Notes to Kant and Hume on Causality

1. Lewis White Beck’s well-known essay, “A Prussian Hume and a Scottish Kant” (1978), sketches these events in Kant’s intellectual development and firmly decides for the latter alternative. In footnote 20 of this work Beck credits Robert Paul Wolff (1960) especially for developing the idea of “Kant’s debt to Hume via Beattie”; in this note, and the following one, Beck also provides further helpful discussion (and references) concerning the relationship between Kant, Hume, and Beattie.

2. There are a number of other passages in Kant’s 1766 essay which are also clearly reminiscent of the Enquiry, and this much, moreover, is not controversial. The existence of such parallels is even emphasized by Beck (1978)—who, however, maintains that they do not show that Kant directly derived his ideas from the Enquiry. We follow the discussion of Dreams of a Spirit-Seer by Alison Laywine (1993, chapter 6) in thinking that these parallels do suggest that Kant very likely had Hume’s Enquiry firmly in mind in his essay of 1766, especially when read against the background of Kant’s earlier discussion of the same topic in the essay on Negative Magnitudes. The remainder of the present section will provide further evidence in support of this view.

3. The distinction between judgments of perception and judgments of experience, which occurs only in the Prolegomena, is a particularly vexed and controversial subject in Kant scholarship; and it seems, in any case, that Kant abandoned this distinction in the second edition of the Critique in favor of the view that all genuine judgments must be objectively valid (see especially § 19 of the second edition Transcendental Deduction). Nevertheless, Kant retains a central distinction between mere “perception” and objective “experience”. Indeed, Kant reformulates the general principle of the Analogies of Experience in the second edition to read (B218): “Experience is possible only by means of the representation of a necessary connection of perceptions”. This formulation (unlike its predecessor in the first edition at A176) is very close to the last-quoted passage from the Prolegomena (4, 305; 58). [We note, for future reference, that the three Analogies of Experience are, first, a principle of the permanence of substance, second, a general principle that every alteration must have a cause, and third, a principle of community or causal interaction between simultaneously existing substances.]

4. In a preliminary section to the Transcendental Deduction (from which we have quoted before) Kant makes essentially the same point (in both editions), although without explicitly naming Hume (A91–92/B123–123):

If one thought to extricate oneself from the difficulty of these investigations by saying that experience unceasingly offers examples of such rule-governedness of appearances, which provide sufficient inducement for abstracting the concept of cause and, at the same time, for thereby proving the objective validity of such a concept, then one is failing to notice that the concept of cause can never arise in this way. Rather, it must either be grounded completely a priori in the understanding or be entirely abandoned as a mere phantom of the brain. For this concept positively demands that something A be such that something else B follow from it necessarily and in accordance with an absolutely universal rule. Appearances certainly provide cases from which a rule is possible in accordance with which something usually happens, but never that the succession is necessary; therefore, a dignity pertains to the synthesis of cause and effect that cannot be empirically expressed at all, namely, that the effect does not merely follow upon the cause but is posited through it and follows from it. The strict universality of the rule is certainly not a property of empirical rules, which, through induction, can acquire nothing but comparative universality: i.e., extensive utility.

5. We believe that Hume’s discussion of induction in the Treatise, Book 1, part 3, section 6 is completely parallel to the discussion in the Enquiry, section 4, part 2; in particular, Hume’s position is skeptical in both works. The leading contemporary representative of the non-skeptical interpretation of this argument, Don Garrett (1997), maintains, on the contrary, that Hume, in these sections of the Treatise and the Enquiry, is only making the purely descriptive claim that “reasoning” cannot be the cause of our inductive inferences.

6. We believe, contrary to non-skeptical interpretations like Garrett’s (note 5 above), that Hume’s appeal to circularity here is normative or justificatory: Hume is saying that a circular argument for the principle of the uniformity of nature is simply begging the question and, as such, it is a fallacious argument—not simply one that happens to be causally inefficacious.

7. The naturalistic interpretation initiated by Norman Kemp Smith (1941), and then followed, for example, by Barry Stroud (1977), emphasizes Hume’s positive descriptive account of human nature. The main import of Hume’s treatment of induction, on this view, is to show that custom or habit takes the place of reason in enabling us to make inductive inferences. For both Kemp Smith and Stroud, however, there is a preliminary skeptical stage in Hume’s argument (showing the insufficiency of the evidence provided by reason for the principle of the uniformity of nature) which serves as a vehicle, as it were, for establishing the impotence of reason and the primacy of natural beliefs. Radical skepticism, on this view, is a preliminary exercise which is then left behind once and for all. (For further discussion, and criticism, of this “vehicle view” see De Pierris 2001, 2002, 2015.) Recent non-skeptical interpretations like Garrett (1997), and, following him, David Owen (1999), take naturalism one step further and deny that there is even a preliminary skeptical stage. The discussion of this issue by Henry Allison (2008) is complex, but he expresses nuanced and qualified agreement with the Garrett/Owen reading of Treatise, Book 1, part 3, section 6 and parallel texts.

