Kant’s Critique of Metaphysics

First published Sun Feb 29, 2004; substantive revision Wed Sep 14, 2022

How are synthetic a priori propositions possible? This question is often times understood to frame the investigations at issue in Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason. In answer to it, Kant saw fit to divide the question into three: 1) How are the synthetic a priori propositions of mathematics possible? 2) How are the synthetic a priori propositions of natural science possible? Finally, 3) How are the synthetic a priori propositions of metaphysics possible? In systematic fashion, Kant responds to each of these questions. The answer to question one is broadly found in the Transcendental Aesthetic, and the doctrine of the transcendental ideality of space and time. The answer to question two is found in the Transcendental Analytic, where Kant seeks to demonstrate the essential role played by the categories in grounding the possibility of knowledge and experience. The answer to question three is found in the Transcendental Dialectic, and it is a resoundingly blunt conclusion: the synthetic a priori propositions that characterize metaphysics are not really possible at all. Metaphysics, that is, is inherently dialectical. Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason is thus as well known for what it rejects as for what it defends. Thus, in the Dialectic, Kant turns his attention to the central disciplines of traditional, rationalist, metaphysics — rational psychology, rational cosmology, and rational theology. Kant aims to reveal the errors that plague each of these fields.

1. Preliminary Remarks: The Rejection of Ontology (general metaphysics) and the Transcendental Analytic

Despite the fact that Kant devotes an entirely new section of the Critique to the branches of special metaphysics, his criticisms reiterate some of the claims already defended in both the Transcendental Aesthetic and the Transcendental Analytic. Indeed, two central teachings from these earlier portions of the Critique — the transcendental ideality of space and time, and the critical limitation of all application of the concepts of the understanding to “appearances” — already carry with them Kant’s rejection of “ontology (metaphysica generalis).” Accordingly, in the Transcendental Analytic Kant argues against any attempt to acquire knowledge of “objects in general” through the formal concepts and principles of the understanding, taken by themselves alone. In this connection, Kant denies that the principles or rules of either general logic (e.g., the principle of contradiction), or those of his own “transcendental logic” (the pure concepts of the understanding) by themselves yield knowledge of objects. These claims follow from Kant’s well-known “kind distinction” between the understanding and sensibility, together with the view that knowledge requires the cooperation of both faculties. This position, articulated throughout the Analytic, entails that independently of their application to intuitions, the concepts and principles of the understanding are mere forms of thought which cannot yield knowledge of objects.

For if no intuition could be given corresponding to the concept, the concept would still be a thought, so far as its form is concerned, but would be without any object, and no knowledge of anything would be possible by means of it. So far as I could know, there would be nothing, and could be nothing, to which my thought could be applied. B146

We thus find one general complaint about efforts to acquire metaphysical knowledge: the use of formal concepts and principles, in abstraction from the sensible conditions under which objects can be given, cannot yield knowledge. Hence, the “transcendental” use of the understanding (its use independently of the conditions of sensibility) is considered by Kant to be dialectical, to involve erroneous applications of concepts in order to acquire knowledge of things independently of sensibility/experience. Throughout the Analytic Kant elaborates on this general view, noting that the transcendental employment of the understanding, which aims towards knowledge of things independently of experience (and thus knowledge of “noumena”), is illicit (cf. A246/B303). It is in this connection that Kant states, famously, in the Analytic, that “…the proud name of ontology, which presumes to offer synthetic a priori cognitions of things in general… must give way to the more modest title of a transcendental analytic” (cf. A247/B304). Filling this out, Kant suggests that to take ourselves to have unmediated intellectual access to objects (to have “non-sensible” knowledge) correlates with the assumption that there are non-sensible objects that we can know. To assume this, however, is to conflate “phenomena” (or appearances) with “noumena” (or things in themselves). The failure to draw the distinction between appearances and things in themselves is the hallmark of all those pernicious systems of thought that stand under the title of “transcendental realism.” Kant’s transcendental idealism is the remedy for these.

2. The Rejection of Special Metaphysics and the Transcendental Dialectic

Kant’s rejection of the more specialized branches of metaphysics is grounded in part on this earlier claim, to wit, that any attempt to apply the concepts and principles of the understanding independently of the conditions of sensibility (i.e., any transcendental use of the understanding) is illicit. Thus, one of Kant’s main complaints is that metaphysicians seek to deduce a priori synthetic knowledge simply from the unschematized (pure) concepts of the understanding. The effort to acquire metaphysical knowledge through concepts alone, however, is doomed to fail, according to Kant, because (in its simplest formulation) “concepts without intuitions are empty” (A52/B76).

