls “himpathy” (Manne 2019). These norms also render societies more likely to believe the testimony of those who are privileged and to diminish the perspectives of those not considered objective, rational knowers (Fricker 2007). As a result, people often consider themselves objective and fair while systematically discriminating against “different” others (Piper 1990; Young 1990). Such prejudice cannot be dispelled through rational reflection alone (Meyers 1994; Al-Saji 2014). In effect, then, the conception of the unbiased rational self countenances “innocent” wrongdoing and reinforcement of the social stratification that privileges an elite whom this conception takes as paradigmatic.

The nullification of women’s selfhood was once explicitly codified in Anglo-European and American law. The legal doctrine of coverture held that a woman’s personhood was absorbed into that of her husband when she married (McDonagh 1996). Assuming her husband’s surname symbolized the denial of the wife’s separate identity. In addition, coverture deprived the wife of her right to bodily integrity, since rape and other forms of physical abuse within marriage were not recognized as crimes. She lost her right to owning property, controlling her own earnings, and making contracts in her own name. Lacking the right to vote or serve on juries, she was a second-class citizen whose enfranchised husband purportedly represented her politically. Although coverture has been rescinded, vestiges of this denial of women’s selfhood can be discerned in recent legal rulings and in contemporary culture. For example, pregnant women remain vulnerable to legally sanctioned violations of their bodily integrity and legal autonomy, especially if they lack race and class privilege (Bordo 1993; Brown 1998). Selflessness remains the pregnant woman’s legal status. Moreover, the stereotype of feminine selflessness still thrives in the popular imagination. Any self-confident, self-assertive woman is out of step with prevalent gender norms, and a mother who is not unstintingly devoted to her children is likely to be perceived as selfish or even a welfare “fraud” and to face severe social censure and deprivation of social services (Sparks, 2015).

Complementing this line of argument, a number of feminists argue that the very ideal of an independent, rational self has invidious social consequences. To realize this ideal, it is necessary to repress inner conflict and to police the rigid boundaries of a purified self. Alien desires and impulses are consigned to the unconscious, but this unconscious material inevitably intrudes upon conscious life and influences people’s attitudes and desires. In particular, the feared and despised Other within is projected onto “other” social groups, and hatred and contempt are redirected at these imagined enemies (Kristeva 1988 [1991]; McAfee 2019; Scheman 1993). Misogyny and other forms of bigotry are thus borne of the demand that the self be decisive, invulnerable, and unitary together with the impossibility of meeting this demand. Worse still, these irrational hatreds cannot be cured unless this demand for self-mastery is repudiated, but to repudiate it is to be resigned to a degraded, feminized self whose concerns are not taken seriously. Indeed, all-too-often women’s protests are dismissed as those of a hysteric or killjoy (Ahmed 2017). Far from functioning as the guarantor of moral probity, the fictive Kantian self is the condition for the possibility of intractable animosity and injustice.

A further problem with the traditional modern views from a feminist standpoint is that they fail to furnish an account of internalized oppression and the process of overcoming it. It is common for women to comport themselves in a feminine fashion, to scale down their aspirations, and to embrace gender-compliant goals (Irigaray 1985a; Bartky 1990; Babbitt 1993; Cudd 2006; Beauvoir 1949 [2011]). Feminists account for this phenomenon by explaining that women internalize patriarchal norms: these norms are integrated into the cognitive, emotional, and conative structure of the self. Women may contribute to their own oppression without realizing it. At times, warped norms may even lead women to question their own sanity through a process that Kate Abramson terms “gaslighting”. A gaslighted woman may lose her sense of self to the point where depression and grieving is appropriate (Abramson 2014). Once embedded in a woman’s psychic economy, internalized oppression conditions her core desires. To maximize desire-satisfaction, then, would be to collaborate in her own oppression. Homo economicus’s equation of fulfillment with desire-satisfaction is unable to get out of this bind.

Finally, in dominant conceptions of the self, no one seems to be born and raised, for caregivers and birth mothers are driven offstage (Irigaray 1985b; Baier 1987; Code 1987; Held 1987; Willett 1995 and 2001; Kittay 1999; LaChance Adams and Lundquist 2012). The self appears to materialize on its own with a starter set of basic physical desires and rational skills. No one’s powers ever seem to deteriorate or change in different contexts. Since dependency and vulnerability are denied, all affiliations are assumed to be freely chosen, and all transactions freely negotiated. The repudiation of caregiving underwrites the voluntaristic illusion of independence that characterizes the Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus—and it is no coincidence here that caregiving has traditionally been women’s work. Alternative virtues, such as care, love, tenderness, spontaneity, and interdependence are registered as defeats for the “Man with the Plan” rather than aspects of resilient selfhood and a fluid sense of agency (Baier 1987; Koziej 2019). The mother cultivating a “social erotic” between herself and her infant through the dance of affect attunements (Willett 1995 and 2001), like the lover embracing the unexpected, transgress rigid modern norms of selfhood.