8. Beck 1978 is a paradigmatic and influential articulation of this wide-spread view. Beck helpfully distinguishes between the “every-event-some-cause” principle and the “same-cause-same-effect” principle. He argues that, whereas Hume raises doubts concerning both principles, Kant only intends to vindicate the first in the Second Analogy. Beck also places particular emphasis on the fact that Hume discusses the first principle solely in the Treatise, Book 1, part 3, section 3—as the “general maxim in philosophy, that whatever begins to exist, must have a cause of existence” (T; SBN 78). By contrast, the Enquiry is concerned solely with the second principle (“same-cause-same-effect”). Thus, according to Beck, Kant has no serious disagreement with Hume about this second principle—and no serious disagreement, therefore, about the status of particular synthetic a posteriori causal laws. [Indeed, it is for this reason, on Beck’s view, that it must have been Kant’s reading of Beattie’s discussion of the Treatise in 1772, rather than his reading of the Enquiry approximately ten years earlier, which first woke Kant from his “dogmatic slumber” (compare note 1 above).] Others who have defended a position similar to Beck’s include H. J. Paton (1936), Robert Paul Wolff (1963), Gerd Buchdahl (1969, 1972 [1974]), Graham Bird (1962), James Van Cleve (1973), and Henry Allison (1983, 2004). Notable exceptions to this trend are Arthur Melnick (1973) and Paul Guyer (1987, 2005: chapter 2, 2008: chapter 2)—both of whom defend the view that causal relations as described in the Second Analogy require the existence of particular (empirical) causal laws as well. Nevertheless, both Melnick and Guyer also appear to hold that the epistemic status of such laws, as far as the Second Analogy is concerned, can only be broadly inductive (but see also note 9 below).

9. This point is urged in Friedman 1992a, in opposition, especially, to views like those defended by Buchdahl (1969) and Allison (1983)—according to which causal relations between individual events, for Kant, do not necessarily involve causal laws at all. Allison responds in his 1996, chapter 6; see also the corresponding discussion in Allison 2004. Guyer (2008, chapter 2) articulates a view that is intermediate between our conception and the Buchdahl/Allison view. As suggested in note 8 above, Guyer, unlike Buchdahl, takes (empirical) causal laws to be necessary for causal relations; like Buchdahl, however, he takes the a priority and necessity of such laws, for Kant, to rest wholly on the purely regulative function of reflective judgment. The essence of our view, by contrast, is that precisely this a priority and necessity has a crucial constitutive dimension, resting on Kant’s discussion of the category of necessity in the Postulates of Empirical Thought: it is for precisely this reason, in particular, that the (empirical) causal laws in question have a more than merely inductive status. (For our conception of the role of reflective judgment see note 52 below.)

10. A few lines later, however, Kant refers to “the dynamical law of causality” (in the singular) and “the possibility grounded thereon of inferring a priori from some given existence (a cause) to another existence (the effect)” (A228/B280). Here, as the context makes clear, he is referring to the general principle of the Second Analogy (that every event b must have a cause a)—but, at the same time, he is also making it clear that this general principle “grounds” the possibility of particular causal laws (of the form every event of type A must always be followed by an event of type B) which allow us to “infer a priori” the existence of an effect (b) from the existence of a cause (a). Thus, once again, the general causal principle and particular causal laws are inextricably connected for Kant (compare note 9 above, together with the paragraph to which it is appended).

11. For a detailed discussion of Kant’s treatment of the law of universal gravitation in § 38 of the Prolegomena see Friedman 1992b, chapter 4, and compare Friedman 2012.

12. Kant formulates his three “laws of mechanics” slightly differently from Newton’s three laws of motion: he does not formulate Newton’s second law (F = ma) explicitly, and Kant’s first law is the conservation of the total quantity of matter rather than the law of inertia. (For both Newton and Kant the third law is the equality of action and reaction.) We shall return to this matter in note 32 below.

13. Beck (1978, note 45) explains:

Kant repeatedly asserts that empirical laws cannot be derived from a priori principles of the understanding, yet he believed some of them to be necessary. Those are the ones involved in an overall theory whose principles are derived from the a priori principles of “rational science” or “pure physics”.