Although this general charge is certainly a significant part of Kant’s complaint, the story does not stop there. In turning to the specific disciplines of special metaphysics (those concerning the soul, the world, and God), Kant devotes a considerable amount of time discussing the human interests that nevertheless pull us into the thorny questions and controversies that characterize special metaphysics. These interests are of two types, and include theoretical goals of achieving completeness and systematic unity of knowledge, and practical interests in securing the immortality of the soul, freedom, and the existence of God. Despite their contributions to metaphysical illusion, Kant tells us that the goals and interests in question are unavoidable, inevitable, and inherent in the very nature of human reason. In the Introduction to the Transcendental Dialectic Kant thus introduces “reason” as the locus of these metaphysical interests.

2.1 The Theory of Reason and Transcendental Illusion

The emphasis on reason in this connection is important, and it links up with the project of Kant’s “critique” of pure reason. A major component of this critique involves illuminating the basis in reason for our efforts to draw erroneous metaphysical conclusions (to employ concepts “transcendentally”), despite the fact that such use has already been shown (in the Transcendental Analytic) to be illicit. What emerges in the Dialectic is a more complex story, one in which Kant seeks to disclose and critique the “transcendental ground” that leads to the misapplications of thought which characterize specific metaphysical arguments. In developing the position that our metaphysical propensities are grounded in the “very nature of human reason,” Kant (in the Introduction to the Dialectic) relies on a conception of reason as a capacity for syllogistic reasoning. This logical function of reason resides in the formal activity of subsuming propositions under ever more general principles in order to systematize, unify, and “bring to completion” the knowledge given through the real use of the understanding (A306/B363-A308/B365). Kant thus characterizes this activity as one which seeks “conditions” for everything that is conditioned. It is therefore central to this Kantian conception of reason that it is preoccupied with the “unconditioned which would stop the regress of conditions by providing a condition that is not itself conditioned in its turn.”

The demand for the unconditioned is essentially a demand for ultimate explanation, and links up with the rational prescription to secure systematic unity and completeness of knowledge. Reason, in short, is in the business of ultimately accounting for all things. As Kant formulates this interest of reason in the first Critique, it is characterized by the logical maxim or precept: “Find for the conditioned knowledge given through the understanding the unconditioned whereby its unity is brought to completion” (A308/B364). It is central to Kant’s Dialectic that this requirement for systematic unity and completeness of knowledge is inherent in the very nature of our reason. Controversially, Kant does not take it that this demand for the unconditioned is something we can dismiss, nor does he take the interests we have in metaphysics to be merely products of misguided enthusiasm.

Although the demand for the unconditioned is inherent in the very nature of our reason, although it is unavoidable and indispensably necessary, Kant nevertheless does not take it to be without problems of a unique sort; for the very same demand that guides our rational scientific inquiries and defines our (human) reason is also the locus of error that needs to be curbed or prevented. In connection with this principle, then, Kant also identifies reason as the seat of a unique kind of error, one that is essentially linked up with metaphysical propensities, and one which he refers to as “transcendental illusion [transzendentale Illusion].” Kant identifies transcendental illusion with the propensity to “take a subjective necessity of a connection of our concepts…for an objective necessity in the determination of things in themselves” (A297/B354). Very generally, Kant’s claim is that it is a peculiar feature of reason that it unavoidably takes its own subjective interests and principles to hold “objectively.” And it is this propensity, this “transcendental illusion,” according to Kant, that paves the way for metaphysics. Reason plays this role by generating principles and interests that incite us to defy the limitations of knowledge already detailed in the Transcendental Analytic. The Introduction to the Transcendental Dialectic is therefore interesting for Kant’s presentation of reason as a presumably distinct capacity for cognizing in a way that, as Kant puts it, incites us to tear down the boundaries already enforced in the Analytic (cf. A296/B352). Kant refers to this capacity of reason as one that leads to the specifically transcendent judgments that characterize metaphysics. Thus, the Transcendental Dialectic is said to be concerned “to expose the illusion in transcendent judgments” (A297/B354). Indeed, Dialectic is defined as “the logic of illusion [Schein]” (A293/B350).