Feminist critique exposes the partiality of the ostensibly universal Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus. These conceptions of the self are: (1) androcentric because they replicate masculine stereotypes and ideals; (2) sexist because they demean anything that smacks of the feminine; (3) masculinist because they help to perpetuate male dominance; and (4) elitist because they perpetuate other associated biases, including heterosexist, transphobic, racist, ethnocentric, ableist, classist, and, arguably, speciesist biases (Haraway 2008). While the latter dimensions of these prevalent conceptions of the self are outside the scope of this article, these problems cannot be disentangled from the larger critique and efforts at reconceptualizing a self that do not duplicate the modernist Anglo-European structures of dominance.

2. Reclamation of Feminine Identities and Women’s Status

These oversights necessitate reconceptualizing the self in at least two respects. To account for features of the self that have been traditionally overlooked, such as interdependence and vulnerability, the self must be understood as socially situated and relational. To account for the self’s ability to discern and resist ingrained cultural norms, the moral subject must not be reduced to the capacity for reason. For many feminists, to acknowledge the self’s dependency is not to devalue the self but rather to value vulnerability (Code 2011), as well as to call into question the supposed free agency of a self that implicitly corresponds to a masculine ideal.

Yet one might worry that revaluing dependency risks perpetuating derogatory views of women as victim and men as agents and/or entrenching a gender binary that divides values into masculine and feminine. A focus on dependency and care may additionally risk conflating women with mothers and nurturers in what Patrice DiQuinzio has called “essential motherhood” (1999). Arguing that moral virtues truly have no gender, Mary Wollstonecraft regards “feminine” virtues as perversions of these true virtues and laments women’s conscription into a bogus ideal (Wollstonecraft 1792). Similarly, Simone de Beauvoir labels women under patriarchy “mutilated” and “immanent” (Beauvoir 1949 [2011]). Socialized to objectify themselves, women are said to become narcissistic, small-minded, and dependent on others’ approval. Excluded from careers, waiting to be chosen by their future husbands, taken over by natural forces during pregnancy, and busy with tedious, repetitive housework, women never become transcendent agents. For Beauvoir, they often resist the burden of responsibility for their own freedom.

This portrayal of women as abject victims of the patriarchal family has been challenged and modulated in contemporary feminist philosophy. We shall review three major reclamation strategies: (1) revaluing the traditionally “feminine” activities of mothering and other modes of social bonding through the development of care ethics and eros ethics; (2) rethinking autonomy by moving beyond the two traditional models described above; and (3) reclaiming sexual difference through a symbolic analysis of female identity.

Feminists argue that pregnancy, birth, and mothering reveal important features of the self, even for humans who do not have these experiences themselves. Two overlapping philosophical approaches—an ethics of care and an ethics of eros—have revalued the significance of the mother in ways that bear on the issue of the self. Both traditions emphasize that pregnancy and/or mothering reveal that agency is frequently co-constituted and dynamic. The care tradition varies among those who aim to value dependency work and/or reconceptualize autonomy so that autonomy and dependency are compatible (Gilligan 1982 and 1987; Ruddick 1989; Kittay 1999; Held 2006; Lindemann 2014). Care ethics emphasizes the value of care work and character virtues that reflect vulnerability. An ethics of eros draws from traditions of “othermothering” and emancipatory discourses of generative libidinal drives and/or cultivating a social eros of connection (Collins 1990; Irigaray 1993; Willett 1995, 2001, 2008, 2014, 2019; Lorde 2007). Social bonds may reflect a dynamic of kinship, political solidarity, or community engagement outside the nuclear family paradigm (Collins 1990; Nzegwu 2006). This tradition of eros foregrounds complicated modes of interdependency that spiral out of the autonomy/dependency binary and emphasize thick networks of social belongings. An ethics of eros emphasizes the revitalizing affects of preconscious energy and connectedness, and their creative potential for political subversion and communal practices. Here, the self is a multilayered phenomenon with a dynamic set of roles and interconnected desires.

