Notes to Heidegger’s Aesthetics

1. In the early 1920s, Heidegger will repeatedly proclaim that genuine philosophy “is and remains atheism” (HCT 80/GA20 109–10) because true philosophical questioning must follow freely where the questions themselves lead and so cannot agree ahead of time to abide by the external limits imposed by the Church or any other would-be authorities over matters of the mind or spirit. For precisely the same reason, of course, a “Nazi Philosopher” would also be an oxymoron, a fact Heidegger unfortunately failed to grasp between 1933 and 1937.

2. As Bernasconi (1998, p. 378) rightly observes, “there has been relatively little scrutiny of Heidegger’s attempt to free the concept of art itself from its status as an aesthetic category.” For nice explications of the broader historical context of Heidegger’s hermeneutic and phenomenological understanding of art, see Guignon 2003, Crowell 2010, and Wrathall 2011.

3. David Whewell (in Cooper 1995, p. 6) defines “aestheticism” as: “The doctrine that art should be valued for itself alone and not for any purpose or function it may happen to serve,” which connects this idea to the l’art pour l’art movement that emerged in mid-nineteenth century France.

4. Julian Young’s excellent translation of “The Origin of the Work of Art” (see OBT) has frequently been consulted, and the emendations he makes to the better known translation of the essay by Hofstadter (in PLT) have often been adopted here.

5. For Heidegger, the historical transformation of intelligibility (or “history of being”) proceeds—via what we would now call a “punctuated equilibrium”—through five different Western “epochs” or historical constellations of intelligibility: the Presocratic, Platonic, Medieval, Modern, and late-Modern epochs. For a full discussion of Heidegger’s understanding of the mechanisms responsible for establishing, maintaining, and transforming our fundamental sense of what is and what matters, see Thomson 2005, Ch. 1.

6. Heidegger’s view of art applies to all great art, including, e.g., great poetic works of art. Thus he writes that in a masterful Greek tragedy like Aeschylus’s Oresteia, “the struggle of the new gods against the old is being fought. The work of language…does not speak about this struggle; rather, it transforms the saying of the people so that every essential word fights the battle and puts up for decision what is holy and unholy, what great and what small, what brave and what cowardly, what precious and what fleeting, what master and what slave (cf. Heraclitus, Fragment 53)” (PLT 43/GA5 29). For a clear explanation of how Aeschylus’s tragic drama functions like a “God,” transforming the self-understanding of fifth century Greece, see Dreyfus and Kelly 2011, 90–102. There would, moreover, be much to say about the complex political subtext of the seemingly self-referential passages quoted here, with their abundant use of such Nazi buzzwords as Kampf (struggle), derivatives of führen (leading), and the opposition of Sieg (victory) and Schmach (disgrace). Typically, Heidegger’s rhetorical strategy is to try to appropriate these buzzwords by radically reinterpreting them in terms of his own philosophy.

7. Dreyfus draws on Clifford Geertz (along with Thomas Kuhn and Charles Taylor) to help illuminate Heidegger. As Dreyfus (2005, p. 412) explains: “The temple draws the people who act in its light to clarify, unify, and extend the reach of its style, but being a material thing it resists rationalization. And since no interpretation can ever completely capture what the work means, the temple sets up a struggle between earth and world. The result is fruitful in that the conflict of interpretations that ensues generates a culture’s history.” On Hegel’s influence on Heidegger’s understanding of the temple, see Harries 2009, 105–6; for a Hegelian response to Heidegger (and more on their philosophical disagreement), see Pippin 2014, ch. 4 (esp. pp. 98–116); and, for a Heideggerian rejoinder, see Torson 2014.

8. This view was first sketched in Thomson 1998. Heidegger raises an important puzzle for this view, however, when he implicitly but deliberately includes Van Gogh’s painting as a “great” work of art in “The Origin of the Work of Art,” stating that “great art…is all we are talking about here” (PLT 40/GA5 26). The solution to this puzzle is that the way Van Gogh’s painting illuminates what art itself is, as we will see, is supposed to help us transcend modern aesthetics from within, and this encounter itself is supposed to exemplify—and so help us learn to understand—what it means to encounter being in a “post modern” way. For Heidegger, i.e., Van Gogh’s painting is both a paradigmatic and a macroparadigmatic work; for, it shows us what art is in a way that changes our understanding of what it means for anything to be. (This post-modern understanding of being applies universally but it is not totalizing, moreover, because of the way it helps us understand and so encounter all that is as conceptually inexhaustible, as we will see in section 3.7 below.)

9. In his important book, Young rightly recognizes “the inseparability of ontology and ethics” as “a thesis fundamental to all phases of Heidegger’s thinking” (Young 2001, p. 24).

10. Even if this rather esoteric view represents the romantic kernel in Kant’s aesthetic thought, it nevertheless presupposes the same subject/object divide that, as we will see, Heidegger believes has led the entire aesthetic tradition off track. (For more on Heidegger’s critique of the modern metaphysics underlying aesthetics, see Torsen 2016.)

11. Cf. T.S. Eliot’s well-crafted line (from “The Love Song of J. Alfred Prufrock”): “And I have known the eyes already, known them all— / The eyes that fix you in a formulated phrase, / And when I am formulated, sprawling on a pin, / When I am pinned and wriggling on the wall, / Then how should I begin…”

12. In the scholarly literature, the answer to this question is often drawn from Heidegger’s “Six Basic Developments in the History of Aesthetics” (section 13 from the first of Heidegger’s famous Nietzsche lectures, The Will to Power as Art, delivered between 1936 and 1937). The history of aesthetics Heidegger presents here is typically taken as Heidegger’s own view, despite the fact that this raises puzzles about why Heidegger seems to have drastically different views in essays written at almost the same time. It is not always easy to separate Heidegger’s own view from the Nietzschean position he claims to be explicating (especially in the first of his Nietzsche lectures—this becomes much less of a problem by the end of the second lecture series, as Heidegger becomes increasingly disillusioned with Nazism and so more careful to distinguish Nietzsche’s views from his own). Nevertheless, Heidegger clearly claims that the history of aesthetics he presents here is in fact drawn from Nietzsche, and should be understood as “an attempt to simplify Nietzsche’s presentations concerning art to what is essential” (N1 122/GA43 143). Recognizing this makes it less surprising that Heidegger occasionally contradicts these views when speaking in his own voice elsewhere (as in the lecture delivered the following year, “The Age of the World Picture”, explicated below).

13. Heidegger suggests in 1937 that modern aesthetics stays within the traditional philosophical approach to art. “The name ‘aesthetics’ for a meditation on art and the beautiful is young and stems from the eighteenth century. But the matter itself so aptly named by this name—that is, the way of inquiring into art and the beautiful on the basis of the state of feeling in enjoyers and producers—is old, just as old as mediation on art and the beautiful in Western thought. The philosophical meditation on the essence of art and the beautiful already begins as aesthetics.” (N1 79/GA43 92) Heidegger’s more careful view is that aesthetics proper presupposes the modern subject/object divide, but because he holds Plato responsible for inaugurating this divide (see Thomson 2005, ch. 4), he can loosely trace the “aesthetic” way of conceiving art all the way back to Aristotle, as he does here.

14. As Heidegger puts it: “What determines thinking, that is, logic, and what thinking comports itself toward, is the true.” Analogously: “What determines human feeling, that is, aesthetics, and what feeling comports itself toward, is the beautiful” (N1 78/GA43 90). Hence: “Aesthetics is the way in which the essence of the beautiful and of art is determined metaphysically, namely, in terms of modern metaphysics.” (HHI 88/GA53 109)

15. Heidegger presupposes the same point again in What Is Called Thinking (1951–52). Here he glosses “seeing art aesthetically” by adding: “that is, from the point of view of expression and impression—the work as expression and the impression as experience” (WCT 128/GA8 132).

16. On Heidegger and Duchamp, see Vattimo 2008, pp. xvi, 45–7, 105, and 159. Vattimo even suggests that Duchamp’s “Fountain” is a better illustration of art’s revolutionary potential than Heidegger’s own example of the Greek temple. (On this point, see also O’Halloran 2020.) Yet, there are for Heidegger clearly different orders of magnitude here. In this regard, Wright nicely captures Heidegger’s larger point when she writes that: “The temple celebrates the extraordinary event of Greece’s emergence as a history-making force that gives direction to the next two thousand years of Western history” (Wright 1998, p. 385). Or, as Dreyfus 2005 (p. 419 note 4) puts it: “The [Greek] temple and the Presocratic thinkers had to take the style that was already in the language and, for the first time, focus it and hold it up to the people. According to Heidegger, this is the origin (Ur-sprung) of our Western culture.”

