Notes to Modal Fictionalism

1. Examples include cases where P itself contains nested modal locutions, or where it contains names or other rigid designators subject to counterpart-theoretic paraphrase.

2. Other biconditionals which might be needed besides the ones associated with the sentential operators of necessity and possibility are ones connecting counterfactual statements and “closeness” relations between possible worlds, and biconditionals connecting probability values and measures on sets of possible worlds. De re modality may call for even more biconditionals, linking de re modal claims to claims about which counterpart relations, or trans-world identities, hold according to the fiction.

3. A modal fictionalist need not take possible worlds to be concrete, spatio-temporal (albeit fictional) objects: one could easily be a fictionalist whose fiction of possible worlds describes them as being abstract objects of some sort. This “abstract object” approach has not received much support in print, however.

4. This blanket approach would require rejection of some widely held basic principles of modal logic: that “possibly P” is true whenever “P” is, for example, or that “actually P” is true for all true P (if “actually” is to be treated as a modal operator, as it often is taken to be). This view would also run into difficulties if we retain the standard interdefinition of “necessarily P” with “not-possibly not-P” and “possibly P” with “not-necessarily not-P”. If both “necessarily P” and “possibly not-P” were without truth value, excluded middle would fail, since “possibly not-P or not-possibly not-P” would fail to be true. If statements prefixed with a modal operator were all treated as false, on the other hand, then if the standard interdefinitions applied, violations of the law of non-contradiction could be generated. One counterexample to non-contradiction could be derived from the falsity of “possibly not-P or not-possibly-not P”. Since this is false, its negation is true (plausibly), and hence, by application of a De Morgan law, “not-possibly not-P and not-not-possibly not-P” follows, which is a contradiction. It is, of course, open to a fictionalist to reject both the basic modal inferences mentioned and the standard interdefinition of possibility and necessity. Such a theorist could still allow that these moves and the interdefinition preserve truth according to the fiction of modality, which may salvage enough of the basic principles and the interdefinition for a fictionalist’s purposes.

5. Jeremy Bentham (Works VII 76–9, 1959, pp. 53–58), advocates fictionalism about the “qualities” of impossibility and possibility, as well as probability and improbability. It is clear that he understood these “qualities” as epistemic rather than alethic ones, but his general approach suggests he might have said the same about the ascription of alethic modalities. He would then count as an early fictionalist about modality itself.

6. The concern is exacerbated if the fiction of possible worlds is intended to provide an analysis or reductive explanation of modal truth (i.e. if “strong modal fictionalism” is intended). For the modal truths are not up to us, it seems. Whether or not it is possible for it to be simultaneously raining and not raining (in the same location, at the same time, in the same respect, etc. etc.) does not seem to be anything we have any control over. Furthermore, some propositions being necessary and others possible, some de re modal claims being true and others false, does not seem to depend on whether or not humans bothered to tell stories about possible worlds. Finally, if things like natural laws and causation are modal matters (e.g. if causation is a matter of the obtaining of certain counterfactuals), the artificiality of modality would seem to imply that even natural laws and causation are, to some extent, artificial. This anti-realism will be found objectionable by many (though not by all: Rescher reasons from conceptualism about modality to idealism virtually across the board through these sorts of connections (Rescher 1975)). Taking modal facts to depend on accidents of our storytelling seems to make the modal truths too artificial.

7. Though Rosen does not say so in quite so many words, he seems to have particularly in mind David Lewis and the account of fiction he offered in Lewis 1979. Lewis’s account of fiction is one in which what is true in a fiction is what is true in certain possible worlds determined by the text of that fiction. Rosen points out that such accounts would have trouble dealing with fictions about the space of possible worlds as a whole (Rosen 1990, pp. 345–346). If the realist’s analysis of truth in fiction does not satisfactorily deal with what is true according to fictions like PW, the realist cannot claim to have an account of “According to PW…” that the fictionalist lacks (p. 346). So if Rosen is right, the realist cannot analyse away the locution that the fictionalist takes as primitive, so the realist cannot claim to be better off in choice of primitives. Rosen recognizes that the realist might eventually be able to account for even this class of fictions using possible worlds, and should that day come the realist will be able to reclaim the advantage of avoiding the “according to PW” primitive.

The sort of treatment offered by Lewis 1979 notoriously faces difficulties in dealing with impossible fictions more generally, especially ones in which it is not straightforward to divide the fictions into consistent subfictions. But there are world-based treatments of fiction that are arguably more successful at dealing with these problems: Routley 1990 (Ch. 7) is one example. Another way of developing a more adequate account of impossible fictions is to stay classical but supplement the theory of Lewis 1979 with impossible worlds (classical accounts of impossible worlds include Nolan 1997b and Zalta 1997, among others). So Rosen’s tu quoque is shaky, at best. In any case, an analysis of fiction which relied in part on some modal resource or other need not look very much like the traditional approaches employing possible worlds, and it does not seem that Rosen has given us reason to suppose that such analyses of fiction could not be made to work.

8. This section replaces longer discussions of these concerns: those looking for longer discussions, perhaps because of references in the wider literature, can find them in the 2016 version of this encyclopedia entry.

Notes to the Supplement A Persisting Problem For Fictionalism About Possible Worlds

9. Another version of the central objection in this piece to the Menzies/Pettit proposal has been developed independently by David Lewis.

10. This is the account of possible worlds that is treated as the fiction about possible worlds by Gideon Rosen, (1990) and by Menzies and Pettit (1994), and by Brock (1993).

11. We use the term “Lewis story” it when discussing the specific proposal that takes Lewis’ theory as the fiction rather than using the term “PW” or “the fiction of a plurality of worlds”, as obviously one could employ a story about the existence of many possible worlds without it agreeing with the story told by David Lewis. (One could have trans-world identity rather than counterparts, for example).

12. See Menzies and Pettit (1994), p. 35, for this “Last Difficulty”. They attribute this further objection to Stuart Brock.

13. At1, for those who wish to be precise in the manner described in Menzies and Pettit (1994), p. 33

14. These reasons for rejecting this move are the same sorts of reasons that Brock (1993, pp. 149–150) outlines for not arbitrarily ruling “Necessarily there are many worlds” out of consideration by a fictionalist theory.

15. I am especially indebted to Peter Menzies and Philip Pettit for encouragement as well as helpful comments and discussion.

Copyright © 2024 by
Daniel Nolan <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free