Historically, the relation between mother and child was either excluded altogether from philosophical discourse or taken as mere preparation for a full expression of ethical selfhood. Prevalent Western views commonly invoke a tale of early dependency on the family followed by the eventual achievement of autonomy through narratives of separation and acquiring virtues of self-determination. In contrast, feminists in the care ethics and eros traditions revalue the mother-child relationship as a way of figuring the interdependency of the self. The infant’s development of creative communicative skills through affect attunement and face-to-face play explains the lifelong intensity of social bonds (Willett 1995, 2001, and 2014; Welsh 2013). Alternative traditions of maturation may feature instead a multiplicity of social roles, practices, and connections. Hilde Lindemann argues that caregiving exhibits key features of what she calls the practice of personhood of knowing when and how to hold and let go of parts of others identities (Lindemann 2014). Patricia Hill Collins offers glimpses of an erotic ethics of interconnectivity in her characterization of the fluidity of “othermothers” for black American communities (Collins 1990). Collins cites Audre Lorde’s distinct rendering of the term “eros” as not primarily sexual or narrowly maternal, but rather as an energetic drive that oppressive systems attempt to appropriate, but which may be regenerated through creative social practices. Cynthia Willett, expanding upon critical traditions of eros, argues that the laughing mother provides a subversive complement to the long-suffering, self-sacrificing maternal ideal (Willett and Willett 2019), while Mary Rawlinson advocates the generativity of mothers as an alternative to the proprietary notion of the modern self (Rawlinson 2016). Because all people are cared for by an adult or adults, and every individual is shaped by this emotionally charged interaction, the self is essentially formed in and through its relations with its caregivers (Chodorow 1981). For Chodorow, the rigidly differentiated, compulsively rational, and stubbornly independent self is a masculine defensive formation—a warped form of the relational self—that develops as a result of fathers’ negligible involvement in childcare.

Caring for a child involves a range of activities governed by a distinct set of values: protecting and caring for a fragile existence and expanding the sense of self while acknowledging the limits of one’s power and the unpredictability of events, being sensitive to the other’s very different viewpoint, and learning to love while struggling against traumatic social conditions, inadequate social services, and invasive governmental and medical interventions (Collins 1990; Brown 1998). The practice of motherhood calls upon a wide range of interpersonal, political, and reflective skills that go well beyond the deliberative reasoning that dominates traditional view of the self. For instance, the ability to empathize with others and imaginatively reconstruct their unique viewpoints is vital to moral wisdom, but ethics that base moral judgment on an abstract conception of personhood marginalize this skill (Meyers 1994). Care and eros ethicists revalue that which is traditionally deemed feminine—feeling, intimacy, and nurturance—in order to reclaim the venues traditionally associated with women and to open up a broader way of conceiving of the moral self.

Some feminists seek to rebalance autonomy with care, while others do away with autonomy altogether. For some, autonomy is an androcentric relic of modernism (Jaggar 1983; Addelson 1994; Hekman 1995; Card 1996). Others assert women’s need for autonomous self-determination (Lugones and Spelman 1983; de Lauretis 1986; King 1988; Govier 1993). Mothering itself frequently involves the need to carve space and time away from one’s child (LaChance Adams and Lundquist 2012). It may also involve a reclamation of spirited independence in the “fearless fighter” role that women reclaim as part of a maternal ethos in some cultures and/or oppressive conditions (Nzegwu 2006; Lorde 2007). In this vein, a number of feminists present accounts of autonomy that do not devalue the interpersonal capacities that are conventionally coded feminine (Mackenzie 2014 and 2017; Nedelsky 1989; Meyers 1989 and 2000; Benhabib 1999; Benjamin, 1988; Weir 1995). In feminist accounts, autonomy is not conflated with self-sufficiency and free will, but rather is seen to be facilitated by supportive relationships and to be a matter of degree (Friedman 1993). Feminist accounts also stress the autonomous individual’s need for constructive feedback and the co-creation of selves with others (Brison 2002 and 2017; Cavarero 1997; Alcoff 2017; Ahmed 2017). A feminist view opens the space for considering autonomy an ongoing and improvisational process of self-discovery, self-definition, and self-direction, rather than endorsing a set of desires and goals chosen exclusively by the individual (Meyers 1989 and 2000).

In addition to caregiving practices such as mothering, some feminists have attended to the potential of pregnancy for reconsidering autonomy and independence. Additionally, pregnancy draws attention to a uniquely intimate embodiment of self-other imbrication. Iris Marion Young argues that pregnancy is a testament to the split subject or self. For Young, pregnancy disrupts the integrity of the body. In pregnancy, the boundary between self and other breaks down, and one experiences one’s “insides as the space of another” (Young 1990). In contrast with Young, Gail Weiss suggests that pregnancy allows us to re-envision the integrity of the body: instead of positioning the pregnant body as a breakdown of the traditional unified self, pregnancy reveals that bodily integrity is always already fluid and expansive (Weiss 1999). As Talia Welsh points out, the experiences of those who are pregnant reveal that selfhood is neither unified nor genderless (Welsh 2013). It may even be that pregnancy offers a “metaphysically and phenomenologically privileged” situation for investigating the interrelation between self and other (Rodemeyer 1998).