The central problem is that the above prescription to seek the unconditioned presents to reason as a metaphysical principle that tells us that the unconditioned is already given, and is (as it were) “there” to be found. This problematic principle is formulated by Kant as follows: “If the conditioned is given, the absolutely unconditioned… is also given” (A308/B366). This “supreme principle of pure reason” provides the background assumption under which the metaphysician proceeds. These claims set the agenda for Kant’s project, which involves showing not simply that the metaphysical arguments are fallacious, but also exposing their source in reason’s more general illusions.

Kant has been traditionally taken to be offering a method of avoiding the insidious “transcendental illusion” that gives rise to metaphysics. Read in this way, Kant’s Dialectic offers a criticism not only of the specific arguments of metaphysics, but also of transcendent, metaphysical (speculative or theoretical) interests and propensities themselves. This certainly accords with much in the Dialectic, and specifically with Kant’s well-known claim that knowledge has to be limited to possible experience. Kant, however, complicates things somewhat by also stating repeatedly that the illusion that grounds metaphysics (roughly, that the unconditioned is already given) is unavoidable. Moreover, Kant sometimes suggests that such illusion is somehow necessary for our epistemological projects (cf. A645/B673). In this connection, Kant argues that the transcendent ideas and principles of reason do have a positive role to play in knowledge acquisition, so long as they are construed “regulatively” and not “constitutively.” He thus suggests that rather than jettison the ideas of metaphysical objects (something, it seems, he does not think we are in a position to do), it is best to identify the proper use and function of these ideas and principles. This critical reinterpretation involves the claim that the ideas and principles of reason are to be used “regulatively,” as devices for guiding and grounding our empirical investigations and the project of knowledge acquisition. What the ideas do not do, according to Kant, is provide the concepts through which we might access objects that could be known through the speculative use of reason.

The need for this critical reinterpretation stems from the fact that reason’s demand for the unconditioned cannot be met or satisfied. The absolutely “unconditioned,” regardless of the fact that it presents to reason as objective, is not an object or state of affairs that could be captured in any possible human experience. In emphasizing this last point, Kant identifies metaphysics with an effort to acquire knowledge of “objects” conceived, but in no wise given (or giveable) to us in experience. In its efforts to bring knowledge to completion, that is, reason posits certain ideas, the “soul,” the “world” and “God.” Each of these ideas represents reason’s efforts to think the unconditioned in relation to various sets of objects that are experienced by us as conditioned.

It is this general theory of reason, as a capacity to think (by means of “ideas”) beyond all standards of sense, and as carrying with it a unique and unavoidable demand for the unconditioned, that frames the Kantian rejection of metaphysics. At the heart of that rejection is the view that although reason is unavoidably motivated to seek the unconditioned, its theoretical efforts to achieve it are inevitably sterile. The ideas which might secure such unconditioned knowledge lack objective reality (refer to no object), and our misguided efforts to acquire ultimate metaphysical knowledge are led astray by the illusion which, according to Kant, “unceasingly mocks and torments us” (A339/B397).

The Dialectic is concerned to undermine three distinct branches of special metaphysics in the philosophical tradition: Rational Psychology, Rational Cosmology and Rational Theology. Each of these disciplines seeks to acquire knowledge of a particular metaphysical “object” — the “soul,” the “world,” and “God,” respectively. This being stated, the Dialectic proceeds systematically to undermine the arguments specific to each of these disciplines—arguments about, for example, the nature of the soul and the world, and the existence of God. Despite the difference in their objects, however, there are a number of problems shared by all the disciplines of special metaphysics. In its most general terms, the central problem with each of these attempts has to do with the fact that the alleged “objects” under consideration are “transcendent.” Although we think the soul, the world, and God (necessarily) as objects, these ideas actually lack objective reality (there is no object corresponding to the ideas that is or could be given to us in any intuition). It is thus not uncommon to find Kant referring to these alleged metaphysical entities as “mere thought entities,” “fictions of the brain,” or “pseudo objects.” Although the Dialectic does not presume to prove that such objects do not or could not exist, Kant is committed by the strictures of his own transcendental epistemology to the claim that the ideas of reason do not provide us with concepts of “knowable” objects. For this reason alone, the efforts of the metaphysicians are presumptuous, and at the very least, an epistemological modesty precludes the knowledge that is sought.