Beck also refers to the Metaphysical Foundations in this connection. However, by not clearly distinguishing between the status of synthetic a priori laws of pure natural science (like the laws of motion) and synthetic a posteriori empirical laws made possible thereby (like the law of gravitation), Beck (in our view) thereby misses the crucial point of the present section: that even synthetic a posteriori laws can acquire a material, empirical, or causal necessity in virtue of the way in which they are “determined”, in turn, by synthetic a priori laws.

14. In Newton’s explanation of his initial statement of the third law communication of motion by impact figures prominently (Principia, 417):

If some body impinging upon another body changes the motion of that body in any way by its own force, then, by the force of the other body (because of the equality of their mutual pressures), it also will in turn undergo the same change in its own motion in the opposite direction.

Then, in the following Scholium to the Laws of Motion, Newton discusses the experimental evidence for the fundamental law of the communication of motion by impact (equal changes of momentum experienced by the two bodies) at considerable length (Principia, 425–427). (Newton derives a general principle of the conservation of momentum as Corollary 3 to the Laws of Motion.)

15. See Principia, 404:

Because of the inertia of matter, every body is only with difficulty put out of its state either of resting or of moving. Consequently, inherent force [vis insita] may also be called by the very significant name of force of inertia [vis inertiae]. Moreover, a body exerts this force only during a change of its state, caused by another force impressed upon it, and this exercise of force is, depending on the viewpoint, both resistance and impetus: resistance insofar as the body, in order to maintain its state, strives against the impressed force, and impetus insofar as the same body, yielding only with difficulty to the force of a resisting obstacle, endeavors to change the state of that obstacle.

It appears, then, that the force of bodies to which Newton refers in his explanation of the third law of motion (note 14 above) is precisely the force of inertia.

16. In Locke’s empiricist version of this philosophy, if we could (per impossibile) penetrate into the inner microscopic constitution of bodies (their “real essences”), we would know without experience (in Locke’s terminology, “without Trial”) the causal connections among bodies. For example, Locke writes (Essay, IV, III, 25):

I doubt not but if we could discover the Figure, Size, Texture, and Motion of the minute Constituent parts of any two Bodies, we should know without Trial several of their Operations one upon another, as we do now the Properties of a Square, or a Triangle.

In this way, despite his empiricism, Locke preserves the rationalist ideal (as in Descartes and Leibniz, for example) of an a priori demonstrative science of nature. Yet Locke, as an empiricist, is deeply skeptical about our ability ever to have access to the exact configurations of the hidden microscopic parts in question. Hence, the ideal of a genuine “Science” or “Knowledge” of nature is in fact unattainable, and we must instead be content with mere “Belief” or “Opinion” based on experiments. For example, Locke writes (Essay, IV, XII, 10):

I deny not, but a Man accustomed to rational and regular Experiments shall be able to see farther into the Nature of Bodies, and guess righter at their yet unknown Properties, than one, that is a Stranger to them: But yet, as I have said, this is but Judgment and Opinion, not Knowledge and Certainty. This way of getting, and improving our Knowledge of Substances only by Experience and History … makes me suspect, that natural Philosophy is not capable of being made a Science.

17. For further discussion of this point see Howard Stein 1967: 179.

18. I. Bernard Cohen, in the “Guide to Newton’s Principia” included in his translation (1999), explains that the terms “intension” and “remission” go back to late-medieval doctrine referring to qualities that “undergo an intension or remission by degrees” (Cohen 1999: 200). See Alexandre Koyré 1965, chapter 6, for a discussion of how the Rules Newton added to the second and third editions were developed in response to the rationalist proponents of the mechanical philosophy.

19. Rule 4, added to the third edition in 1726, makes it even more explicit that inductive generalization is to be rigorously extended without interference from hypotheses (such as those of the mechanical philosophy), so that only further observed phenomena can then limit the truly universal scope of the resulting generalizations (Principia, 796):

In experimental philosophy, propositions gathered from phenomena by induction should be considered either exactly or very nearly true notwithstanding any contrary hypotheses, until yet other phenomena make such propositions either more exact or liable to exceptions.

The explanation of Rule 4 reads (ibid.): “This rule should be followed so that arguments based on induction may not be nullified by hypotheses”. Koyré (1965: chapter 6) argues that Rule 4 was added to the third edition precisely because defenders of the mechanical philosophy still persisted in rejecting universal gravitation after the second edition.

20. Thus, for example, after sketching the inductive argument for unrestricted universal gravitation, Newton continues (Principia, 796):

Indeed, the argument from phenomena will be even stronger for universal gravity than for the impenetrability of bodies, for which, of course, we have not a single experiment, and not even an observation, in the case of the heavenly bodies.