While pregnancy affords opportunities for positively demonstrating the multiplicity of the self, it may also shed light on the violations that women face in patriarchal societies. Young points out that the interventions of obstetric medicine into women’s bodies alienate women from themselves through pathologizing their conditions, subjecting women to invasive medical technologies, and rendering women passive in the birthing process (Young 1990). The devaluation and surveillance of black and brown pregnant bodies, such as in state-induced abortions, call for greater empowerment of women rather than an automatic praise of vulnerability (Brown 1998). In the last few decades, medical technologies, such as sonography and fetal and neonatal surgery, have sometimes faced those who are pregnant with wrenching choices that test their agential resilience and capacities to care (Feder 2014; LaChance Adams and Lundquist 2012). Jennifer Scuro suggests that all pregnancies involve a death within the self because all end in an expulsion of the other’s body from oneself (Scuro 2017). All pregnancy thus dislodges presumptions of the self-possessed subject. At the same time, this expulsion of the other is not always a birth—pregnancy sometimes ends in miscarriage, when it does not end in abortion—and so pregnancy should be dissociated from childbirth.

As is evident from this analysis of pregnancy, feminist theories of selfhood frequently combine philosophical analysis with social critique and the testimony of lived experience. The latter has an especially long history within phenomenology, where feminist philosophers have been describing women’s experiences for the past century. Because phenomenology as a whole strongly emphasizes the body and first-person experience, it fits methodologically with many of the goals of feminism. Specifically, phenomenological theories of embodiment emphasize the agential nature of the lived body, resisting traditional conceptions from philosophy that make the body the mere instrument of the mind. At the same time, feminist phenomenologists resist the abstract nature of traditional phenomenological methods. For feminist phenomenology, different selves are differently positioned in ways that matter, and cannot be abstracted from their social roles into a transcendental domain of inquiry. This stands in opposition with classical phenomenology, which tended to promulgate a universalized notion of the ego that elided differences between bodies. Early women phenomenologists, such as Edith Stein and Gerda Walther, frequently analyze how traditionally feminine-coded values such as empathy and community play a part in women’s everyday lives and moral development (Stein 1996; Walther 1923). Most influentially, Simone de Beauvoir argues that the human condition is ambiguous: experience involves “immanence”, or embeddedness within one’s historico-cultural and interpersonal situation, and “transcendence”, or radical freedom with respect to one’s choices and future. While all humans shared this condition according to Beauvoir, she claims that women have been overwhelmingly associated with immanence, and thus have not been encouraged to claim their own freedom (Beauvoir 1949 [2011]). This means that their selves are generally overdetermined by their situations and contexts—what biology and others claim them to be. For Beauvoir, women should reassert their transcendence through productive projects. Beauvoir thus puts an existentialist spin on both phenomenology’s emphasis on situation and some feminists’ reclamation of autonomy. For Beauvoir, “woman” is a category imposed by society; women’s selves, then, are also in large part imposed on them by society, and women would do well to fashion their own selfhood through claiming their freedom. Yet this freedom is always co-determined in situation with others.

In recent decades, feminist phenomenologists have further investigated the living body as a site of selfhood that both reflects cultural norms and can provide a site of resistance to them. Taking inspiration from Beauvoir’s claims about ambiguity, feminist phenomenologists undertake a wide range of investigations into dimensions of women’s bodily existence. Iris Marion Young, for instance, has drawn attention to the way that women’s bodily modes of expression reflect cultural norms of immanence and objectification (Young 1990). Sandra Bartky shows that women are encouraged to take themselves as sexual objects, which alienates them from their lived bodies and encourages them to see their bodies and selves as passive (Bartky 1990). The phenomenology of embodiment is thus not separate from nexuses of social power (Oksala 2016). At the same time, phenomenological attention to conditions such as pregnancy (described above) may illuminate a more positive side of the fractious nature of women’s selves: the self, here, is multiplicitous. Conflict among roles is constitutive of the self, and it is especially salient among women in patriarchal societies (Weiss 2008). Latina feminist phenomenology has been particularly active in recent decades in reconceptualizing this multiplicitous self, as we will see in greater detail in the following section.

Feminist phenomenology also emphasizes the way that sexual violations trade on the interdependent, vulnerable, and gendered nature of the self. Sexual violence is taken by many feminists not merely to be one form of physical violence among others, but rather to be a denial of self (Cahill 2001; Brison 2002). The body for phenomenology is the dynamic site of the self, and can only be reduced to an object under oppressive social conditions (Beauvoir 1949 [2011]; Cahill 2001). As such, sexual violence cuts to the very heart of the self. Rape, for instance, alters selfhood (Cahill 2001; Brison 2002; Alcoff 2017).

Phenomenology is not the only site of feminist philosophy that underscores the body and resists the mind/body dualism characteristic of modern notions of autonomous selfhood. The contemporary fields of affect theory and new materialism have pushed feminist conceptions of embodiment and selfhood even beyond a recognition of situated relationality, sometimes arguing for a radical rupture of the self/other distinction. Sara Ahmed and Teresa Brennan suggest that affects and emotions neither go from the “inside out” nor come from the “outside in”; rather, emotions may be found within the very atmosphere of the social (Ahmed 2004; Brennan 2004). Ranjana Khanna sees affects as openings onto the other both “within” the self and beyond it (Khanna 2012). For feminist new materialisms, the body is not an individual expressive whole (as it remains in phenomenology); rather, the body is a “sexually preconstituted, dynamic bundle of relations” (Braidotti 2006) that is interconnected with the environment through intensities and flows (Grosz 1994). Feminist materialism often positions itself in contrast to poststructuralism because of the former’s emphasis on the material body, but both of these approaches underscore the radical heterogeneity, or even nonexistence, of the self. And the new materialist focus on the body, following the “cyborg” theory of Donna Haraway, suggests that biological bodies are not set in opposition to technology; rather, they are densely imbricated. Feminist materialism seeks to dislocate identities and focus on becomings (Braidotti 2016).