17. In his treatment of Shapiro’s critique of Heidegger, Michael Kelly raises the same objection to Heidegger’s interpretation of Van Gogh, suggesting that Heidegger sets himself a difficult challenge in his “attempt to desubjectivize aesthetics while discussing Van Gogh,” an artist who placed his work under the bold signature, “Vincent,” and is often taken as “the paradigm case of subjective art.” Kelly’s interpretation of “the subjectivization of aesthetics” as the tendency “to understand and judge art in terms of the viewer’s subjective experience or judgment of it” allows him to bring Heidegger into dialogue with central issues in contemporary aesthetics (Kelly 2003, pp. 49–50), but this interpretation overlooks what Heidegger most fundamentally objects to about aesthetics, viz., its relation to “subjectivism.” Heidegger’s deepest objection to aesthetics is not that our understanding of art is overly constrained by idiosyncratic, “subjective” biases but, as we have seen, that aesthetics follows from (and feeds back into) the modern subject’s “subjectivistic” compulsion to control the entire objective world—a compulsion that Heidegger argues derives from modern metaphysics and thus from the “history of being,” and so requires a response at this deeper level. (For more on this point, see Thomson 2011, ch. 1.)

18. As Heidegger begins to extend his critique of aesthetic subjectivism so as to connect it to “enframing” (i.e., our reductive way of understanding the being of entities in terms of Nietzsche’s ontotheology of eternally recurring will-to-power), he will go so far as to claim that: “The aesthetic state is the tunnel-vision through which we constantly see.” (N1 139/GA43 170) (On Heidegger’s relation to the fugue in particular and to music more generally, see Thomson 2011, ch. 6 (“The Philosophical Fugue”); Nowell-Smith 2012; and Rentmeester and Warren 2022.)

19. Schiller’s famous poem, “The Gods of Greece,” mournfully contrasts the experience of the ancient Greeks, in which “Everything to the initiate’s eye / Showed the trace of a God,” with our modern experience of “A Nature shorn of the divine [or, less poetically, ”a de-divinized nature,“ die entgötterte Natur]” (quoted by Taylor 2007, pp. 316–7). Heidegger himself will pit (what we could think of as) the texture of the text against this modern current in order to resist its more nihilistic effects and try to lead it beyond itself (as we will see in parts 4 and 5 below).

20. In his broader “history of being,” Heidegger traces “subjectivism” back to Plato, whose doctrine of the ideas begins a movement whereby truth is no longer understood solely in terms of the manifestation of entities themselves but, instead, becomes a feature of our own “representational” capacities. In this way, truth becomes a matter of the way we secure our knowledge of entities rather than of the prior way entities disclose themselves to us. (On this “displacement of the locus of truth” from being to human subjectivity, see Thomson 2005, p. 160.)

21. The modern prejudice that (to put it simply) all meaning comes from the human subject reaches its most powerful apotheosis in Nietzsche and Freud. From Heidegger’s perspective, however, this phenomenologically mistaken view misses (and subsequently obscures) the fact that meaning emerges at the prior practical intersection of human beings with their worlds (as well as in our engaged negotiations with one another). Heidegger is thus an ethical realist, one whose phenomenological investigations led him to recognize that the world is no mute partner but, rather, actively contributes to our most profound sense of what matters (see below and Thomson 2004).

22. In “The Origin of the Work of Art,” Heidegger again presents his phenomenological conception of “existence” as a way to undercut and transcend the modern subject/object dichotomy: “In existence, however, humanity does not first move out of something ‘interior’ to something ‘exterior’; rather, the essence of existence is the out-standing standing within the essential separation [i.e., the ontological difference between being and entities thought in terms of the essential strife that joins ”earth and world“] belonging to the clearing of beings.” (PLT 67/GA5 55)

23. As this suggests, Heidegger’s later work is dedicated to detecting, resisting, and, ultimately, transcending what he took to be the core of the Nazi ideology. For a justification of this admittedly provocative claim, see Thomson 2011, Ch. 7 and Thomson 2017A. On Heidegger’s attempt to transcend aesthetics from within, see also Sallis 2008, Ch. 8.

24. Dreyfus (2005, p. 413) calls the freeway interchange a “debased work of art” because he thinks it “imposes such an efficient order on nature that earth is no longer able to resist.” Thomson (2005, pp. 70–1) suggests that this is a bit too bleak to be the view of Heidegger, who instead followed the Hölderlinian dictum: “Where the danger is, however, there grows / that which saves as well [Wo aber Gefahr ist, wächst / Das Rettende auch].” For more on this point, see Thomson 2011, ch. 7. See also Brodsley 1981 and Dreyfus 2009.

25. On Heidegger’s prediction, see Thomson 2011, Ch. 7. For a neo-Heideggerian critique of our ongoing attempts to optimize ourselves technologically, see Sandel 2007.

26. In the early 1950s, e.g., Heidegger again asks, “while science records the brain currents, what becomes of the tree in bloom? …[W]e shall forfeit everything before we know it, once the sciences of physics, physiology, and psychology, not to forget scientific philosophy, display the panoply of their documents and proofs, to explain to us that what we see and accept is properly not a tree but in reality a void, thinly sprinkled with electric charges here and there that race hither and yon at enormous speeds” (WCT 42–3/GA8 45–6).

27. Concerning “great art,” Heidegger acknowledges that many of the “works themselves [still] stand and hang in museums and exhibitions,” but and asks: “[A]re they here in themselves as the works they themselves are, or are they not rather here as objects of the art industry?” Heidegger’s point is that “placing artworks in a collection has withdrawn them from their own world” (PLT 40/GA5 26); i.e., the “great works of art” have been uprooted from the worlds of meaning they once focused and preserved in a way that kept the future of those worlds open. Although it might initially sound counter-intuitive, then, Heidegger is suggesting that most of the great works we find collected in museums no longer keep their worlds open, and thus no longer work as art. As he puts it: “As soon as the thrust into the extraordinary is parried and captured by the sphere of familiarity and connoisseurship,” the work of art has ended and “the art business has begun” (PLT 68/GA5 56). In Heidegger’s rather polemical view: “The whole art industry, even if carried to the extreme and exercised in every way for the sake of the works themselves, extends only to the object-being of the works. But this object-being [of artworks] does not constitute their work-being” (PLT 41/GA5 27). This reduction of art-works to art “objects” is, as we have seen, at the core of the aestheticization of art Heidegger opposes. An objection often raised in the literature—viz., that Heidegger’s own work on Van Gogh, e.g., cannot hope to escape making a contribution to aesthetics and the art industry—misses the fact that Heidegger seeks to transcend aesthetics from within (as we will see) by trying to “preserve” (that is, creatively and responsively disclose) what he argues phenomenologically is the true significance of Van Gogh’s painting. (On Heidegger’s “perfectionist” vision of learning such “response-ability” in order to cultivate human existence at its best, see Thomson 2004, 2005 ch. 4, and 2016.) Here as elsewhere, then, Heidegger employs the rhetorical strategy Derrida refers to as a “phoenix motif”: “One burns or buries what is already dead [or dying] so that life…will be reborn and regenerated from these ashes.” (See Derrida 1985, p. 26, discussed in Thomson 2005, p. 154.)

28. Heidegger understands the manifestation of a new truth of being in art as “beauty” (PLT 81/GA5 69), but beauty understood in a post-aesthetic sense as the revelation of a new understanding of being. As he puts it in the early 1950s: “Beauty is a fateful gift of the essence of truth, whereby truth means the unconcealment of the self-concealing. The beautiful is not what pleases, but what falls within that fateful gift of truth which comes into its own when that which is eternally unapparent [or inconspicuous, Unscheinbare] and therefore invisible attains its most radiantly apparent appearance.” (WCT 19/GA8 21) On the distinctive sense of “postmodern” that can rightly be applied to Heidegger, see Thomson 2011, Ch. 4.

29. As Hammermeister (2002, p. 175) shows convincingly, however, “Heidegger’s claim for a fresh start glosses over his affinities for the idealist tradition, especially Schelling.” Heidegger’s views on art also owe significant philosophical debts to Dilthey, as Hansen (2017) shows.