21. Similarly, Hume takes the law of gravitation to be on an equal footing with the inductively arrived at general principles of elasticity, cohesion of parts, and communication of motion by impulse (EHU 4.12; SBN 30–31):

Elasticity, gravity, cohesion of parts, communication of motion by impulse, these are probably the ultimate causes and principles which we shall ever discover in nature; and we may esteem ourselves sufficiently happy, if by accurate enquiry and reasoning, we can trace up the particular phenomena to, or near to, these general principles.

22. The similarity appears even more striking when we note that Newton formulates the same supposition in Query 31 of the Opticks as “Nature will be very conformable to her self and very simple” (Opticks, 397). For further discussion of the evidence for taking Hume’s inductive method to be modelled on Newton’s Rule 3, and for taking Hume’s principle of the uniformity of nature to be modelled on the supposition Newton offers in his explanation of Rule 3, see De Pierris 2006, 2015: chapter 3.

23. Tom L. Beauchamp and Alexander Rosenberg (1981) neglect the circularity argument and maintain, following Kemp Smith (1941), that Hume is a skeptic only concerning the use of a priori reason in causal inferences: Hume merely intends to show that there is no demonstrative argument for the principle of the uniformity of nature. Annette Baier (1991) endorses this view and adds an interpretation of the circularity argument according to which it is a reductio ad absurdum of rationalism. We believe, however, that the argument is aimed precisely at Newton’s (and Hume’s own) use of the principle of the uniformity of nature—and, therefore, that this situation brings out the mutual autonomy of Hume’s two standpoints (the standpoint of radical skepticism and the natural standpoint of science and common life) especially clearly: see notes 25 and 50 below.

24. Robert Fogelin (1985) emphasizes Hume’s radical skepticism concerning induction, and he also argues that Hume’s radical skeptical argument has the consequence, ultimately, that necessity is no longer an essential ingredient in our idea of causation: Hume’s view of causation thus reduces to a pure regularity conception according to which causation is based solely on constant conjunction. We believe, on the contrary, that necessity remains an essential ingredient in Hume’s conception of causation and that it has normative force—even though it is projected from a subjective feeling of determination (an impression of reflection) arising from our inductive inferences themselves. For further discussion see De Pierris 2002, 2015.

25. Hume’s skepticism about our knowledge of causal relations is very different from Locke’s and, more generally, so is his conception of causal necessity. As we have seen (note 16 above), Locke preserves the rationalist ideal of the mechanical philosophy of an a priori demonstrative science of nature, but he is skeptical about ever attaining it. Hume, by contrast, entirely rejects this a priori demonstrative model of causation and replaces the rationalist ideal, once and for all, with the opposing Newtonian inductive ideal. There is thus a fundamental asymmetry between Hume’s skepticism concerning the a priori model of causal explanation of the mechanical philosophy and his skepticism concerning Newton’s (and his own) inductive method. Within the naturalistic standpoint of science and common life, Hume emphatically endorses the inductive method—but not the a priori model of causal explanation. The inductive method follows natural principles of association of the mind and relies only on experience. By contrast, the a priori reasoning of the mechanical philosophers, involving the hypothetical postulation of a hidden configuration of properties of tiny parts of matter and their powers demonstratively necessitating its effects, does not follow such natural operations. This asymmetry also reveals itself in the character of Hume’s positive notion of necessity, within the standpoint of common life and science. He explains this notion in terms of a natural and inevitable projection from our inductive inferences, while the necessity of hidden powers postulated by the mechanical philosophy has no analogue at all in any natural operations of the mind. Hume simply rejects this inherited notion of necessity once and for all—from both the naturalistic and radically skeptical standpoints. Locke, despite his empiricism (and despite his own debt to Newton), never takes the step of replacing the rationalist ideal of a demonstrative science of nature with the purely inductive Newtonian ideal; and it is for precisely this reason, we believe, that the Lockean “skeptical realist” interpretation of Hume—defended, for example, by John P. Wright (1983) and Galen Strawson (1989)—is fundamentally mistaken. For further details on the relationship between Hume, Locke, and Newton see De Pierris 2006, 2015: chapter 3.