New materialism in particular has been influenced by the work of poststructuralist Luce Irigaray, who draws on the imagery of the female body to offer an alternative to masculine models of autonomy. Irigaray plays off the symbol of the vaginal lips to figure a mode of selfhood in which the body is always already two, a self-touching organism that is multiplicitous (Irigaray 1985b and 1993). Through this gesture, Irigaray reclaims the association of the feminine with the body in the face of masculine dreams of separatist autonomy. Through her strategy of “mimesis”, Irigaray utilizes the very stereotypes that have been used against women in order to undermine them: she plays on the traditional conception of woman as the “other”, the mere body, the passive “mirror” of the male subject. She depicts an erotic love of self that affirms difference within oneself and allows the self-differentiating subject to connect with others. She also resists the very idea of identity as presuming a unified, phallocentric model of selfhood (Irigaray 1985b).

These and other reclamations of female identities have prompted a number of significant reconceptualizations of the self as relational and multilayered.

3. Reconceptualizations of the Self

3.1 The Dynamic and Relational Self

As we have seen, many feminist philosophers argue that it is a mistake to hold that rationality alone is essential to the self and that the ideal self is transparent, unified, coherent, and independent, since they discern misogynist subtexts in the atomistic individualism of the Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus (see section 1). While some feminists argue for a relational model of autonomy, others reject the narrative of separation from the maternal sphere as an overarching framing device for maturation. Drawing upon multicultural and global sources, they see this narrative arc as falling short of the complex dynamics of a multilayered, interconnected self that may grow through sustained interactions through its community rather than in decisive breaks from them. In this section, we take up new conceptions of the relational self. These conceptions involve novel contributions to the philosophy of selfhood, sometimes drawing on frameworks from traditions such as poststructuralism, psychoanalysis, narrative theory, and local knowledges. Feminist philosophers gravitate toward these approaches to understanding selfhood because they do not share the drawbacks that prompt feminist critiques of the Kantian ethical subject and homo economicus. None of these approaches regards the self as homogeneous or transparent; none removes the self from its cultural or interpersonal setting; none sidelines the body.

Taking a psychoanalytic approach, Julia Kristeva maintains that infants gradually develop autonomy from their caregivers, but complicates this narrative by transposing the classical Freudian conception of the self and its distinction between consciousness and the unconscious into an explicitly gendered framework (Kristeva 1980; Oliver 1993; McAfee 2003; Miller 2014). For Kristeva, the self is a subject of enunciation—a speaker who can use the pronoun “I”. But speakers are neither unitary nor fully in control of what they say because discourse is bifurcated. The symbolic dimension of language, which is characterized by referential signs and linear logic, corresponds to consciousness and control. The semiotic dimension of language, which is characterized by figurative language, cadences, and intonations, corresponds to the unruly, passion-fueled unconscious. All discourse combines elements of both registers. This contention connects Kristeva’s account to feminist concerns about gender and the self. Since the rational orderliness of the symbolic is culturally coded masculine, while the affect-laden allure of the semiotic is culturally coded feminine, it follows that no discourse is purely masculine or purely feminine. The masculine symbolic and the feminine semiotic are equally indispensable to the speaking subject, whatever this individual’s socially assigned gender may be. Every self amalgamates masculine and feminine discursive modalities.

Like the unconscious in classical psychoanalytic theory, the semiotic decenters the self. One may try to express one’s thoughts in definite, straightforward language, yet because of the semiotic aspects of one’s utterances, what one says carries no single meaning and is amenable to being interpreted in more than one way. In Kristeva’s view, this is all to the good, for accessing the semiotic—that which is conveyed, often inadvertently, by the style of an utterance—kindles social critique. The semiotic gives expression to repressed, unconscious material. According to Kristeva, what society systematically represses provides clues to what is oppressive about society and how society needs to be changed. Thus, she discerns a vital ethical potential in the semiotic (Kristeva 1983 [1987]). Since this ethical potential is explicitly linked to the feminine, moreover, Kristeva’s account of the self displaces “masculine” adherence to principle as the prime mode of ethical agency and recognizes the urgent need for a “feminine” ethical approach. At the same time, Kristeva’s questionable-subject-in-process seems for some to enshrine the very gender dichotomy that causes women so much grief. The association of the woman/mother with the unruly and ambiguous semiotic may obscure the rich affect attunement and preverbal dialogues between caregivers and their socially-oriented infants (Willett 1995). Kelly Oliver’s interpretation of Kristeva resists some of these more gendered components of Kristeva’s view and expands upon the relational self as a capacity for a loving sense of “response-ability” to otherness and difference (Oliver 1998). For Oliver, the self is fluidly defined by its openness to others.