30. Heidegger’s famous essay was first published in 1950, along with its undated “Afterword” (which, judging from its terminology, stems from about 1938), as the first chapter of Holzwege; the 1956 “Addendum” was first added to the 1960 Reclam edition. For interpretations of the changes which take place between the earliest drafts of Heidegger’s famous art essay, see Taminiaux 1993 and Bernasconi 1999. Clearly, a significant transformation occurs between the earliest, German nationalistic version of Heidegger’s essay and the much more famous, published version, in which traces of that earlier nationalism still survive (in the largely undeveloped references to Greek tragedy and to Hölderlin, e.g.) but can no longer be said to dominate the piece (pace Wright 1998). For an interpretation of the ways in which Heidegger further modified his view after the 1930s, see Young 2001.

31. Young is right that Heidegger’s interpretation of Van Gogh is “anomalous” if we understand anomaly in a Kuhnian way, as an inexplicable detail that, when properly understood, transforms our entire previous view.

32. As Plato puts it: “everything that is responsible for creating something out of nothing is a kind of poetry; and so all the creations of every craft and profession are themselves a kind of poetry, and everyone who practices a craft is a poet” (Symposium, 205b, Woodruff and Nehamas translation).

33. There are, nonetheless, other possibilities. It could be that “The Origin of the Work of Art” (as it is often read) merely prepares for this crucial encounter with an artwork capable of ushering in a new understanding of being, an encounter which perhaps never arrives (such that Heidegger himself dies waiting for the arrival of a salvific event that never comes, as Wolin (1990) and others suggest by misreading Heidegger’s famous Der Spiegel interview, “Only a God Can Save Us”). Or it could be that Heidegger is here simply setting-up his reading of the German Romantic poet Friedrich Hölderlin, whose work Heidegger does most frequently nominate to play such a pivotal role (including in his 1934–35 lectures, see GA39). The latter hypothesis receives some apparent support from the fact that “The Origin of the Work of Art” closes by quoting two lines from Hölderlin’s poem, “The Journey”: “What dwells near the origin / Leaves that place with reluctance” (PLT 78/GA5 66). Wright (1998) makes the strongest case for reading these lines as a nationalistic call for Germany to break with the history of the West that began in Greece and begin history again, but Wright’s genealogical analysis of Heidegger’s essay, while insightful and revealing, misses the emergent view that took shape only in the final version of the essay, where Van Gogh rather than Hölderlin plays the starring role. (By the time Heidegger wrote the final draft of “The Origin of the Work of Art”, moreover, he is no longer assigning a vanguard role to “Germany” in the dissemination of this postmodern view, as he did in its first draft, following GA39. By “Germany,” moreover, Heidegger always primarily meant himself, a thinker creatively interpreting Hölderlin’s meaning for German history in terms of his own philosophical views—and Heidegger’s idea that his thought was crucial for a postmodern revolution is something he never stopped believing.) Heidegger does conclude his famous essay by proposing Hölderlin’s lines as “a test” that is supposed “infallibly” to tell us whether, “in our comportment to art,” our existence stands within art’s “origin” or whether we are merely relying on a cultured acquaintance with the past. Hölderlin’s suggestive lines are polysemic (and their full significance for Heidegger could be explicated at length, bringing is such facts as Heidegger’s recent and very public refusal to leave his home near the Black Forest in order to accept a prestigious chair of philosophy in Berlin, as well as the allusion to the Greek adage, “All beginnings are difficult,” which Wright nicely picks up on). Read in the context of the published essay, however, Heidegger uses these lines primarily to suggest that we can tell that we are genuinely encountering art when we find it as difficult to put its inherently-polysemic meaning into words as the artist found it to capture that meaning in the work in the first place. As we will see, “The Origin of the Work” seeks to lead its audience performatively to encounter this “enigma of art” (PLT 79/GA5 67) for ourselves, recognizing how the inexhaustible earth resists being fully stabilized within the light of any single world, in order to learn to understand being in a post-modern, ontologically-pluralistic way. (On the political implications of these later views, see Thomson 2016.) Indeed, this performative dimension is a central and defining feature of all Heidegger’s most important later works, each of which (despite many important connections to Heidegger’s other works) seeks to be self-contained in this respect, i.e., each of these essays seeks to lead its audience to see something important (even existentially transformative) for ourselves. Heidegger’s famous essay does not indefinitely postpone such an encounter or even merely prepare for it to happen at some point in the future or in another of his works; he thinks he has prepared for it to happen in (or through) “The Origin of the Work of Art” itself. As he thus puts it there: “Our efforts concerning the actual working of the work [die Wirklichkeit des Werkes] should have prepared the ground for discovering, in this working of the work, art and its essential nature” (PLT 70/GA5 58). As strange as it sounds initially, this means that it is primarily Van Gogh rather than Hölderlin whom Heidegger turns to in order to teach us how to encounter the work of art in a postmodern way in his most famous essay on art.

34. After this chapter was written, another scholar was discovered who notices this intriguing puzzle and interprets it similarly (see Gover 2008). Gover, however, goes so far as to present the poem itself as the central work in Heidegger’s famous essay. Gover is right that Meyer’s poem is much more important to Heidegger’s essay than previous interpreters have realized, but once one recognizes that Heidegger’s goal is to transcend modern aesthetics from within, then the painting clearly emerges as the most crucial work of art in his essay. A further bit of evidence for this view can be found in the fact that Heidegger’s three examples—the Greek temple, the “Roman Fountain” poem, and Van Gogh’s painting—map onto the three main ages in his history of being, viz., the ancient, medieval, and modern, respectively. The poem nicely discloses that history for Heidegger (as we will see in the next note), but his attempt to transcend modernity from within takes place primarily through his interpretation of the modern work: Van Gogh’s painting of “A Pair of Shoes.”

35. Heidegger provides the key to unlocking his understanding of Meyer’s poem in the linked rhetorical questions he poses right after introducing it. The crucial clue to his understanding of the ontological “truth set into the work” of the poem comes when he asks (rhetorically—he often uses rhetorical questions to make bold assertions): “Which truth happens in the work? Can truth happen at all and thus be historical?” (PLT 38/GA5 23) In an otherwise-insightful treatment of the poem, Mulhall (2019) resists this reading even while quoting these lines that support it. For Heidegger, the poem is not allegorical but rather embodies and discloses ontological truths about (what I have called) “historicity” and “epochality” (that is, the linked ideas that our understanding of being changes over time and that these changes take shape as unified but overlapping ontological epochs; see Thomson 2011, Ch. 1). The poem itself shows how the three epochs in the history of being are not equally disclosive (pace Mulhall 2019, note 7); just like the successive basins of the fountain, the ontological truth embodied in the first, Greek epoch is uniquely “veiled over” in the second Medieval epoch when (so Heidegger alleges) the ontology embodied in central Greek philosophical terms get mistranslated into Latin in a way that conceals the Greek understanding of truth as aletheia or ontological disclosure. Of course, because Meyer surely did not intend his poem to mean what Heidegger takes it to mean (viz., that truth is essentially historical; that this history is epochal; that the aletheic truth of the essential earth-world tension embodied in the epoch of Greek antiquity was already lost in the Medieval epoch; so that this original aletheiac understanding of truth as a disclosive struggle between earth and world can be rediscovered through a return to “the origin”), it is only natural to worry here about the thorny issue of the significance authors’ intentions have for the meaning of their work. For Heidegger, works of art have two equally important sides: their creation (by an artist) and their preservation (by a community of interpreters). As he puts it: “Just as a work cannot be without being created and thus is essentially in need of creators, so what is created cannot itself come into being without those who preserve it.” (PLT 66/GA5 54) An artwork without an interpretive community remains mute (and static), and an interpretive community without a guiding artwork remains blind (and unformed). At the game time, Heidegger suggests that artworks’ creators are often unreliable guides to the meaning of their own work. Notoriously, Heidegger was never shy about asserting that he understood a work better than its own author, whether that author was a philosopher (whose essential but “unthought” ontological thoughts Heidegger sought to disclose) or an artist (with an insufficient philosophical understanding of his work to recognize its place in or relevance for the history of being). E.g., Petzet tells us that, although Paul Klee’s work was “of crucial significance for Heidegger,” Heidegger was convinced that Klee himself “does not know what is happening” in his own work (Petzet 1993, pp. 147, 149). As if to justify this view, Heidegger quotes from Klee’s Creative Confessions, where Klee writes: “Art plays an unknowing game with the ultimate things and yet reaches them nonetheless!” (Seubold 1993, p. 9) Heidegger will thus seek to deepen Klee’s self-understanding by questioning Klee’s own presuppositions. E.g., Heidegger takes the first sentence of Klee’s Creative Confessions—viz., “Art does not give the visible but, instead, makes visible”—and asks: “What? The invisible and from where and in what way the invisible determines?” (Seubold 1993, p. 12) Perhaps the most sympathetic way to understand Heidegger’s undeniable hermeneutic arrogance is that, as a phenomenologist, he is committed to the view that our knowledge of authors’ intentions can easily narrow and so distort our appreciation of the essentially polysemic meaning of their work (assuming it is indeed “great” work). This would, at any rate, help explain Heidegger’s belief that the truth of the work shows itself to us most “purely, …[p]recisely where the artist and the process and the circumstances surrounding the genesis of the work remain unknown” (PLT 65/GA5 53). On Klee’s own views and their relation to Heidegger’s phenomenological approach to art, see also Wrathall 2011, pp. 21–28.