26. The crucial methodological difference between Hume and the mechanical philosophy is that Hume, following Newton, emphasizes purely inductive arguments as opposed to the hypothetical postulation of a hidden microscopic constitution of bodies. In Locke’s empiricist version of the mechanical philosophy there is an a priori commitment to the existence of such a hidden constitution (a “real essence”), while, at the same time, Locke remains skeptical about our access to such a constitution (note 25 above). Hume, by contrast, dispenses with this a priori commitment and adopts the Newtonian notion of “experimental proof” or “proof by experiment” as the paradigm of our best science of nature. Such proofs proceed via the inductive methodology articulated in Rule 3 of Book 3 of the Principia for inferring universal generalizations from completely uniform experience (see the paragraph to which note 18 above is appended, together with the following note 19). It is precisely this notion of inductive proof that characterizes Hume’s own conception of scientific methodology and decisively distinguishes him from the mechanical philosophy, including that of both Boyle and Locke: see De Pierris 2015, chapter 3. In both the Treatise (T 1.3.11) and the Enquiry (section 10, part 1) Hume draws a contrast between the superior certainty of conclusions based on proofs from uniform constant experience and that of merely probable conclusions based on non-uniform experience involving a contrariety of evidence (as in human testimony). It is precisely the latter, however, that is emphasized in the experimental method of Boyle and Locke. This central methodological difference between Hume and the mechanical philosophers has not been considered, even by commentators who acknowledge Hume’s more general debt to Newton. Moreover, ignoring the importance of the Newtonian notion of (inductive) proof in Hume has led some recent commentators to identify Hume’s conception of experimental method with Boyle’s. An influential example is Barfoot 1990, which rightly points out that Hume, in The History of England, emphasizes the importance of Boyle’s hydrostatics. Yet Barfoot does not consider the conclusion of the discussion of Boyle’s hydrostatics, where Hume directs our attention to Boyle “being a great partizan of the mechanical philosophy” and criticizes that philosophy for “allowing us to imagine” the “secrets of nature” that we have not yet discovered—thereby flattering our “natural vanity” (HE VI, 541). Barfoot also fails to appreciate Hume’s immediately following paragraph on Newton, which begins (HE VI, 542):

In Newton this island may boast of having produced the greatest and rarest genius that ever arose for the ornament and instruction of the species.

Hume praises Newton as

[c]autious in admitting no principles but such as were founded on experiment; but resolute to adopt every such principle, however new or unusual. (ibid.)

For the only “principles” one can “resolutely” admit, according to the “cautious” inductive method, are universal generalizations derived from completely uniform experience—including such surprising and “unusual” generalizations as the law of universal gravitation. Hume emphatically concludes by contrasting Newton’s position vis-à-vis the mechanical philosophy with Boyle’s (ibid.):

While Newton seemed to draw off the veil from some of the mysteries of nature, he shewed at the same time the imperfections of the mechanical philosophy; and thereby restored her ultimate secrets to that obscurity, in which they ever did and ever will remain.

It is quite clear that Hume’s comparison of the two here is favorable to Newton and unfavorable to Boyle. For detailed further discussion of challenges to a Newtonian reading of Hume’s experimental method see De Pierris 2015, chapter 3, section 5.

27. For further discussion of Kant’s understanding of the argument of Book III of the Principia in the Metaphysical Foundations see Friedman 1992a, 1992b, 2012, 2013.

28. This is the one place where Newton explicitly appeals to Rule 3 in the argument, namely, in Corollary 2 to Proposition 6 (Principia, 809):

All bodies universally that are on or near the earth are heavy [or gravitate] toward the earth, and the weights of all bodies that are equally distant from the center of the earth are as the quantities of matter in them. This is a quality of all bodies on which experiments can be performed and therefore by Rule 3 is to be affirmed of all bodies universally.

29. This conclusion depends on Proposition 69 of Book 1, where Newton applies the third law of motion to conclude that, if a system of several bodies all attract one another in accordance with the inverse-square law and with weights proportional to mass (as in Galileo’s law of fall), then the accelerations generated by any two bodies in the system will be directly proportional to their masses when the bodies so attracted are considered at equal distances. Thus, for example, we can thereby compute the mass of Jupiter from the accelerations of its satellites and compare this quantity with the mass of Saturn: all accelerations towards each of these primary bodies obey the inverse-square law and (in accordance with Galileo’s law of fall) depend only on the distance from the primary body and the primary body itself; but, by universality, Jupiter and Saturn accelerate towards one another in accordance with the same law of proportionality; applying the equality of action and reaction to the mutual accelerations between Jupiter and Saturn then yields the result that these accelerations are proportional to the respective masses of the two bodies; and, by varying the distance in question all the way back down to the region of their respective satellites, we can then compute the (relative) masses of Jupiter and Saturn from the accelerations of their satellites. For further discussion of this stage of the argument—and the way in which it is entangled with the Newtonian concepts of (absolute) space, time, and motion—see Friedman 1992b (chapter 3, § III) and 2013.

30. After giving the argument for the first part of his conclusion (see note 29 above) Newton continues (Principia, 810–811):

Further, since all the parts of any planet A are heavy [or gravitate] toward any planet B, and since the gravity of each part is to the gravity of the whole as the [quantity of] matter of that part to the [quantity of] matter of the whole, and since to every action (by the third law of motion) there is an equal and opposite reaction, it follows that planet B will gravitate in turn toward all the parts of planet A, and its gravity toward any one part will be to its gravity toward the whole of the planet as the matter of that part is to the matter of the whole.