In contrast with the revaluing of motherhood and/or femininity that Kristeva and others undertake (see section 2), poststructuralists, critical race theorists, and trans* feminists have been vocal about the heterosexist and binary assumptions in some feminist conceptions of the self, as well as their inattention to other forms of difference among women. In the face of this, many feminists have offered accounts of the self designed to accommodate a wider range of differences. The earlier work of poststructuralist Judith Butler maintains that personal identity is an illusion (Butler 1990). The self is merely an unstable discursive node, and sexed/gendered identity is a “corporeal style”—the imitation and repeated enactment of norms, frequently ones that are demanded by cultural contexts. For Butler, psychodynamic accounts of the self such as Kristeva’s camouflage the performative nature of the self and collaborate in the cultural conspiracy that maintains the illusion that one has an anchored identity derived from one’s biological nature (manifested in one’s genitalia). Such accounts perniciously conceal the ways that normalizing regimes of the state and culture deploy power to enforce “natural” sexed/gendered bodies together with “unnatural” bodies, obscuring the arbitrariness of the constraints that are being imposed in order to deflect resistance to them. The solution, in Butler’s view, is to question the categories of biological sex, gender, and sexuality that serve as markers of personal identity. Sex, gender, and sexuality are at the very “core” of self-identity, because self-identity is constructed through modes of power. Thus, resistance may be developed in enacting one’s identity differently, through unorthodox performances and parodic identities: the construction of identity is a site of political contestation. Butler’s more recent work continues to emphasize the relationality of the self through its dispossession by the very discursive structures that call the self into existence (Butler 2005).

Butler is also a major contributor to feminist theories of narrative identity, one of the most important strands of contemporary feminist theories of the self. Feminist narrative views of the self are prominent in both Anglo-American and Continental traditions of philosophy. Adriana Cavarero promulgates the “narratable self” as an alternative to the self-constituting subject of traditional philosophy (Cavarero 1997). This self does not have a premium on self-narration; rather, others may actually have a better handle on one’s own self. For this reason, narrating oneself must occur within a communal, political context. Subjectivity is necessarily inclined toward others (Cavarero 1997). Butler, in part drawing on Cavarero’s views, suggests that the self is constructed in an ongoing fashion through giving an account of itself to others (Butler 2005). Linda Martín Alcoff combines poststructuralism with a hermeneutic approach, declaring that social identities are relational and core to narratives of the self (Alcoff 2006). Memory has long been seen as a locus of self-identity, and narrating one’s life story is crucially linked with memory. Yet feminists contend that narration and memory are relational, often involving communal social practices (Brison 2002; Campbell 2003). Rather than promulgating an ideal of self-knowledge, which presumes a fixed self that a reliable, rational knower discovers at the core of everyday life, feminist narrative theorists advocate self-cultivation within contextual practices. Here we see again that for feminists, the ontology and metaphysics of selfhood are inseparable from ethical, social, and political domains.

This is also the case for strands of queer and trans* theory as they intersect with feminist approaches. For trans* theorists, metaphysical questions about identity operate within dominant discourses that frequently perpetuate violence and transphobia, as well as within queer and transgender subcultures that redefine gender and sex identities in a dynamic, collaborative fashion (Bettcher 2014, 2016, 2017a, 2017b). Trans feminist Talia Mae Bettcher pushes back on narratives of trans identity that are modeled on liberal individualist models of selfhood, such as the idea that a trans individual might have been “trapped in the wrong body” and, after coming out, may let their core true self come to the surface (Bettcher 2014). Bettcher contends that the idea of a true gendered self at the core of a person overlooks the ways that gender and sex are created by culture (Bettcher 2014). It also tends to entrench mind-body dualism, whereas movements such as phenomenology have shown that gendered embodiment is a very feature of selfhood. In this vein, Bettcher argues that sexism and transphobia trade on a presumed hierarchy where one’s “proper” appearance, or clothed appearance in public, is taken to be subordinate to one’s “intimate” appearance when naked. For Bettcher, these two forms of appearance are in fact on par, since both are culturally constituted.