For more on Kant’s theory of illusion, see Allison (2004), Butts (1997), Grier (2001, forthcoming), Neiman (1994), Theis (1985), Bird (2006). See also Ameriks (2006), Dyck (2014).

2.2 Hypostatization and Subreption

There are two noteworthy themes implicit in Kant’s criticism of metaphysics. First, Kant offers an account and critique of the ideas of reason specific to each discipline. In relation to this, the general theory of reason plays a role in Kant’s efforts to argue against the “hypostatization” of each of the ideas. More specifically, Kant’s criticism of the metaphysical disciplines centers on his efforts to show that the ideas of reason (the soul, the world and God), which are thought in accordance with the demand for an unconditioned that could unify the relevant domain of conditions, get erroneously “hypostatized” by reason, or thought as mind-independent “objects” about which we might seek knowledge. In the same way, that is, that the prescription to seek the unconditioned appears to reason as an objective principle, so too, the subjective ideas appear to reason as objects existing in a mind-independent way. Kant’s aim is to secure the subjective ideas while enforcing their subjective status, and thereby defusing the metaphysics that attends to them.

Thus, Kant’s criticism of metaphysics simultaneously involves denying the pure use of theoretical reason as an instrument for knowledge of transcendent objects, and defending reason’s ideas as projections or goals that have some significant role to play in the overall project of knowledge acquisition. As we shall see, Kant unfortunately is not as clear as we might like on this issue. Sometimes, he seems to argue that the ideas and principles of reason play a merely heuristic role in guiding and systematizing the knowledge already obtained. Other times, he suggests that these ideas are deeply essential to the project of knowledge acquisition, and that their presupposition is utterly necessary if we are to acquire knowledge. Regardless of how the matter is to be resolved, it is clear that Kant’s criticism of metaphysics does not entail any straightforward rejection of the ideas and principles of reason. Indeed, it appears to be precisely the rational constraint to move to the ideas of reason that binds us to our metaphysical propensities and which thus demands a critique of the kind offered by Kant.

In addition to criticizing the “hypostatization” of the ideas of reason, Kant seeks to expose the “subreptions” involved in the use of the ideas. The term “subreption” refers to a fallacy that specifically involves the surreptitious substitution of different kinds of terms and concepts. Kant usually uses the term to refer to the error of confusing or substituting concepts and principles meant for use in experience (those which properly apply to appearances) with principles of “pure reason.” By this means, a concept or principle which is a condition of our experience (e.g., the principle of apperception) is used in a way that assumes its applications to “objects in general” or things in themselves. Alternatively, a most general, formal, principle that would only hold for things in general is taken, by itself alone, to yield knowledge about appearances. This second kind of criticism found throughout the Dialectic thus pertains to Kant’s efforts to expose the subreptions that ground the illusory metaphysical arguments. Ultimately, Kant will also seek to reveal the very specific formal fallacies that vitiate the metaphysical arguments, to demonstrate that (although they have the appearance of soundness) the positions in each case are implicitly grounded in, or deploy, dialectical uses of terms and concepts, misapplications of principles, and conflations of appearances with things in themselves. What we find in Kant’s criticism of metaphysics, in other words, is a complex account, one grounded in a fairly robust theory of human reason. Accordingly, he identifies reason as the locus of certain principles and propensities, and certain “illusions,” which cooperate with misapplications of concepts and principles to create the errors already exposed in the Transcendental Analytic. Although this variety of aims and complaints certainly complicates Kant’s discussions in the Dialectic, it also makes for a richer and more penetrating criticism of metaphysics.