Newton is here appealing to the well-known property of terrestrial gravity that weight is compositional: the weight of a compound body is equal to the sum of the weights of its constituent parts. This property can then be extended to the “weights” of any body towards any other body by the argument of Proposition 7. But, by the third law of motion, if one body is “heavy” towards another body, then this last body must also be “heavy” towards the first. For the relationship between this stage of Newton’s inductive argument and Hume’s “Rules by which to judge of causes and effects” see De Pierris 2006 and 2015, chapter 3.

31. See Proposition 7 of the second or Dynamics chapter (4, 512; 50): “The attraction essential to all matter is an immediate action of one matter on other matter through empty space”. Again, for the relationship between this property of the “original” force of attraction—its immediacy—and the Newtonian concepts of (absolute) space, time, and motion see Friedman 1992b (chapter 3, § III) and 2013.

32. See note 12 above, together with the paragraph to which it is appended. Since Kant takes the equality of action and reaction, in the first instance, to govern changes of momentum (rather than the forces which produce such changes), he actually does not need to formulate Newton’s second law separately. Moreover, since Kant places particular emphasis on the equality of action and reaction, he is (in effect) elevating Corollary 3 to Newton’s laws (what we now call the conservation of momentum: see note 14 above) to the status of a fundamental law. Kant’s use of the conservation of the total quantity of matter (in accordance with the transcendental principle of the conservation of substance) in place of Newton’s second law is a reflection of this situation.

33. See the first remark to Proposition 4 of the Mechanics chapter (4, 549; 88): “Newton by no means dared to prove this law a priori, and therefore appealed to experience”.

34. For further details on this crucial part of Kant’s argument see Friedman 1992a, 1992b, 2013; compare also note 41 below, together with the paragraph to which it is appended and the preceding paragraph.

35. See again the references cited in note 27 (and 34) above. Proposition 8 of the Dynamics chapter reads (4, 526; 55):

The original attractive force, on which the very possibility of matter as such rests, extends immediately to infinity throughout the universe, from every part of matter to every other part.

Kant therefore builds both universality and immediacy (compare note 31 above) into the metaphysical “dynamical theory of matter” he develops in this chapter. Further discussion of Kant’s metaphysical theory of matter is beyond the scope of the present article. We note, however, that Kant is here radically revising a broadly Leibnizian metaphysics of matter he had earlier developed in the pre-critical period, and Kant’s pre-critical version of a Leibnizian metaphysics has led some recent commentators—notably Eric Watkins (2005)—to develop an interpretation of Kant’s conception of causality in the critical period that is markedly more Leibnizian (and thus more Aristotelian) than the present account.

36. This distinction between “appearance” and “experience” is developed in the fourth chapter or Phenomenology of the Metaphysical Foundations, whose subject, in general, is the transformation of merely “apparent” motions into “true” motions. In particular, the “phenomena” described by Kepler’s laws are so far merely apparent motions (relative to their primary bodies), whereas the everywhere mutual inverse-square accelerations described by the law of universal gravitation are true motions (relative to the center of gravity of the solar system). For further discussion of this point see Friedman 2013, chapter 4.

37. See again the references cited in note 27 (and 34) above. Kant identifies the effect of the fundamental force of attraction with gravitation in a note to Proposition 8 of the Dynamics chapter (4, 518; 56):

The action [or effect] of the universal attraction immediately exerted by each matter on all matters, and at all distances, is called gravitation; the tendency to move in the direction of greater gravitation is weight.

What is Kant’s justification for this identification? This is a subtle and delicate point, into which we cannot enter fully here. In the end, however, the only justification Kant has to offer is that the force of universal gravitation has all the essential properties of his own fundamental force of attraction: immediacy, universality, and proportionality to mass (compare notes 30 and 34 above). Hence, Kant’s justification for making this identification must ultimately depend on empirical facts. The identification is also framed, however, by an a priori “special metaphysics” of nature (including Kant’s metaphysical “dynamical theory of matter”—note 35 above), which, in turn, is itself framed by the a priori transcendental principles of the pure understanding constituting a “general metaphysics” of nature: the result, although empirical, is certainly not, from Kant’s point of view, merely inductive.

38. See Proposition 2 of the Phenomenology (4, 556–557; 96):

The circular motion of a matter, as distinct from the opposite motion of the space, is an actual predicate of this matter; by contrast, the opposite motion of a relative space, assumed instead of the motion of the body, is no actual motion of the latter, but, if taken as such, is mere semblance [Schein].