Trans* feminist accounts frequently underscore the relationality of the self, including the potential that others have to define us. If others did not have such power, internalized sources of psychic discord such as gender dysphoria, and the desire that many trans* folks express for recognition or “passing”, would be difficult to explain. It would also be difficult to explain transphobia: as Alexis Shotwell and Trevor Sangrey argue, cisgender individuals’ resistance to recognizing trans* identities hinges on the fact that trans* gender expression affects cisgender identity (Shotwell and Sangrey 2009). Shotwell and Sangrey draw on the feminist theory of selfhood put forth by Brison to develop this argument. And, while the relational constitution of gender identity within a given culture is a cause of transphobia, some queer and trans* feminists hold that it is also the basis of self-transformation. Specifically, Kim Q. Hall points out that queer crip communities affirm transforming oneself through transforming one’s bodies. These creative transformations occur within “the context of communities of support and recognition” (Hall 2009). They frequently involve the desire for intersubjective recognition, where body modifications may be undertaken in order to foster a relatively continuous sense of self (Rubin 2003). This further demonstrates the way that public identities are not removed from an interior sense of self, as liberal individual models tended to assume. This continuity, however, need not rely on the narrative of a “core” interior self that is merely seeking validation from a public. Instead, intersubjective self-fashioning may reject an interior/exterior dichotomy to begin with, following arguments such as Bettcher’s above. They also follow feminist phenomenology in disrupting the presumed binary between nature and culture in bodily comportment (Salamon 2010; Heyes 2007; Hale 1998). Although discussions in trans* theory and queer theory often do not occur within a feminist context, the emphasis on lived embodiment, first-person authority, and the relationality of selfhood frequently found in these discourses both draw on and contribute to feminist discussions of selfhood in crucial ways.

3.2 The Intersectional and Multiplicitous Self

Over the past several decades, biosocial, intersectional, and phenomenological layers of the relational self have increasingly gained prominence. Intersectional theories of selfhood brought forward by African American feminists note that stratifications of social identities such as gender, race, and class do not operate in isolation from one another (Williams 1991; Crenshaw 1993). Rather, these identity modalities interact to produce compound effects. As such, the individual is an intersectional self, or even multiple selves, where structures of subordination but also of agency converge (Moraga and Anzaldúa 1981; King 1988; Crenshaw 1993). Intersectional theory aims to capture those aspects of selfhood that are conditioned by membership in subordinated or privileged social groups. Accenting the liabilities of belonging to more than one subordinated group, Kimberlé Crenshaw likens the position of such individuals to that of a pedestrian hit by several speeding vehicles simultaneously, while María Lugones likens their position to that of a border-dweller who is not at home anywhere (Crenshaw 1991; Lugones 1992). As a “world traveler”, Lugones finds herself shifting between Latinx and Anglo-American worlds. She offers the image of a “curdled self” to indicate the heterogeneity of selfhood in such conditions (Lugones 1994). For Gloria Anzaldúa, the mestiza is a central figure for understanding a new kind of self with an ambiguous, fluid identity: the mestiza experiences a sense of constant in-betweenness that fosters unique modes of meaning-making. As such, intersectional border-dwelling can be a model of positive identity that registers the multiplicitous nature of the self (Anzaldúa 1987; Ruíz 2016; Alarcón 1991 and 1996; Barvosa 2008; Ortega 2016). Border-dwelling selves are frequently ill at ease in the world, but this need not be a disadvantage; rather, it may offer a unique lens for interpreting the fractious nature of the self as well as the possibilities for resistance to oppressive social norms.

Some feminists are comfortable rejecting the unity of the self altogether and suggesting that persons are comprised of what Edwina Barvosa calls a “wealth of selves” (Barvosa 2008). María Lugones influentially argues that “world-traveling” is a modality of moving between mutually exclusive selves that appear within different contexts (Lugones 2003). Barvosa advocates striving to unify these mutually exclusive selves through a self-integrative life project (Barvosa 2008). Mariana Ortega takes issue with both of these positions because they advocate an ontological pluralism: one individual is comprised of multiple selves (Ortega 2016). For Ortega, this position is untenable, because it fails to account for the fact that a self must have some unique identity. In order to do justice both to the uniqueness of the self and to its multiplicity, Ortega argues that selves are ontologically singular but existentially plural. Persons, for her, are characterized by a singular multiplicitous self with various facets that are always in the process of becoming. Ortega utilizes phenomenology in order to argue that the self experiences an existential continuity over time, even as its roles and identities may be incommensurate in various contexts.

Theories of the multiplicitous self resonate with Lorde’s “sister outsider” and Collins’ “outsider-within”, which, in contrast with W.E.B. DuBois’s well-established account of “double consciousness”, develop a multitudinous identity in connection with others. This identity is not primarily oriented around the black/white divide prominent in DuBois, nor in modern theories of autonomy, but instead around multiple roles and sources of energy, kinship, and and community. As we saw above, proponents of the intersectional self credit multiply oppressed people with a certain epistemic advantage in virtue of their suffering and alienation. Thus, black women are acutely aware of racism within feminism and sexism within the struggle for racial justice. Their intersectional positioned selfhood makes such insight virtually unavoidable.

