Supplement to Kant’s Theory of Judgment

Completing the Picture of Kant’s Metaphysics of Judgment

A. Judgments of experience, the categories, and the B Deduction

So far in Section 3, we have concentrated on the connection between transcendental idealism and Kant’s theory of the meaning and truth of empirical judgments. But in a sense this has gotten the cart before the horse, because above all Kant wants to show that the synthetic a priori judgments expressing the first principles of Kant’s own metaphysics of nature are meaningful and true only if transcendental idealism is correct. As a first step towards showing this, Kant offers the following very famous argument:

  1. Empirical judgments, or judgments of experience, are “about,” or directed to, objects of experience.
  2. Given the strongest version of transcendental idealism, the logical forms implicit in the propositional contents of judgments of experience are imposed upon unstructured sensory representations, or conscious perceptions, in order to constitute the objects of experience.
  3. These logical forms are “pure concepts of the understanding” (a priori concepts) or “categories” (a priori concepts insofar as they specifically apply to objects) that are originally derived from pure general logic, when construed as an exhaustive theory of logico-syntactic and logico-semantic forms of and in propositional contents.
  4. Since the spatiotemporal forms of intuition that necessarily govern all conscious perceptions, and also the pure concepts of the understanding or categories that govern all propositional contents of judgments, alike fall under the faculty of apperception, or rational self-consciousness, when apperception is directly combined with the faculty of the imagination and its figural synthesis or synthesis speciosa (the combination of which Kant calls “the original synthetic unity of apperception”), and since the strongest version of transcendental idealism is true, it follows that the objectivity of any object of experience is strictly determined by the forms of intuition plus the categories that are alike implicit in judgments of experience about those objects and also literally imposed upon those objects of experience by the faculties of the judging subject in acts of judgment.
  5. Therefore the categories necessarily apply to all and only the objects of experience, and are objectively valid.

The argument just sketched is a thumbnail version of the Transcendental Deduction of the Pure Concepts of the Understanding in the B edition of the Critique of Pure Reason (B129–B169), more commonly known as “the B Deduction.” This is certainly not the place to engage in a critical discussion of the many different possible interpretations of the B Deduction; nor is it the place to relate the B Deduction to the A Deduction. For our purposes right now, the crucial points to notice are three.

First, as many commentators have noted, there is an intimate and indeed necessary connection between Kant’s theory of judgment and the B Deduction. Without the centrality thesis and the priority-of-the-proposition thesis, the argument could not even be valid, much less sound. Kant’s conception of the objectivity of objects of experience, and the role that the categories play in determining this objectivity, both depend heavily on the assumption that all human cognition is centrally judgmental, and also on the further assumption that judgmental cognition is essentially propositional.

Second, as many commentators have also noted, the conclusion of the B Deduction depends intimately and again indeed necessarily on Kant’s conception of the role of the faculty of apperception or rational self-consciousness in the nature of the judgment. Without Kant’s doctrine that the unity of the proposition is strictly determined by the higher-order self-representations introduced by the faculty of apperception, it could not be the case that the pure concepts of the understanding, as logical forms, would necessarily carry over into the objects of experience, as constituting their objective structure.

Third and finally, as perhaps fewer commentators have noticed, the linchpin of the argument is in fact the antecedent of step 4, which asserts that the unity of the spatiotemporal forms of intuition and the unity of propositional content in judgments is identically the same unity, namely the unity imposed by the faculty of rational self-consciousness in accordance with the categories, when it is directly combined with the faculty of imagination and its figural synthesis. In other words, according to Kant the spatiotemporal intuitional unity of the content of our conscious perceptual representations is necessarily also a fully logico-conceptual unity. If this claim were not true, then the unity of conscious perceptions of objects in space and time might be distinct from the unity of judgments, and, assuming transcendental idealism, even though the categories necessarily applied to all objects of experience, there might then still be some spatiotemporal objects of conscious perception to which the categories either do not actually apply, or at least not necessarily apply: that is, there might be some objects of human intuition that are not also objects of human experience, in the strong sense that those objects of human intuition either actually do or possibly could turn out to be nomologically ill-behaved or unconstrained, thereby falling outside the categories. Let us call such categorially-anarchic objects rogue objects. Examples of rogue objects would include objects of intuition that engaged in systematically counter-nomological behavior (magic), purely random or indeterministic behavior (pure chance), teleological behavior (organismic life), arbitrary orderings of representations in inner sense (the spontaneity of consciousness), or incompatibilistic causal determination at the source of human intentional action (the practical spontaneity of freedom). The deterministic causal laws of natural science, and thus also the objectively valid category of cause and effect, would simply fail to apply to all such rogue objects of perception. We will return to this crucial point about the real possibility of categorial anarchy in Section 4.1.

B. Transcendental judgments, transcendental schematism, and the Second Analogy of Experience

One last piece needs to be fitted into the puzzle in order to give us a fairly complete picture of Kant’s metaphysics of judgment. We saw in Section 2.2.3 that Kant’s project in the first Critique can be glossed as the attempt to explain how synthetic a priori judgments are possible. But what is the connection between this project and the B Deduction? The answer is that the B Deduction, if sound, shows that the categories are objectively valid, and then objectively valid synthetic a priori judgments containing the categories can be formulated in order to state general metaphysical truths about the possibility of our cognition of objects of experience and correspondingly (assuming the strongest version of transcendental idealism) about the possibility of objects of experience themselves. Now granting that these categorial synthetic a priori judgments are properly generated both as to their logical form and semantic content, it will then follow that they compositionally inherit the objective validity of their constituent categorial concepts. So these judgments will be at once objectively valid, non-empirical or a priori, necessarily true, and also synthetic or non-logical. Furthermore they will also be specifically about the objects of possible human experience. In short, they will make up the subject-matter of Kant’s own transcendental metaphysics of nature. Kant calls such judgments “principles of pure understanding” (A148/B187), and correspondingly he also calls the extension of his theory of judgment to these principles, “the analytic of principles” or “the transcendental doctrine of the power of judgment” (A137/176).

