Supplement to Modal Fictionalism

Rosen’s Incompleteness Worry

The “incompleteness problem” discussed by Rosen (1990, pp. 341–345) can be expressed as follows: there are some modal issues (and corresponding issues about the nature of possible worlds) that a realist may well be silent on — not because they believe there is no answer, but rather because they believe themselves ignorant of the answer. A fictionalist who treats the realist’s theory as a fiction, on the other hand, will be silent upon the same issues — but this can lead to a more serious problem. Rosen, who uses as his fiction the theory that David Lewis proposes as fact, takes as an example an issue Lewis 1986 is silent on: the maximum “size” of possible worlds (or in particular, the maximum number of non-overlapping physical objects in a single world). Rosen’s worry is this: according to the view he develops, (the numbering is Rosen’s, and the details are from his example on p. 342 of 1990):

There might have been \(\kappa\) non-overlapping physical objects.

if and only if

According to PW, there is a [world] containing \(\kappa\) non-overlapping physical objects.

(10f) is not true, since PW is silent on the issue. So (10) is not true. But the same thing happens for the negation of (10):

It is not the case that there might have been \(\kappa\) non-overlapping physical objects.

is plausibly true if and only if

According to PW, no [world] contains \(\kappa\) [non-overlapping] physical objects.

If (11) is really the negation of (10), then classically one of them must be true. If one of them is literally false, then its negation should be true. Rosen is inclined to accept (on the fictionalist’s behalf) that they are genuine contradictories, and both lack a truth-value. He points out, however, two difficulties with this: firstly, his proposal makes (10f) and (11f) truth-valueless too, when they seem clearly false (at least if “according to PW…” works like “according to the fiction …” operators standardly do); and secondly, the disjunction of (10) and (11) is true and a logical truth, so we have the truth of a disjunction without the truth of either disjunct. (Not that this is unknown in the treatment of truth-value gaps, as Rosen points out.) Such logical revision might be thought a high price to pay.

In addition, Rosen rightly points out (p. 342), the fictionalist has settled the question of whether it is true that there might have been \(\kappa\) many non-overlapping physical objects: it is not true. Those who were inclined to think that we are in ignorance of this piece of modal information (or any other piece of modal information about which the story is “silent” in a similar way) will not like this result. The fictionalist does not make room for modal ignorance to the same extent the realist does.

Rosen’s discussion of this worry is unhappy in several places. The first is that (11f) is not his only official translation of (11), assuming “might have been” is to be treated as “possibly” in this context: controposing his biconditional for possiblity (with the appropriate substitutions for \(P)\) yields:

It is not the case that there might have been \(\kappa\) non-overlapping physical objects

if and only if

It is not the case that, according to PW, there is a world containing \(\kappa\) non-overlapping physical objects.

(11f*) yields the result that (11) is simply true, if we interpret “according to PW” in the usual way (and not the way which makes “According to PW, \(Q\)” truthvalueless if \(Q\) is “not determinately settled as true or false by the theory PW”, whatever that might mean in this context). Since (11) is the contradictory of (10), and (10) is false by the lights of Rosen’s original proposal, this should not be surprising. This result has unpleasant consequences of its own, of course, since accepting this theory would commit one to denying the interdefinability of possibility and necessity. Normally, “possibly \(P\)” is taken to be equivalent to “not-necessarily not-\(P\)”, and “necessarily \(P\)” is taken to be equivalent to “not-possibly not-\(P\)”. But the second will fail in this case (and the first will fail in other similar cases). For (11f) is the appropriate correlate of the claim that “necessarily, there are not \(\kappa\) non-overlapping physical objects”, and this claim is standardly taken to be equivalent to (11). For the reasons Rosen gives, however, the correlate of (11f) is not true, whereas (11) is, due to the truth of (11f*).