36. As we saw in part one, it was not until 1938 (in “The Age of the World Picture”) that Heidegger began to distinguish modern “subjectivism” (the modern subject’s quest to completely control the objective world) from “enframing” (the objectification of that subject whereby everything gets reduced to the status of an intrinsically-meaningless “resource,” Bestand, merely standing by to be optimized and efficiently ordered for further use). Heidegger also later distinguishes between two phases in the Ancient world, viz., the Presocratic and the Platonic (see Thomson 2005, Ch. 1).

37. In this regard, it is quite possible that Heidegger does not envision a new fountain, or even a fourth basin, here in 1936 but instead imagines a (much more politically problematic) revitalization of the third basin, along the lines of his then current faith in the possibility of redirecting the Third Reich philosophically. Given the timing of Heidegger’s essay, the suggestive proximity of the words “reich / Der dritten” (“…riches / the third…”) in lines 5 and 6 of Meyer’s poem are certainly troubling in this regard (PLT 37/GA5 23). This worry cannot be dismissed by pointing to the obvious fact that Meyer employs the reich of “riches” rather than the homophonic Reich of “empire,” because Heidegger’s own understanding of poetry stresses the central importance of poetry’s ineliminable polysemy. Indeed, it is precisely here that those searching for a hidden allusion to Nazism in Heidegger’s essay should look (rather than to Heidegger’s interpretation of Van Gogh’s painting, as Shapiro suggests—see section 4 below). That Heidegger chose a poem containing these words at this time is surely no coincidence but, rather, another significant aspect of the otherwise mysterious attraction Meyer’s rather mediocre poem held for him. Yet, this initially alarming allusion, taken in context, actually suggests Heidegger’s view of the spiritual poverty of the Third Reich as it existed in 1935–6, a poverty which for a brief time Heidegger hoped to remedy by helping to lead the Nazi movement philosophically to a “second, deeper awakening” (HB 571), a more profound spiritual “awakening” which Heidegger rather megalomaniacally thought Nazism could attain by being grounded not in Hitler’s eugenic vision (which Heidegger rejects as a “biologistic” extension of Nietzschean metaphysics) but, instead, in his own philosophical understanding of the history of being. In general, the political context of Heidegger’s essay is too complicated and momentous an issue to address adequately here. For a careful treatment of the broader political issues raised by Heidegger’s thinking of art, see Young 2001 as well as the suggestive view outlined by Wright 1998. Contrast the polemical view advanced by Geulen 2006, Ch. 6. On the more direct connection between Heidegger’s philosophy and his politics, see Thomson 2005, Ch. 3, and Thomson 2017A. For more on the “other beginning” Heidegger was then calling for, see his CP/GA65 and Thomson 2011, Ch, 6. To this literature, we might simply add that Heidegger’s simultaneous celebration of Van Gogh (an artist Hitler hated and who became for the Nazis a prime example of “degenerate art”) and of a female farmer (the very image of a woman laborer became an anti-fascist trope) suggests how far Heidegger was from the central tenets of Nazi ideology. (Thanks to David Craven for suggesting these latter two points.)

38. Understanding Heidegger’s phenomenological interpretation of Van Gogh allows us to recognize that the less culturally-monolithic understanding of art which Dreyfus and Young rightly discern in Heidegger’s later writings can already be found in a nascent form in his phenomenological interpretation of Van Gogh, alongside the more culturally-unified view suggested by Heidegger’s thoughts on the ancient Greek temple. The trick is that the post-modern understanding of being Heidegger believes Van Gogh can help us inaugurate historically would understand the being of beings in terms of being as such, i.e., not in a single, monolithic way but, instead, as essentially inexhaustible and thus necessarily polysemic (as we will see in section 3.7), and so the origin of a nascently postmodern, plural realism (see Thomson 2011, 2016).

39. In this quotation from his middle period, Heidegger calls for an “overcoming” (Überwindung) of modern aesthetics, but he will soon reject the idea of overcoming modern metaphysics directly (for the aforementioned reason that any such attempt to move directly “anti-” inevitably remains entangled in that which it opposes), instead calling for a “twisting-free” (Verwindung) of modern metaphysics, i.e., a kind of passing through and getting beyond, as one might “get over” or recover from a serious illness (see EP).

40. According to the theoretical picture at the core of modern philosophy, we have no unmediated acquaintance with reality; instead, we only ever experience the objective world as it is re-presented in our own consciousness. From the perspective of phenomenology, however, this doubling of the world in representation looks like a mischaracterization of ordinary existence, in which we usually encounter people and trees, e.g., not representations of people and trees. Of course, we do explicitly encounter representations in certain types of break-down cases, for example, when our only access to a painting is through various representations of it and, as we study them, we become aware of subtle differences between these different representations of the same work; or when we our only way to see our family is by a bad telephone connection or low-resolution videoconference in which the sound or picture make it difficult to ignore the medium of our interaction. In such break-down cases, we become aware of representations coming between us and the world precisely because we experience them as a poor substitute for the thing they represent. Interestingly, thinking about such media of perception (especially the empirical study of optics) originally helped Descartes motivate the rather strange idea that representations of which we are unaware pervasively mediate our experience of the world. On Heidegger’s radical challenge to this view, see Guignon 1993; Richardson 1986; Olafson 1987); and Dreyfus 1991. Heidegger’s theory of the transformation from the “hands-on” (zuhanden) the “on-hand” (vorhanden), discussed in part one above, helps explain why it is that when our practical engagement with the world of our involvements breaks down or runs into unexpected difficulties, we often find ourselves explicitly deliberating, making plans, articulating our beliefs and desires, trying out various interpretations, and the like. Given Heidegger’s radical challenge to the subject/object divide which has been axiomatic to modern metaphysics since Descartes, it seems problematic to try to understand his original and challenging views by shoe-horning them into the terms developed in contemporary discussions of modern aesthetics, since this risks missing what is most original, challenging, and inspiring about Heidegger’s original postmodern phenomenology of art.

41. Hammermeister, e.g., advances this claim (see Hammermeister 2002, p. 238 note 8); on this point, however, Bartky (1981) seems closer to the truth. This specific question of whether Heidegger believes art has an essence (he does) leads back to the larger question of whether, given Heidegger’s understanding of this essence (as a poetic naming-into-being), he can properly be said to have a “philosophy of art,” properly speaking. Pöggeler (1972) famously argues that Heidegger does not have a “philosophy of art” at all, because Heidegger does not think art distinctively as art but only in terms of the role that art plays disclosing being in time. But Pöggeler’s criticism seems to beg the question against Heidegger’s ontological understanding of art, as von Herrmann (1980) suggests. (Von Herrmann, like Young, finds Heidegger’s distinctive philosophy of art only in his later work, but we will see that it can already be found in his phenomenological reading of Van Gogh.) On this disagreement between Pöggeler and von Herrmann, see also Seubold 1996, pp. 41–7.

42. Plato’s metaphysical understanding of the forms already lays the ground for Kripke’s influential definition of an essence as an invariant property that can be “rigidly designated” across all possible worlds. For more on Heidegger’s historical understanding of essences (which is closer to Hegel than to Plato, but lacks Hegel’s teleological commitments), see Thomson 2005, pp. 52–61. Owing to the nature of his project, Heidegger is much less concerned to get all the details correct in an historical genealogy of art than he is to show how modern aesthetics eclipses the true work of art so that, on the basis of this critique of aesthetics, he can try to describe and so suggest how the work of art might be encountered in a post-aesthetic way.

43. The essence of art, as we will see, is the essential tension whereby being becomes intelligible in time, so Pöggeler is right that recognizing this essence does not allow us to distinguish art from non-art. This essential tension conditions the becoming-intelligible of all things, Heidegger suggests, even technological works of art that efface and deny this struggle like the freeway interchange noted earlier. For this reason, such works can be subjected to immanent critiques which show that they deny, efface, or contradict their own condition of possibility.