3. The Soul and Rational Psychology

One historically predominant metaphysical interest has to do with identifying the nature and the constitution of the soul. Partly for practical reasons, partly for theoretical explanation, reason forms the idea of a metaphysically simple being, the soul. Such an idea is motivated by reason’s demand for the unconditioned. Kant puts this point in a number of ways, suggesting that the idea of the soul is one to which we are led necessarily insofar as we are constrained by reason to seek the “totality” of the “synthesis of conditions of a thought in general” (A397), or insofar as we seek to represent “the unconditioned unity” of “subjective conditions of representations in general” (A406/B433). More straightforwardly, Kant states that a metaphysics of the soul is generated by the demand for the “absolute (unconditioned) unity of the thinking subject itself” (A334/B391). The branch of metaphysics devoted to this topic is Rational Psychology. Rational psychologists, among whom Descartes or Leibniz would serve as apt historical examples, seek to demonstrate, for example, the substantiality, simplicity, and personal identity of the soul. Each such inference, however, involves concluding “from the transcendental concept of the subject, which contains nothing manifold, the absolute unity of this subject itself, of which I possess no concept whatsoever” (A340/B398). In other words, Kant takes the rational psychologist to slide (mistakenly) from formal features of our self concept to material or substantive metaphysical claims about an alleged (super-sensible) object (the soul).

An essential aspect of all these arguments, according to Kant, is their attempt to derive conclusions about the nature and constitution of the “soul” a priori, simply from an analysis of the activity of thinking. A classic example of such an attempt is provided by Descartes, who deduced the substantiality of the self from the proposition (or, perhaps better, the activity) “I think.” This move is apparent in the Cartesian inference from “I think” to the claim that the “I” is therefore “a thing” that thinks. For Descartes, this move is unproblematic: thought is an attribute, and thus presupposes a substance in which it inheres. Kant emphasizes the a priori basis for the metaphysical doctrine of the soul by claiming that in rational psychology, the “I think” is supposed to provide the “sole text” (A343–4/B401–02). It is this feature of the discipline that serves to distinguish it from any empirical doctrine of the self (any empirical psychology), and which secures its status as a “metaphysics” that purports to provide synthetic a priori knowledge.

Kant’s criticisms of rational psychology draw on a number of distinct sources, one of which is the Kantian doctrine of apperception, or transcendental self-consciousness (often formulated in terms of the necessary possibility of attaching the “I think” to all my representations (B132)). Kant denies that the metaphysician is entitled to his substantive conclusions on the grounds that the activity of self-consciousness does not yield any object for thought. Nevertheless, reason is guided by its projecting and objectifying propensities. In accordance with these, self-consciousness is “hypostatized,” or objectified. Here again, Kant claims that a “natural illusion” compels us to take the apperceived unity of consciousness as an intuition of an object (A402). The ineliminably subjective nature of self-consciousness, and the elusiveness of the “I” in the context of that activity, are thus the well known bases for Kant’s response to rational psychology, and the doctrine of apperception plays an important role in Kant’s rejection. For in each case, Kant thinks that a feature of self-consciousness (the essentially subjectival, unitary and identical nature of the “I” of apperception) gets transmuted into a metaphysics of a self (as an object) that is ostensibly “known” through reason alone to be substantial, simple, identical, etc. This slide from the “I” of apperception to the constitution of an object (the soul) has received considerable attention in the secondary literature, and has fueled a great deal of attention to the Kantian theory of mind and mental activity.

The claim that the ‘I’ of apperception yields no object of knowledge (for it is not itself an object, but only the “vehicle” for any representation of objectivity as such) is fundamental to Kant’s critique of rational psychology. Kant thus spends a considerable amount of time arguing that no object is given in transcendental self-consciousness, and thus that the rational psychologist’s efforts to discern features of the self, construed as a metaphysical entity, through reason alone are without merit. To elucidate the ways in which the rational psychologist is nevertheless seduced into making this slide from formal representations of self consciousness to a metaphysics of the self, Kant examines each of the psychological arguments, maintaining that all such arguments about the soul are dialectical. He refers to the arguments designed to draw such conclusions, “transcendental paralogisms”, and hence the chapter of the Critique that criticizes rational psychology goes by the name “The Paralogisms of Pure Reason.” A transcendental paralogism, according to Kant, is a “syllogism in which one is constrained, by a transcendental ground, to draw a formally invalid conclusion” (A341/B399). Kant’s subsequent efforts are thus directed towards demonstrating the paralogistic (fallacious) nature of the arguments about the soul.

Kant’s diagnosis of the fallacies has received considerable attention, and has generated considerable controversy. In each case, Kant tells us, the argument is guilty of the fallacy of sophisma figurae dictionis, or the fallacy of equivocation/ambiguous middle. Kant suggests that in each of the syllogisms, a term is used in different senses in the major and minor premises. Consider the first paralogism, the argument that allegedly deduces the substantiality of the soul. In the A edition, Kant formulates the argument as follows:

That the representation of which is the absolute subject of our judgments and cannot be employed as determination of any other thing, is substance.