Denying the interdefinability of necessity and possibility in the standard way is perhaps not as big a modification to our logic and semantics as introducing truth-value gaps. It will still be seen as very unattractive by many. There is another modification to the basic theory which might be made to deal with these cases, which is a different way of implementing the spirit of Rosen’s proposed strategy here. Rosen says the fictionalist can modify his theory by “declaring that in general when the paraphrase \(P^*\) of a modal claim is not determinately settled as true or false by the theory PW, the modal claim \(P\) is to lack a truth-value” (p. 343). What is puzzling about Rosen’s implementation of this proposal is that he takes it that this implies that the “According to PW, \(P^*\)” claim has to be truthvalueless when PW neither says \(P^*\) or its negation.  This has the further unwelcome consequence that “According to PW” will not function like “according to the fiction…” operators are standardly thought to. A more natural way of going, surely, is to treat “According to PW …” in the standard way (i.e. it is just false that “According to PW, \(P^*\)”, when PW is neither committed to \(P^*\) or to its negation), but to provide for truth-value gaps for the modal claims by restricting the fictionalist biconditional. Instead of the general scheme:

\(P\) iff According to PW, \(P^*\),

the fictionalist could instead accept the clumsier:

if \(P\), then According to PW, \(P^*\), and if not-\(P\), then According to PW, not-\(P^*\), and if According to PW, \(P^*\), then \(P\), and if According to PW, not-\(P^*\), then not-\(P\)

and further stipulate that \(P\) is truthvalueless iff neither according to PW, \(P^*\), nor according to PW, not-\(P^*\).

When the fiction says something about whether or not \(P^*\), which will be the usual case, this longer set of conditions will permit the fictionalist to move back and forth from modal language to talk of possible worlds in the usual way: it is only when PW is silent about the relevant issue that the corresponding modal claim suffers a lack of truth-value. In modifying the central biconditional, it is true that the fictionalist is sacrificing some of the elegance of the original theory, though the unpleasant looking list of conditions can be rewritten so that they have more of the appearance of a minor alteration of the original:

\(P\) iff According to PW, \(P^*\), (unless PW is silent about \(P^*\), in which case \(P\) is truth-valueless).

This still has the feature that a disjunction may be true without either of its disjuncts being true, and other features common to many treatments of truth-value gaps, and it still has the feature that the theory delivers definite answers of a sort for certain modal matters (i.e. that \(P\) has no truth-value) when it might have seemed that we imagined we were merely ignorant: it is still an approach with many of the features of Rosen’s amendment. It however lacks the most objectionable feature possessed by Rosen’s proposal of keeping the biconditional intact and declaring that “According to PW …” is gappy. Woodward 2012 offers a different treatment that ensures indeterminacy of truth value in the cases where PW is apparently silent about P*, a way he argues is more elegant than the one presented here.

In any case, Rosen’s incompleteness worry arises only for those modal fictionalist theories which do indeed admit that the modal fiction is silent on some relevant issues. Some are indeed likely to (and Rosen’s is one), but it should be remembered that this does not seem to be an unavoidable feature of such theories. One could attempt to specify enough about the content of the modal fiction so that it settled, at least in principle, all of the relevant issues. (It may be difficult to tell how they are settled, of course, if the content of the fiction depends, e.g., on facts about the arrangement of the actual world, but this is not a problem of completeness, but only of modal epistemology). In particular, timid fictionalists can stipulate the content of the modal fiction in terms of the modal truths (so, e.g. the fiction is to represent that at some world, \(Q^*\), just in case possibly \(Q)\). This sort of specification would only be circular if the status of the modal truths was to be analysed in terms of the content of the fiction, but the timid fictionalist has no such pretensions. While the timid fictionalist’s fiction may leave some questions unsettled (how many indiscernible worlds there are, for example), the timid fictionalist should be able to make the fiction determinate to the extent that all of the correlates of modal claims are represented, by brute stipulation if necessary. It may be harder for a strong modal fictionalist, but it has not been shown to be impossible.

In summary, then, while Rosen’s incompleteness concerns may well not give rise to the problems he alleges, there are difficulties (or at least departures from orthodoxy) which will be faced by fictions which are incomplete in the sorts of ways that, for instance, Rosen’s candidate is.

Return to Modal Fictionalism

Copyright © 2024 by
Daniel Nolan <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free