44. Heidegger’s more specific point here is that the way things show themselves to us is not determined solely by us: Human beings do not simply get to decide the fundamental conceptual parameters through which we make sense of reality and ourselves. Instead, the great poets and thinkers receptively shape the lenses through which we see the world and ourselves by selectively appropriating from among the ways things show themselves. Even for the great poets and thinkers, then, the way that entities reveal their being is never entirely within human control or simply a product our own representational capacities. (See Thomson 2011, ch. 1.)

45. Heidegger describes the paradoxical movement at rest in a great work of art as “the constantly self-exceeding composure of the work’s movement” (PLT 50/GA5 36). This fundamental ontological instability which can be discovered in the inconspicuous movement of a great artwork is precisely what “The Origin of the Work of Art” describes as the “essential strife” between “earth” and “world.” For Heidegger, the preservation of this inconspicuous movement at rest in a work—e.g., in the paintings of Van Gogh, Cézanne, and Klee—is a sign of the highest artistic mastery, for it allows such works to convey rather than conceal the conditions of their own generation.

46. Hammermeister (2002, p. 183) picks up on Heidegger’s paradoxical description of the movement resting in a great artwork and suggests that: “Only because the work of art moves can it move us. Yet there is nothing restless about the work of art either. …[The artwork] must be thought of as simultaneously moving and at rest.” Mining a parallel vein, Harries (1998, p. 376) suggests that: “To be open to the earth is inevitably to be affected, moved, claimed. Heidegger’s talk of the earth thus gestures also toward the affective base without which all our talk of values or divinities is ultimately groundless… The step beyond nihilism is possible only as a recovery of the earth.”

47. Heidegger continues: “This letting the work be a work is what we call preservation [Bewahrung, i.e., the preservation of the ontological truth or phenomenologically dynamic happening] of the work.” (PLT 66/GA5 54) Such preservation happens as a creative and responsive disclosure of the seemingly inexhaustible truth embodied in a great work of art; such disclosure helps keep that truth open by living in its light and so developing it further.

48. Heidegger discusses the Ancient hypokeimenon and symbebêkos—which get reduced to the Medieval “substance and accidents” and the Modern “primary and secondary properties”—as well as Aristotle’s “formed matter” and Kant’s “unity of a sensory manifold” (see PLT 20–30/GA5 5–16). Here Heidegger is building on the contemporaneous lectures he gave between 1935 and 1936 on The Question Concerning the Thing (QT/GA41).

49. Thus, e.g., the last line of this quotation points to the way aesthetics serves enframing (as we saw in section 3.3). We have good reason to be skeptical of this description because, as Taylor Carman nicely puts it, “just as a useful thing is not a mere object with functional properties added on, neither is a work of art simply a useful thing with aesthetic qualities in addition.” See Carman, “Heidegger, Martin: Survey of Thought,”, vol. 2., p. 373. On Heidegger’s relation to architecture, see Sharr 2006.

50. From Heidegger’s perspective, the last explanation is the most problematic; it not only illustrates the ways in which aesthetics come to serve the “enframing” of all that is through neuroscience but also shows how the enigma of art gets “explained” away in the process. See Livingstone’s remarks at .

51. Heidegger assumes his original audience (viz., “the Art-Historical Society of Freiburg”) will recognize that his argument for art in “The Origin of the Work of Art” comes out of his complementary critique of aesthetics, because as Kelly (2003, p. 35) notes, “the title of the colloquium at which he first presented an early version of the ‘Origin’ essay (and which he coorganized) was entitled ‘The Overcoming of Aesthetics in the Question of Art.’” On Heidegger’s deliberate and strategic decision to begin writing in a more poetic style in order to do better justice to (what he has newly recognized as) the inherently polysemic nature of being as such, see Thomson 2017A.

52. We address the famous whose shoes controversy in section 4.

53. This famously chagrined Carnap, for whom such a seeming hypostatization of negation was the very epitome of metaphysical nonsense. Carnap completely misunderstood Heidegger, and Friedman (2000) argues that this sentence effectively represents the moment which split the so-called analytic and continental traditions asunder. Because “The Origin of the Work of Art” rethinks and develops this phenomenon of the “nothing” in terms of the “earth,” this essay helps us better understand what Heidegger was groping toward with that initially obscure formulation from 1929. The active “noth-ing” Heidegger is describing can be encountered phenomenologically in the suggestive glimmering of that which is not-yet a thing but which seems to beckon us to put it into words and thereby bring it fully into being (like philosophical midwives). Still, Heidegger transitions to the “earth” because this allows him to describe the way we encounter the texture-laden “rift-structure” of being better than the overly amorphous and textureless sounding “noth-ing.” For more on the philosophical motivations behind Heidegger’s controversial phenomenological descriptions of the “noth-ing” of the nothing, see Thomson 2021 and Thomson 2024 (esp. chs. 1, 3, and 8).

54. “From Van Gogh’s painting we cannot even determine where these shoes stand” (PLT 33/GA5 18)—or “to whom they belong” (GA5 18 note a), Heidegger adds in a note he made in the margins of a copy of the 1960 Reclam edition, clearly in response to Meyer Shapiro’s criticism. On this basis, Shapiro concluded that (1) “Heidegger changed his interpretation of Van Gogh’s painting” and (2) “ended up admitting that he was uncertain about whose shoes they were.” Meyer’s former conclusion is exaggerated (Heidegger retracts nothing essential from his phenomenological interpretation of Van Gogh, as we will see in section 4), and his second misses the point of Heidegger’s note, which is that no one (neither he nor Shapiro) can be certain about who originally broke in the shoes which Van Gogh painted. See Shapiro 1968(p. 142 note 9) and Shapiro 1994. The quotations above are taken from Craven 1997, p. 161. On Shapiro, see also Craven 1994.

55. Heidegger is not the only one who thinks that the key to the enduring appeal Van Gogh’s famous painting of “A Pair of Shoes” can be found in the poignant way in which the painting paradoxically depicts an absence making itself present. Cliff Edwards, who spent “many hours in Amsterdam’s Van Gogh Museum with this painting,” suggests that “Vincent, in these empty shoes, painted absence,” although, as we will see, Heidegger means something different by this than Edwards does (see Edwards 2004, pp. 52, 54).

56. As noted earlier, Klee became extremely important for the later Heidegger, who would spend many “hours [alone] with Klee’s paintings.” But when Heidegger’s art-historian friend Petzet helped make a television program about Klee, Heidegger watched it and then vociferously objected to the way that the “random movement of the camera forces the eye to take certain leaps that hinder an intensive, quiet viewing as well as a thoughtful staying-with (or a ‘lingering thinking-after,’ verweilendes Nachdenken), which each single work and the relations within it deserve.” Petzet was so convinced by Heidegger’s criticism that this technologically-mediated viewing necessarily “missed the tenderness and intimacy that flourish between Klee’s lines” that he resolved never again to make a television program about art (Petzet 1993, pp. 146, 150). For more on Heidegger’s relation to Klee, see Schmidt 2013. On Heidegger’s relation to such other modern artists as Ernst Barlach, Bernhard Heilinger, and Eduardo Chillida, see Mitchell 2010.

57. Even Shapiro eventually found it important to draw our attention to “[t]he thickness and heaviness of the impasto pigment substance, the emergence of the dark shoes from the shadow into the light, the irregular, angular patterns and surprisingly loosened laces extended beyond the silhouettes of the shoes” (1994, p. 146, emphasis added), all without ever realizing how close he was coming to Heidegger’s phenomenological interpretation of Van Gogh’s painting.