Kant illustrates this by Newton’s example, from the famous Scholium to the Definitions (on absolute space, time, and motion) at the beginning of the Principia, of two bodies connected by a cord mutually rotating about a common central point. By the law of inertia, the two bodies would fly off along the tangent if there were no cord, and so there must be a true centripetal acceleration (due to the elastic force of the cord itself) holding them in. Thus, the two bodies are truly mutually rotating, and a contrary motion of the surrounding space (e.g., the fixed stars) would be mere semblance. Newton intends this example, it is clear, as a model for his own inference from the apparent to the true motions in the solar system in Book 3.

39. In an unpublished Reflexion, written between the late 1770s and mid 1780s, Kant illustrates the transformation in question by precisely the transition from Kepler to Newton (R 5414; 18, 176):

Empirically one can certainly discover rules, but not laws—as Kepler in comparison with Newton—for to the latter belongs necessity, and hence that they are cognized a priori.

The above discussion of Kant’s reconstruction of the Newtonian “deduction from the phenomena” of the law of universal gravitation emphasizes the Postulates of Empirical Thought and thus the modal categories. Friedman (2017) extends the account by emphasizing the derived pure concept of the understanding or “predicable” of force (which falls under the category of causality). In particular, when the Newtonian force of universal gravitation is considered from this point of view, it is treated as a mathematical quantity abstracted from all hypothetical mechanisms that may be invoked to explain it (such as a vortex model for example). The force (and corresponding law) thereby acquires a considerably stronger epistemic status (than that of a mere hypothesis) by means of the empirical measurements Newton describes for establishing its mathematical properties. Compare Kant’s discussion of what he calls “moving forces” in the Second Analogy (A206-207/B252). [More generally, the essays in the volume on Kant and the Laws of Nature in which Friedman (2017) appears represent the state of the art in contemporary Kant scholarship concerning causality and the laws of nature.]

40. For the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science and Kant’s conception of the Newtonian science of nature see the paragraph to which note 12 above is appended, together with the preceding paragraph; for Kant’s reconstruction of the argument for universal gravitation in this context see the paragraph to which note 36 above is appended, together with the two preceding paragraphs.

41. As explained in the references cited in note 27 above, this depends on Kant’s cosmological conception, developed in his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens (1755), of the structure of the universe as a whole as consisting of an indefinitely extended nested sequence of ever larger rotating (galactic) systems. It is because the sequence in question is indeed indefinitely extended, and thus has no finite endpoint, that Kant views absolute space, in the end, as an idea of reason: a forever unreachable regulative ideal that we can only successively approximate but never fully realize.

42. A single sidereal day, for example, is determined by the return of a location on the earth to a given position relative to the fixed stars rather than relative to the sun (from one noon to another, say); and we also take account of irregularities in the sun’s yearly motion due to varying speeds in different parts of its orbit (for us, the orbit of the earth), the inclination of the sun’s ecliptic relative to the equator (due, for us, to the tilting of the earth’s axis of rotation), and so on. For an explanation of this procedure, which generates what astronomers call the equation of time, see Kuhn 1957, Technical Appendix.

43. See Kant’s formulation of his first “law of mechanics” in the Metaphysical Foundations (4, 541; 80–81):

In all changes of corporeal nature the total quantity of matter remains the same, neither increased nor diminished.

Kant’s following “proof” of this proposition begins (4, 541; 81):

From general metaphysics we take as basis the proposition that in all changes of nature no substance either arises or perishes, and here it is only shown what substance shall be in matter.

In the second edition of the Critique Kant changes the statement of the First Analogy, accordingly, to read (B224):

In all change of the appearances substance persists, and the quantum of substance in nature is neither increased nor diminished.

44. Kant is of course familiar with the ancient (pre-Copernican) corrections based on the equation of time (note 42 above). Moreover, Kant is also perfectly aware of the need to make further corrections in the light of Newtonian gravitational astronomy itself. Just as Kant holds that the ordinary conception of motion based on a stationary earth must be subject to an indefinite series of successive corrections based on ever more extended relative spaces (compare note 41 above), he is also aware that the ordinary measure of time to which he refers in the passage from the Refutation of Idealism is subject to an indefinite process of corrections by the evolving procedures of (post-Copernican) astronomy. Indeed, Kant was the first to envision an especially important such correction, in his essay on Whether the Earth has Undergone an Alteration of its Axial Rotation (1754), which introduces an irregularity or nonuniformity into the sidereal rotation of the earth due to tidal friction. Thus, whereas the law of inertia implies that the earth will rotate uniformly in perpetuity in empty space, the action of external gravitational forces on the earth (principally from the sun and the moon) introduces a number of irregularities into this rotation—including the precession of the equinoxes already described by Newton in the Principia, the further precession or “nutation” of the earth’s axis described by the astronomer James Bradley, and the effects of tidal friction which were initially described by Kant himself.