I, as thinking being, am the absolute subject of all my possible judgments and this representation of myself cannot be employed as determination of any other thing.

Therefore, I, as thinking being (soul), am substance. (A349)

Kant locates the equivocation contained in the argument in the use of the term “substance.” According to Kant, the major premise uses this term “transcendentally” whereas the minor premise and conclusion use the same term “empirically.” (A403). What Kant appears to mean is this: the major premise deploys the term “substance” in a very general way, one which abstracts from the conditions of our sensible intuition (space and time). As such, the major premise simply offers the most general definition of substance, and thus expresses the most general rule in accordance with which objects might be able to be thought as substances. Nevertheless, in order to apply the concept of substance in such a way as to determine an object, the category would have to be used empirically. Unfortunately, such an empirical use is precluded by the fact that the alleged object to which it is being applied is not empirical. Even more problematically, on Kant’s view, there is no object given at all. In Kantian jargon, the category only yields knowledge of objects if it is “schematized,” applied to given objects under the conditions of time.

This same kind of complaint is lodged against each of the paralogistic syllogisms that characterize Rational Psychology. Thus, Kant argues against the inference to the simplicity of the soul, by remarking that the psychologist surreptitiously deduces the actual simplicity of a metaphysical object simply from the formal features of subjectivity (the fact that the “I” is unitary in our representational economy). The personal identity of the soul is attacked on similar grounds. In each case the metaphysical conclusion is said to be drawn only by an equivocation in the use or meaning of a concept of the understanding.

This illustrates Kant’s efforts to demonstrate the fallacious nature of the arguments that characterize metaphysics, as well as his interest in identifying the sources of such errors. Given this, Kant’s criticisms of rational psychology are not as straightforward as one might expect, for embedded in his criticisms of rational psychology are actually a number of distinct charges: 1) The idea of the soul, although it is one to which we are naturally led in our quest for the unconditioned ground of thought, does not correspond to any object that is (or could be) actually given to us in intuition. The hypostatization of this idea, therefore, although it may be natural, is deeply problematic. 2) Because the idea of the soul does not yield, by itself alone, any knowable object, the arguments about it, although they may have the appearance of being legitimate, in fact involve dialectical applications of concepts. The arguments, in other words, involve fallacies that vitiate their conclusions. 3) The arguments are traceable back to certain features of human reason that may not be eradicated, but that can and ought to be curbed and critically reinterpreted. More specifically, the demand for the unconditioned, and the idea of the soul to which it gives rise, may be construed regulatively as devices for guiding inquiries, but never constitutively — never, that is, as yielding grounds for any a priori synthetic knowledge of a metaphysical self given immediately to pure reason.

Kant’s Paralogisms have received considerable and focused attention in the secondary literature. See Ameriks (1992), Brook (1994), Kitcher, Patricia (1990), Powell (1990), Sellars (1969, 1971), Wolff, R. P. (1963). There are also excellent discussions to be found in Allison (1983, 2004), Bennett (1974), Buroker (2006), Grier (2001, forthcoming), Guyer (1987), Wuerth (2010, 2021) (2010), Bird (2006), Ameriks (2006), Melnick (2006), Dyck (2014), Proops (2010), Willaschek (2018)

4. The World and Rational Cosmology

The second discipline of rationalist metaphysics rejected by Kant is Rational Cosmology. Rational cosmology is concerned with the arguments about the nature and constitution of the “world,” understood as the sum-total of all appearances (objects and events in space and time) (A420/B448). The arguments about the world occupy an especially important place in Kant’s rejection of metaphysics. Not only does Kant address himself to the task of discounting the metaphysical arguments in cosmology, but the resolution to some of these conflicts provides, he claims, an indirect argument for his own transcendental idealism.