58. Some art historians are so convinced that such subliminal figures were intentional on Van Gogh’s part that their presence has been used not only to interpret his mental health but even to try to authenticate his disputed works. Personal experience suggests that some people can see these figures quite easily, while others apparently cannot. The scientific “skeptic,” Michael Shermer (2008), plausibly suggests that the tendency to make sense out of non-sense evolved in human beings because missing a real pattern potentially has much higher evolutionary costs than noticing a false one; e.g., to mistake the wind in the grass for a lion is much more dangerous than the reverse. Of course, making sense of what initially seems senseless also surely has immense evolutionary benefits (giving rise to science itself, e.g.!), and the art historians are surely right to suppose that at least some of the “patterns” in Van Gogh’s backgrounds are not in fact meaningless data (upon which one merely projects one’s own subjective associations, as in a Rorschach test). Still, Shermer’s hypothesis opens the door to the phenomenologically problematic possibility that only those who have inherited an evolutionarily non-universal tendency toward a kind of hyperactive pattern-recognition might be able to appreciate Heidegger’s point. If so, one interesting further question would be whether such a trait is more prevalent in artists, poets, sculptors, etc.? That might support Heidegger’s understanding of the essence of artistic creation, but it might also limit the force of his call for us to learn to practice “dwelling”—as a poetic sensitivity and openness to other possible meanings—if such an openness is largely hard-wired. The crucial question here, then, would be whether such an openness can be learned, or at least improved upon. And absent some specific empirical study of the matter, it is not clear how optimistic one is entitled to be here. As Vincent wrote to his brother Theo on 9 August 1882 (a famous correspondence which Heidegger read enthusiastically—in 1919 Heidegger mentions Van Gogh and Martin Luther as his two exemplars of authenticity): “They [our parents] will never [emphasis added] be able to understand what painting is. They cannot understand that the figure of a laborer—some furrows in a ploughed field, a bit of sand, sea and sky—are serious subjects, so difficult, but at the same time so beautiful, that it is indeed worthwhile to devote one’s life to expressing the poetry hidden in them.” (Van Gogh 1991, letter #226.)

59. In a birthday note to the to the poet René Char in 1971, Heidegger wrote of Cézanne that: “In the late work of the painter, the tension of emerging and not emerging has become onefold, transformed into a mysterious identity. Is there shown here a pathway that opens onto a belonging-together of poet and thinker?” (Quoted in Petzet 1993, pp. 143–4.) See below and Young’s unsurpassed treatment of Heidegger’s later work on art (in Young 2001). The understanding of art Young discovers in the later Heidegger can already be found in his more famous middle works, however, if one focuses on his interpretation of Van Gogh’s painting and not only on his better known understanding of the Greek temple.

60. A black and white reproduction of Klee’s “Saint from a Window” can be found in Young 2001, p. 160.

61. (Heidegger’s unpublished notes on Klee are partly reproduced by Seubold 1993; quotations taken from pp. 8, 11.) In his later works, Klee began to erase the lines that typically distinguish a painting’s foreground image from its background, and he populated this background with numerous other figures that enter into a viewer’s awareness to greater and lesser degrees. Thus Klee’s late works, Heidegger suggests, paint the usually inconspicuous tension of emerging and withdrawing, the usually unnoticed opposition of foreground and background which allows painting to work. The “cost” of Klee’s “semi-abstraction” (Young 2001, p. 163) seems to be that Klee’s paintings sacrifice the longstanding tradition of a clear and unambiguous central image. Of course, Klee is far from alone in bearing this “cost,” but his semi-abstraction did help open the door for the abstract and conceptual art movements that followed, the merits of which Heidegger remained more skeptical about, as his acquaintance with them was minimal (as Young 2001 shows). If, in the terms of the early Heidegger, Van Gogh helps lead us back from the presence of an on-hand object to the encounter with hands-on equipmentality, Klee seems to leave us half-submerged within such equipmentality. Or, to put this in a later Heideggerian light, one could say (with Young) that “whereas, like Cézanne, Klee thematizes the presencing of world, unlike Cézanne, the works [of Klee] explicitly present us with the presencing of other worlds as well.” (Young 2001, p. 162.) What Young says here of Cézanne can also be said of Van Gogh, whose work already showed such ontological pluralism to Heidegger (as we will see), helping to inspire his nascent postmodern thinking. (On the origins of Heidegger’s postmodernism, see also Thomson 2011 and 2017A.) Indeed, Van Gogh seems to be somewhere between Cézanne and Klee, in that Heidegger sees at least one other world slumbering in “A Pair of Shoes,” viz., the world of the farmer (to which we return below). In the terms the later Heidegger still uses, he says that Klee depicts “no object” but, instead, “the nothing coming to presence [Nichts Anwesendes]” (Seubold 1993, p. 11), which is precisely the insight that Heidegger finds in Van Gogh in the mid 1930s. For Heidegger, Van Gogh, Cézanne, and Klee also stand in close proximity to “East Asian ‘Art’”—specifically, to “Zen” painting (see e.g. this famous “Enso,” or circle, by the Zen master Hakuin)—which, as Heidegger points out, “is in itself not concerned with a ‘representation’ of what is, but rather with the approach of humanity to the enveloping nothingness” (ibid.).

62. For Heidegger, this audience is a group of “preservers” in whose lives the meaning of the work becomes profoundly important. These preservers are thus a group which the work first constitutes but also a group without which the work cannot accomplish any work at all.

63. Heidegger already anticipates his 1935 thinking of the essential conflict of earth and world in 1929, when he adds: “The nothing does not merely serve as the counterpart of beings; rather, it originally belongs to their essential unfolding [a later note specifies: ‘the essential unfolding of being’] as such.” (P 91/GA9 115)

64. This is true only for as long as the artwork “lives.” For Heidegger all artwork has a finite lifespan, since the preservation of the world of meaning it opens depends not only on its materiality but also on “preservers” who struggle to keep its world open by living in its light and creatively and responsively disclosing its significance. For a clear phenomenological development of Heidegger’s view, see Wrathall 2006, pp. 71–87.

65. Although Heidegger toned down his rhetorical presentation of such “conflicts” in his later work, this Heraclitean tension of unified opposites is maintained even in his much less overtly agonistic thinking of the (now dual) oppositions that join the reconceived “earth” to “the heavens” and the “mortals” to “the divinities” (along two different axes) in his later thinking of “the fourfold” in essays such as “The Thing” and “Building Dwelling Thinking” (both in Poetry, Language, Thought). Nonetheless, the “earth” Heidegger refers to in his later “fourfold” is quite different from the “earth” in “The Origin of the Work of Art”; put simply, the earth loses much of its inexhaustibility, which Heidegger transfers to the fourfold as a whole.

66. The “earth” is Heidegger’s response to the problem that this move seems to make all creation ex nihilo, as we will see.

67. This helps explain why Heidegger placed Klee “higher than Picasso” (Seubold 1993, p. 6). While Klee’s semi-abstraction brings this tension between revealing and concealing itself to the fore (and so teaches us about the necessarily partial nature of perception and our experience of intelligibility more generally), Picasso’s cubism seems to follow the Modern subjectivistic impulse toward total control by seeking to represent all the hidden aspects of a figure simultaneously.

68. As Heidegger puts it: “What happens here? What is at work in the work? Van Gogh’s painting is the revelation [Eröffnung] of what equipment, the pair of farmer shoes, is in truth. This entity steps out here into the unconcealment of its being. This unconcealment is what the Greeks called alêtheia.” (PLT 36/GA5 21) Manifesting the tension between earth and world, the shoes in Van Gogh’s painting emerge from the background to which they nevertheless continue to belong. In the 1956 “Addendum” to “The Origin of the Work of Art,” Heidegger refers to this dynamic union of “clearing and concealing” whereby being becomes intelligible in time as “the movement of the clearing of self-concealment as such” (PLT 84/GA5 71-2). For more on Van Gogh’s transformative phenomenology of things, see Longtin 2017.

69. Given the way Heidegger moves from a particular ontic work of art to the ontological truth of art in general, it is probably not be a coincidence that he seems to generalize from his description of the nothing that emerges from Van Gogh’s particular (“ontic”) painting of “A Pair of Shoes” when he makes the following, ontological claim about the structure of intelligibility: “And yet—beyond what is, not apart from but, rather, before it, there is still something else that happens. In the midst of all that is an open place comes to presence. There is a clearing. Thought from the perspective of entities, this clearing has more being than entities do. This open center is therefore not surrounded by what is; rather, the clearing center itself encircles all that is, like the nothing which we scarcely know.” (PLT 53/GA5 39–40)

70. This holds true, moreover, whether these worlds are more monolithic historical epochs implicitly held together by great works of art like the Greek temple, or initially much smaller and (insofar as Heidegger’s ambition takes root in his successors) ultimately more pluralistic historical worlds like the one brought together around Van Gogh’s painting by Heidegger’s attempt to “preserve” its phenomenological truth.

71. Here Heidegger’s views have obviously been deeply influenced by Nietzsche’s early view that a fundamental conflict between Dionysian and the Apollonian forces is the engine driving the unfolding of history—an opposition Heidegger traces back to Hölderlin’s positing of a basic distinction between Greek “fire” and German “clarity,” as Young (2001, pp. 40–1) shows. (But Young exaggerates when he suggests that Hölderlin’s view is “identical” with Heidegger’s thinking of the earth/world duality.)