45. According to the abstract standard of temporal uniformity defined by the laws of motion, two temporal intervals are truly equal just in case they represent the times during which an inertially moving body would traverse equal distances. No bodies are actually moving inertially, however, because of the universality of gravitational force. Yet the theory of universal gravitation itself then allows us systematically to take these forces into account, and to correct the actually non-uniform motions accordingly.

46. Because of this law, therefore, each motion of a body at a given time follows from the motions of bodies at earlier times, and

there must thus lie in that which precedes an event as such the condition for a rule according to which this event follows always and necessarily. (A193/B238–239)

47. It is no accident, therefore, that Kant illustrates the category of community, in the second edition of the Critique, precisely by the (instantaneous) gravitational interaction between the earth and the moon: see the “proof” of the Third Analogy at B256–258.

48. Compare again the passage from the second edition Introduction already quoted above (B5):

The very concept of cause so obviously contains the concept of a necessity of the connection with an effect and a strict universality of the rule, that the concept [of cause] would be entirely lost if one pretended to derive it, as Hume did, from a frequent association of that which happens with that which precedes, and [from] a thereby arising custom (thus a merely subjective necessity) of connecting representations.

Compare note 4 above, together with the paragraph to which it is appended.

49. Since Kant is here emphasizing the general causal principle of the Second Analogy, the interpretation of this passage is especially controversial. Some commentators—e.g., Beck (1978: 126–127)—take Kant to be here endorsing the “generally accepted view” (of particular empirical causal laws),

according to which we have only been first guided by the perception and comparison of many concurring sequences of events following on certain appearances to discover a rule, in accordance with which certain events always follow on certain appearances.

In section 2 above we discussed in detail the relationship between the general causal principle of the Second Analogy (that every event b must have a cause a) and the particular empirical causal laws (of the form all events of kind A must be followed by events of kind B) which, according to Kant, must “stand under” the general causal principle. In the passage at A195–196/B24–241 Kant is in fact referring to both types of “rules”—the general rule “that everything that happens has a cause” and also the particular rules (causal laws of nature) “in accordance with which certain events always follow on certain appearances”. As we saw in section 2, while the former is synthetic a priori, for Kant, even a posteriori causal laws of nature still possess an empirical or material necessity in accordance with the Postulates of Empirical Thought—and are thereby both necessary and universally valid in the sense of § 29 of the Prolegomena. We explained how the law of universal gravitation, for Kant, possesses precisely this empirical or material necessity in section 3 above: compare note 46 above, together with the paragraph to which it is appended.

50. As suggested in notes 23 and 25 above, we believe that Hume’s very complex position reveals the existence of two mutually autonomous standpoints in Hume’s epistemology: on the one side, the standpoint of radical skepticism, where Hume calls into question our most fundamental natural beliefs and seeks for their ultimate justification, and, on the other side, the standpoint of common life and science, where these same natural beliefs are not called into question but are refined and improved by the normative reflection of the “wise man”, the mitigated skeptic, and the scientist. For further discussion see De Pierris 2001, 2002, 2015.

51. If this is correct, there might be something importantly right about “Kant’s debt to Hume via Beattie” after all (compare notes 1 and 8 above, together with the paragraphs to which they are appended). Kant’s awareness of Hume’s discussion of the general causal principle in the Treatise (derived from reading Beattie after 1772) may have led him to the idea that this principle (together with the other principles of what will eventually become the three Analogies of Experience) could serve as a (synthetic) a priori realization of Hume’s principle of the uniformity of nature. Such a new awareness would not have represented Kant’s first acquaintance with “Hume’s problem” (which awoke him from his dogmatic slumber), but it may have been an important step towards Kant’s ultimate solution to the problem in the critical period.

52. Kant’s argument in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science provides a specific realization or instantiation of this idea in the case of Newton’s theory of universal gravitation: Newtonian mathematical demonstrations, in the context of the Newtonian mathematical theory of space, time, and motion, can indeed lead to a more than merely inductive status for an especially important empirical causal law. Kant then supposes that the mathematical theory of space and time, as further determined via the Analogies of Experience, can (at least in principle) do something similar for lower-level empirical laws such as the sun warming the stone. The question of the relationship between lower-level empirical laws and the “pure natural science” discussed in the Metaphysical Foundations is especially difficult, however, and it involves us, eventually, with the new questions about the relationship between empirical laws and the transcendental principles of the understanding raised in the Critique of Judgment: for further discussion see Friedman 1992a, 1992b, 2013.

Copyright © 2018 by
Graciela De Pierris <>
Michael Friedman <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free