The transcendental doctrine of the power of judgment consists of two parts: (1) the “schematism of the pure concepts of the understanding” or transcendental schematism (A137–A147/B176–187), and (2) the system of all principles of pure understanding (A148–235/B187–294), which formally corresponds to the architectonic format of the table of categories, which in turn mimics the architectonic format of the table of logical forms in judgments (see Section 2.1.1):

Table of Categories
  1. Categories of Quantity: Unity, Plurality, Totality
  2. Categories of Quality: Reality, Negation, Limitation
  3. Categories of Relation: Inherence and Subsistence (substantia et accidens), Causality and Dependence (cause and effect), community (reciprocity between agent and patient)
  4. Categories of Modality: Possibility--Impossibility, Existence--Non-existence, Necessity--Contingency (CPR A80/B106)

System of Principles

  1. Axioms of Intuition
  2. Anticipations of Perception
  3. Analogies of Experience
  4. Postulates of Empirical Thinking in General (CPR A161/B200)

Two leading questions can now be formulated. First, what bearing does the transcendental schematism of the categories have on the transcendental doctrine of the judgment? As we saw in passing in Section 1, schemata are products of the faculty of imagination, and more specifically, they are supplementary rules for interpreting general conceptual rules in terms of more specific figural spatiotemporal forms and sensory images. Schemata are needed by Kant in order to overcome two apparent gaps: an ontological gap between abstract universals and concrete particulars on the one hand, and a cognitive gap between concepts and intuitions on the other hand. This holds not only at the level of empirical judgment, where the cognitive gap is between the conceptual (attributive or descriptive) parts of the judgment on the one hand and the intuitional (directly referential) parts of the judgment on the other, but also at the transcendental level, where the gap is between pure concepts or categories on the one hand and individual objects of experience on the other. Kant’s seminal idea here is that schemata can mediate between the one side (abstract universals, empirical concepts, pure concepts) and the other side (concrete particulars, empirical intuitions, objects of experience) precisely because they are at once figural-formal and also intrinsically sensory. But there is also a decidedly semantic aspect to the doctrine of schematism, because the schemata can be properly regarded as special rules for interpreting otherwise uninterpreted items on the one side, in terms of intermediate spatiotemporal sensory structures or models, so that the items on the one side can then be applied to items on the other side, which will in turn function as the semantic values of the items on the first side. All the transcendental schemata, according to Kant, express various formal properties of time: properties of “the time-series, the content of time, the order of time, and the sum total of time” (A145/B184–185). What this means then is that every objectively valid judgment, whether empirical or a priori, and in particular synthetic a priori, must implicitly include a schematic a priori formal temporal component that functions as an intermediate structure for interpreting the purely logical elements of judgments and thereby securing their applicability to objects of actual or possible experience.

Second, what bearing does the system of principles have on the transcendental doctrine of the judgment? As mentioned above, principles of pure understanding, as synthetic a priori propositions about the objects of experience, make up the subject-matter of Kant’s transcendental metaphysics of nature. Hence, assuming the strongest version of transcendental idealism, every such principle tells us how one of the categories partially constitutes objects of experience in general, by determining an objectively real phenomenal structure across all possible worlds of human experience. For example, consider the Second Analogy of Experience, which Kant describes as “the principle of temporal sequence according to the law of causality,” and which says that “all alterations occur in accordance with the law of the connection of cause and effect” (A189–211/B232–256). According to the first Analogy, Kant regards “alterations,” or singular events, as momentary attributions of distinct phenomenal properties (always occurring in a temporal succession of such moments) to an underlying permanently unchanging (or at any rate temporarily enduring) material substance in space, which is thereby the bearer of those properties and also the metaphysical analogue of the logical subject of predication (A182–189/B224–232). Against this backdrop, and again assuming the strongest version of transcendental idealism, Kant’s fundamental idea in the Second Analogy is that singular events in phenomenal nature are causes if and only if they sufficiently determine, or necessitate, later singular events according to specific natural laws. This in turn answers Hume’s worry about the absence of necessary connection in phenomenal nature, by insisting that causal relations are imposed on sensory phenomena in temporal succession by cognizing subjects, via judgments of experience, and exist neither in themselves nor in the raw data of sensory experience. Kant also insists that necessarily all such causal sequences of phenomenal events are temporally irreversible, although he does not (contrary to Strawson’s famous and witty charge that Kant here commits “a non sequitur of numbing grossness” [Strawson 1966, 137]) hold the converse, namely that necessarily every temporally irreversible sequence of phenomenal events is causal. Finally, Kant also holds that all and only the objects of experience are such that every one of their real attributes in time is causally necessitated by earlier events according to specific natural laws; and this sharply distinguishes them from temporal sequences of phenomenal properties which are ordered in a merely arbitrary fashion that depends on the vagaries of mere inner sense or phenomenal consciousness. So the synthetic a priori principle of cause and effect is also a criterion of the objectivity of objects of experience. The upshot is that the Second Analogy of Experience, like every principle of pure understanding, is an objectively valid and necessarily true synthetic a priori judgment because it expresses both a pure concept or category (in this case, the category of cause and effect) and a corresponding a priori schema (in this case, the successive character of time [A144/B183]) that (in this case regulatively, under the existential condition that the relevant causal event actually occurs) guarantees the application of that category to objects of experience.

Copyright © 2017 by
Robert Hanna

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