72. This, however, is the point of Heidegger’s understanding of the ancient Greek temple. What confuses matters here is that Heidegger seems to have gotten stuck in a rhetorical habit by the time he introduces the Greek temple and Tragedy, and thus misleadingly suggests that: “A building, a Greek temple, displays nothing.” (PLT 41/GA5 27) And: “In the tragedy nothing is staged or displayed theatrically…” (PLT 43/GA5 29). In the former case at least, Heidegger’s point really is the more straightforward one that the Greek temple is not a representation of anything (since there was not anything preceding the temple that it sought to re-present). The temple is thus quite different from Van Gogh’s painting of the shoes, which for Heidegger really represents the nothing.

73. Although Magritte’s painting initially appears “as simple as a page borrowed from a botanical manual,” as Foucault suggests (1983, p. 19), the mysteries of the painting are quickly multiplied by the vague pronoun reference in “This is not a pipe”: “This” could refer to the image of the pipe, the words beneath it, or the entire ensemble.

74. It is true that for Heidegger Van Gogh’s painting is not wholly representational—and should not, in the end, be understood representationally—but this is because it really represents the nothing, and does so in a way that exceeds and so transcends aesthetic representation from within. “The picture which shows the farmer’s shoes…[does] not only [emphasis added] make manifest what these isolated entities are as isolated entities… [Rather, the picture allows] unconcealment as such to happen in relation to the totality of what is” (PLT 56/GA5 43). Heidegger’s “if they manifest entities at all” has been deliberately excised from this quotation because the doubt it expresses stems from the fact that in this quotation he is also discussing Meyer’s poem “Fountain” (the second elision), which Heidegger suggests (perhaps falsely, see Mulhall 2019) might not in fact represent an actual fountain the way Van Gogh’s painting of “A Pair of Shoes” does represent an actual pair of shoes (among the other things that it does). Heidegger’s doubt thus suggests that he thinks Meyer’s poem is more like the completely non-representational Greek temple than the initially representational painting.

75. Here we see the deeper point behind Heidegger’s aforementioned phenomenological dictum: “What seems natural to us is presumably just the familiarity of a long-established custom which has forgotten the unfamiliarity from which it arose.” (PLT 24/GA5 9) See also the emphasis Rorty (1991) places on this important affinity between Nietzsche and Heidegger.

76. Another way to experience this “essential strife” of earth and world in Van Gogh’s painting might be to notice how the painting’s subtly rich and dynamic background not only supports but also envelops the foreground image of the shoes. The shoes in the foreground belong so integrally to their background that they can even appear to recede back into it. Notice, for example, how both shoes (but especially the left one) seem almost to melt back into their own black shadows, and the way the lightest colors “behind” the shoes bleed over across the edges of these shoes in Van Gogh’s thick brushwork (especially between the two shoes and along the right edge of the right shoe). In such ways, as Heidegger suggests, “the earth…tends to draw the world into itself and keep it there” (PLT 49/GA5 35).

77. In Being and Time (1927), the claim that existence always-already “stands-out” into temporally-structured intelligibility is presented as a phenomenological description of how we ordinarily encounter ourselves when we are not paying attention to the encounter. In “The Origin of the Work of Art” (1936), however, such “existence” no longer simply describes the way we always-already are; it now becomes an existential task to become Dasein by realizing what we already are implicitly. Heidegger thus writes that the goal of “The Origin of the Work of Art”—“the step toward which everything that has been said up to now leads” (PLT 66/GA5 54)—is to help us learn from art to become what we are: To “resolutely” own up to what human existence most truly is, Heidegger writes, means entering into the essential conflict of “earth and world” and thereby encountering the “self-transcendence” of existence in “the sober standing-within the extraordinary awesomeness of the truth that is happening in the work” (PLT 67–8/GA5 55). “The Origin of the Work of Art” thus suggests that art is a particularly direct and revealing actualization of the human essence. For, to be a human being, in Heidegger’s terms, is to realize oneself as a world-discloser, struggling to world the earth in the right sort of way (as the next section explains). On this perfectionist issue of how we learn to become what we are, see Thomson 2004b, Thomson 2013B.

78. Heidegger does clearly think, however, that the earth allows itself to be brought into its own, i.e., that there are ways of gestalting the inchoate forms that the earth offers us that best respect what was there, e.g., when Michelangelo gestalts David from that piece of marble, or when Heidegger’s gestalts (what we will call) “the old woman who lived in the shoe” in Van Gogh’s particular painting (see section 4 below), or even, perhaps, when we gestalt the nothing in Heidegger’s own essay. Indeed, such a creative “truth event”—in which entities and human beings come “into their own” simultaneously (for it is not only the marble but also Michelangelo himself who is realized in this act of sculptural world-disclosure)—is what Heidegger means by Ereignis, hence the aptness of the otherwise strange translation of this later term of art as “enowning” rather than simply “event.” (From this perspective, we can also see that the older “event of appropriation” risks suggesting something more subjectivistic than Heidegger intends.) On the meaning of such transformative events for Heidegger, see Thomson 2011 (pp. 22–5), 2013B, and 2017B.

79. It is perhaps not a coincidence that Heidegger’s thinking of the mysterious and yet familiar “rift structure” that joins earth and world should emerge out of his phenomenological meditation on Van Gogh’s painting of a pair of shoes; shoes are precisely the place where our worlds ordinarily make contact with the earth.

80. Heidegger thus makes the case that creation can be grounded no longer in geographical but in ontological indigeny in his “Memorial Address” (in DT).

81. Or, to take another example, think of the way our institutions of higher education increasingly seek to make students into whatever society currently values most, rather than helping them identify, cultivate, and develop their intrinsic skills and capacities and yoke these to serving their generation’s emerging needs. (Heidegger’s arguments to this effect are developed in Thomson 2005, Ch. 4.)

82. Heidegger does not rule out a poetic receptiveness within technological settings but, rather, suggests that such settings do undermine receptivity, and that recognizing how they do so helps us to find meaning within them nevertheless. For a revealing analysis of how such meaning can be discovered within technological settings (as well as how they work against it), see Crawford 2009.

83. What the later Heidegger thus suggests is a fundamental ontological pluralism. We need to be sensitive enough to intrinsic meanings to be able to cut reality at the joints, as it were, but, in each case, there will be more than one way of cutting reality at these joints (or of gestalting Heidegger’s “rift-structure”). This means, for example, that, just as a talented artisan can make more than one thing from a single piece of wood, so there was also more than one form slumbering in the marble from which Michelangelo freed David, and more than one meaningful career open to a talented student. Like the neo-Aristotelian view of “open resoluteness” (Ent-schlossenheit) Heidegger developed in Being and Time, his later view of active receptivity (Gelassenheit) suggests a kind of ethical and aesthetic phronêsis or practical wisdom. The point (Thomson 2004 argues) is that, rather than getting hung up looking for the one right answer—and, when we finally despair of finding that right answer, rebounding back to the relativistic view that no answer is better than any other (or concluding nihilistically that intrinsic meanings are an obsolete myth)—we should instead cultivate the recognition that in most situations there will be more than one right answer to questions of what to do or how to go on. The hermeneutic principle to follow—in ethics as well as aesthetics—is that there is more than one intrinsic meaning to be found. For, if being is inexhaustible, capable of yielding meaning again and again, then the intrinsic meanings of things must be plural (however paradoxical that initially seems, given our obsession with formal systems capable of monosemic exactness).

84. In Heidegger’s terms of art, this means understanding the “being of entities” in terms of “being as such” (Thomson 2005, p. 164).

85. Hence, the humble but difficult “task” (Aufgabe) Heidegger thus sets for himself and for us in “The Origin of the Work of Art,” as he rather mysteriously suggests, is simply “to see the riddle…that art itself is,” not “to solve the riddle” (PLT 79/GA5 67), or to encounter for ourselves the seemingly inexhaustible abundance of possibilities that great art discloses, not to try to yoke them all together into a totalizing framework.

86. See EHP, pp. 51–65; “The Origin of the Work of Art” builds on the same view: “Language, by naming beings for the first time, first brings beings to word and to appearance.” (PLT 73/GA5 61)

87. Shapiro misses this point; his Marxian presuppositions lead him to assume that “Heidegger’s argument throughout refers to the shoes of a class of persons” (Shapiro 1994, p. 150, emphasis added).