While intersectional theorists bring forward race, class, ability, and other socioeconomic markers as central to psychical-historical locations of agency, power, and connectivity, a number of feminists are increasingly paying attention to somatic and organic factors in selfhood. In addition to the revaluing of embodiment in affect theory and new materialisms mentioned above (section 2), Catherine Malabou points to mental ailments such as Alzheimer’s disease to press upon poststructuralist and psychoanalytic theories of selfhood (Malabou 2012). Diseases with a physical basis challenge any conception of subjectivity located exclusively in the psychic continuities of conscious and/or unconscious life as posited by psychoanalytic theory. Malabou reinterprets Derrida’s deconstructive self as punctured by experiences of alterity through a non-reductive neurobiology of trauma and brain injury. Injured selves may experience radical discontinuities or lose entirely aspects of their former selves. The resulting picture of the self is a multilayered nexus of relations with psychic-historical and somatic-organic strata. Her work makes clear that feminist philosophies of the self cannot ignore the biological sciences.

Willett combines this turn to biological and psychological studies of affect and social emotions with Africana, Latina, and other feminist traditions of the interconnected self. As a social species, the most basic drives and affects of the human self are prosocial, not narcissistic or hedonistic. Maturity does not require abjection, repression, or traumatizing discipline for social cooperation. The capacity for love, friendship, and cooperation with social groups characterizes humans as a biological species. One consequence of the biosocial drives, as we have seen, is the rejection of the autonomy narrative as the primary or exclusive goal of self-development (Willett 1995, 2001). The self matures through enhanced capacities and desires to form social bonds, not severance from a source of dependence (typically portrayed as the mother, the body, and/or the animal world).

Another consequence of this intermingling of the biological with the social is that intersectionality theory is now extended to include mixed-species communities (Haraway 2008; Midgley 1983). This eco-feminist extension of eros ethics follows from the re-centering of ethics on affects and eros rather than on the rational capacities that mark human superiority and separation from other animal species. Willett discerns four strata for envisioning connections across human and nonhuman selves, corresponding to modes of social bonds: 1) subjectless sociality, 2) affect attunement, 3) biosocial network as livable place or home, and 4) compassion and the visceral (gut) conscience (Willett 2014). These four layers reveal that social affects such as laughter or panic transfer from one creature to another, whether from an adult to an infant or within a community of birds, as well as emphasizing that visceral feelings shared among creatures are a key source of moral response. The biosocial layering of selfhood reclaims maternal relationality as more than a mechanical instinct for humans and any number of other animal species. The affect-laden, relational self cannot transcend through reason its social embeddedness in a complex politics of in-group/out-group markers. As we saw above (section 2), rules appealed to by autonomous selves do not guarantee unbiased decisions. Thanks in large part to feminist critiques of traditional models of selfhood and ethics, views that emphasize the relational nature of the self and its heterogeneous features are moving to the center of ethics. At the same time, feminists offer a wide range of methodologies and conclusions with respect to this relational self that are sometimes in conflict, reminding us that the work of feminist philosophy is far from finished.

4. Conclusion

As this article attests, there is tremendous foment and variety within the field of feminist work on the self. Yet, in reviewing this literature, we have been struck by a recurrent theme: namely, the inextricability of metaphysical issues of the self from moral, social, and political theory. Feminist critiques of regnant philosophical theories of the self expose the normative underpinnings of supposedly neutral metaphysics. Feminist analyses of women’s agential capacities both acknowledge traditional feminine social contributions and provide accounts of how women can overcome oppressive norms and practices. Feminist reconstructions of the nature of the self are interwoven with arguments that draw out the emancipatory benefits of conceiving the self one way rather than another. There is nothing surprising, to be sure, about the salience of normative concerns in feminist philosophizing Still, we mention it because we believe that feminists’ attention to sociopolitical concerns leads to fresh questions that enrich the philosophical understanding of the self. Moreover, we would urge that this forthrightness about the political viewpoint that informs philosophy s a virtue, for overlooking the political suppositions and implications of esoteric philosophical views has led to considerable mischief. It is precisely the failure to acknowledge that the question of the self is not narrowly metaphysical that has led to philosophy’s implicit modeling of the self on a male subject, a tendency that feminist perspectives on the self seek to remediate.


Comprehensive Bibliography

In the interests of concision and readability, the present essay mentions only some of the representative works on the feminist literature on the self. These cited works are collated in the Bibliography which appears in the next section of this essay. However, the feminist literature on the self is vast. Lisa Cassidy, Diana Tietjens Meyers, and Ellie Anderson have put together a comprehensive bibliography of this literature; it attempts to cite all of the books and articles that are relevant to the present entry. This comprehensive bibliography is linked into the present essay as the following supplementary document:

Comprehensive Bibliography of Feminist Perspectives on the Self

Readers are therefore encouraged to pursue additional references by following the above link.


The following works are cited in the entry.

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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the authors with suggestions.]

Copyright © 2020 by
Ellie Anderson <ellie_anderson@pitzer.edu>
Cynthia Willett <cwillet@emory.edu>
Diana Meyers

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