88. See Shapiro, “A Note on Heidegger and van Gogh,” in Theory and Philosophy of Art, p. 136.

89. See Heinrich Wiegand Petzet, Encounters and Dialogues with Martin Heidegger: 1929–1976, P. Emad and K. Maly, trans. (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1993), p. 134.

90. Shapiro (1968) explains this background and gives the date of his letter to Heidegger.

91. As Babich (2003, p. 155) reports, Shapiro’s objection was widely understood by art historians as having “conclusively discredited Heidegger’s essay… by discounting its objective legitimacy or accuracy.” The strange fact that philosophers and art historians typically reach very different judgments about the significance of Heidegger’s alleged attribution error has itself become the impetus for an interesting philosophical reflection (see Kelly 2003, pp. 20–54).

92. The notable exception here is Martin (2006, p. 104), where Martin addresses this “fateful omen for Heideggerian historiography.”

93. Derrida recognizes this political subtext and suggests that Shapiro’s reduction of earth to soil misses precisely what remained most unorthodox and challenging about Heidegger’s Nazism, viz., his philosophical attempt to replace the Nazi’s identity-defining philosopheme of the blood-drenched “soil” with his own conception of the inexhaustible, non-totalizable, but nonetheless existence supporting “earth.” (See Derrida 1987, pp. 272–3, and the more detailed discussion in Thomson 2005, p. 135 note 103.)

94. One problem with such hermeneutic denegation detection is that it becomes very difficult to circumscribe its legitimate application: To someone like Derrida, every “clearly,” “obviously,” “of course,” “to be sure,” etc., begins to look like an author’s unconscious confession of a repressed uncertainty (except, apparently, when it is Derrida himself who is employing such emphatic expressions of certainty). The specific problem here, moreover, is that Shapiro overlooks the fact that philosophers like Heidegger are trained to anticipate and respond to critics’ likely objections. (Such training, which comes from studying the history of philosophy, gets powerfully reinforced if one becomes well-known enough for one’s own work to become the frequent subject of the criticisms of others, as happened to Heidegger with the publication of Being and Time in 1927.) In the sentence in question, Heidegger shows that he recognizes that he is saying something that will sound idiosyncratic to readers, and how could he not? The sympathetic way to respond to his denial of projection, then, is to look for an alternative explanation for his description of the farming woman—a figure which, his next sentence goes on to say, he literally saw in his own extended phenomenological encounter with Van Gogh’s painting. That is what we are doing here.

95. Shapiro’s own Marxian-Freudian interpretation of Van Gogh’s painting—which holds that for “an artist to isolate his worn shoes as the subject of a picture is for him to convey a concern with the fatalities of his social being” (Shapiro 1968, p. 140)—seems equally open to the charge of subjective projection. And Shapiro’s further development of this way of interpreting Van Gogh’s painting—which unblinkingly suggests that the shoes are “morbid,” “deviant,” “deformed,” “unsightly,” “depressed and broken” (Shapiro 1994, 147)—does little to diminish such an impression.

96. It is perhaps unfortunate that the amazing subtleties of Van Gogh’s use of color and brush-stroke are barely intimated by even the highest-contrast reproductions of the famous work; Van Gogh’s paintings simply must be seen in person in order to be fully appreciated. Heidegger would probably celebrate this fact, however, as another sense in which Van Gogh’s painting resists both representation and the efficient ordering of late-modern enframing, which makes it easy to quickly see all of Van Gogh’s paintings on-line and yet difficult to meaningfully encounter any of them.

97. Kockelmans (1987, p. 128) makes essentially the same mistake as Shapiro when he confidently asserts of Heidegger’s description that “it is obvious that all of this cannot be seen in the picture” and so concludes that Heidegger is not “describing” Van Gogh’s painting at all. As we shall see, Heidegger is indeed describing his experience of Van Gogh’s painting (an experience grounded phenomenologically in his discernment of the figure of “the little old woman” emerging from the shoe on the right).

98. It is, e.g., clearly what Heidegger seeks to do when he describes the farming woman Van Gogh painted (as well as what we seek to do here by describing the nothing Heidegger himself evokes). We can say that this figure is not obvious because no one has ever mentioned it before. Even if it seems obvious in retrospect (as masterful artistic gestalts often do), we can nevertheless imagine gestalting those bits of color and paint otherwise (at least subtly so). This, then, is quite different from a “hidden eye picture” or even from the subliminal images Mark Tansey cleverly conceals in the background of his work, which can be hard to see but, once seen, cannot be seen in any other way; e.g., see his “West Face,” 2004). In effect, Heidegger is offering us his own creative gestalt, his own way of “worlding” this bit of earth, in order to exemplify the very view he is seeking to convey, a creative disclosure that “preserves” the multiple simultaneous (and thus ontological pluralistic) postmodern truth disclosed by Van Gogh’s painting.

99. (See Thomson 2011, ch. 7.) As Heidegger laconically puts this rather complex point: “Truth happens in Van Gogh’s painting. That does not mean that something on-hand is correctly portrayed but, rather, that the totality of what-is, world and earth in their counter-play, attains unconcealment in the becoming manifest of the equipmental being of the shoe-equipment” (PLT 56/GA5 43).

100. Derrida and Babich both seek to unsettle the controversy by, in effect, developing Heidegger’s suggestion that we cannot tell with certainty “to whom [the shoes] belong” (GA5 18 note a). Derrida (1987, pp. 257–382) dedicates more than one hundred pages to multiplying a seemingly unending succession of skeptical questions which seem meant to suggest that the identity of the shoes is radically undecidable (since we cannot even be sure to which painting Heidegger referred, or whether the shoes in question form a pair, and so on). Babich argues that, even if we grant to Shapiro that Van Gogh owned the shoes in the painting, this does not mean they were Van Gogh’s shoes in the appropriate sense. On the basis of the same historiographical evidence Shapiro appeals to (Van Gogh’s letter to his brother, Gauguin’s account of Van Gogh’s studio, etc.), Babich shows that Van Gogh bought the pair of shoes in question not in order to wear them himself but rather, “like the rough beer steins Van Gogh also collected, …in order to paint them” (Babich 2003, pp. 157–8), thus leaving open the question of who originally broke them in. Yet, this line of reasoning is open to the game-changing response that, as Kelly (2003, p. 51) starkly puts it, “The Painting is van Gogh’s, according to Shapiro, because he [Van Gogh] invested himself in it, because his subjectivity is embodied (not merely represented) in it. This idea—that embodied subjectivity is constitutive of what modern art is—is what Shapiro affirms and Heidegger denies.” Although Kelly subtly changes the terms of the debate here, he nicely brings us to the crux of the issue: For Shapiro (on Kelly’s reconstruction), Van Gogh’s very act of painting the shoes transformed them into an expression of his own subjectivity, whereas, for Heidegger, Van Gogh’s painting shows us a way beyond the subject/object metaphysics that Shapiro clearly presupposes. Still, the most basic problem for all those who would defend Heidegger by arguing that the shoes originally did (or could have) belonged to a farmer is that this line of defense overlooks Shapiro’s most telling objection. (This is quite understandable, because the objection does not come through at all clearly in Shapiro’s work. The understanding of it presented here would not have been achieved without personal conversations with the art historian David Craven, who interviewed Shapiro several times, see Craven 1997.) Shapiro’s seemingly incontrovertible objection is that the shoes Van Gogh painted could not have been used by a farmer while farming because the Dutch farmers Van Gogh painted wore wooden clogs in the field, not leather shoes, which would have quickly rotted from the damp conditions in the fields (at least before the later advent of rubber souls). J. Kockelmans (1985, pp. 126–32) implicitly acknowledges the force of this criticism by attempting to dodge it, claiming that Heidegger is not in fact describing Van Gogh’s painting but only using it as a phenomenological jumping off point to evoke the entirely different shoes of the farmers with which he was familiar. This reading not only misses Heidegger’s use of the “nothing” but, more seriously, fails to understand the way Heidegger’s phenomenology seeks to build a direct bridge from the ontic to the ontological (a bridge that cannot be built by the kind of free-associations Kockelmans attributes to him). Kockelmans seems to presuppose here that the ontic and ontological are heterogeneous domains (again understandably, as this was a central tenet of the orthodox Heideggerian scholars of the last generation and continues to be proclaimed by influential critics such as Habermas), but such a mistaken view would destroy the bridge between the ontic and ontological domains and so risk placing Heideggerian phenomenology beyond the realm of any meaningful kind of communal adjudication and development. (For more on Heidegger’s phenomenological method for moving back and forth between ontic entities and the ontological structures that condition them, see Thomson 2013A.)

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