The arguments about the world are referred to by Kant as “antinomies” because in the field of cosmology, reason gives rise to sets of opposing arguments (the “thesis” and the “antithesis”) with respect to each issue. Thus, the case here differs from the paralogisms (and, as we shall see, from the Ideal). The reason for this difference resides in the nature of the idea of reason in question. The idea of the “world” purports to be an idea of an unconditioned but somehow still sensible object (cf. A479/B509). Unlike the soul and God, which are clearly supposed to be non-sensible metaphysical entities, the sum total of all appearances refers specifically to spatio-temporal objects or events. Kant highlights this unique feature of the idea of the world by noting that whereas the ideas of the soul and God are “pseudo-rational,” the idea of the world is “pseudo-empirical.” It is precisely this feature of the idea (that it both purports to refer to a somehow sensible object AND that it involves thinking that object as already given in its unconditioned totality) that leads to the two opposed sets of arguments. For with respect to each problem addressed (the finitude vs. the infinitude of the world, freedom vs. causality, etc.), one can either adopt a broadly “dogmatic” (Platonic) or broadly “empiricist” (Epicurean) approach, each reflecting a different way of thinking the totality of conditions (See A471–2/B499–500). More specifically, one can either think the unconditioned as an intelligible ground of appearances, or as the total (even if infinite) set of all appearances. Unfortunately, each of these conceptual strategies is unsatisfying. To accommodate the thesis interest in ultimate (intelligible) beginnings is to posit something “too big” for the understanding, something that is never to be met with empirically (e.g., freedom, ultimately simple substances). Thus, although the thesis positions satisfy reason’s demand for the unconditioned, they do so by fleeing (however unwittingly) into an intelligible realm, by providing explanations that abstract from that which is or could be given in any spatio-temporal experience. But adopting the empiricist approach is no more rewarding, in the final analysis; although the antithesis positions remain securely lodged within “nature’s own resources,” they can never measure up to the demands of reason’s ideas. Such a strategy is “too small” for reason which, even despite its capacity to think beyond all standards of sense and by its demand for more thorough explanation. Worse, the antithesis arguments, in refusing to go beyond the spatio-temporal realm, end up being just as dogmatic as their opposites, for the assumption is that whatever holds within space and time also holds generally. To assume this is to take what are for Kant merely subjective features of our intuition (forms of sensibility, space and time) to be universal ontological conditions holding of everything whatsoever.

Because both sides to the cosmological disputes seem to be able to argue successfully against the opposite, Kant finds in the antinomies a dramatic exhibition of the “conflict” into which reason inevitably falls (and in which it will remain) so long as it fails to adopt his own transcendental distinction between appearances and things in themselves. The historical debacle of reason’s conflict with itself provides Kant with a dramatic exhibition of the vacillation of reason between two alternatives, neither of which it can accept (or dismiss) without dissatisfaction. Left unresolved, this conflict leads to the “euthanasia of pure reason” (A407/B434), in the sense of provoking skeptical despair.

4.1 The Mathematical Antinomies

There are four “antinomies” of pure reason, and Kant divides them into two classes. The first two antinomies are dubbed “mathematical” antinomies, presumably because in each case, we are concerned with the relation between what are alleged to be sensible objects (either the world itself, or objects in it) and space and time. An important and fundamental aspect of Kant’s rejection of each of these sets of arguments rests on his view that each of these conflicts is traceable back to a fundamental error, an error that can be discerned, according to Kant, in the following dialectical syllogism:

If the conditioned is given, then the whole series of conditions, a series which is therefore itself absolutely unconditioned, is also given

Objects of the senses are given as conditioned

Consequently, the entire series of all conditions of objects of the senses is already given. (cf. A497/B525).

There are a number of problems with this argument, according to Kant. Obviously, one problem is located in the major premise, in the assumption that the unconditioned is “already given.” The problem, maintains Kant, is that such a totality is never to be met with in experience. The rational assumption that the total series of all conditions is already given would hold only for things in themselves. In the realm of appearances, the totality is never given to us, as finite discursive knowers. The most we are entitled to say, with respect to appearances, is that the unconditioned is set as a task, that there is a rational prescription to continue to seek explanations (A498/B526-A500/B528). As finite (sensible) cognizers, however, we shall never achieve an absolute completion of knowledge. To assume that we can do so is to adopt the theocentric model of knowledge characteristic of the dreaded transcendental realist.

This hypostatization of the idea of the world, the fact that it is taken to be a mind-independent object, acts as the underlying assumption motivating both parties to the two mathematical antinomies. The first antinomy concerns the finitude or infinitude of the spatio-temporal world. The thesis argument seeks to show that the world in space and time is finite, i.e., has a beginning in time and a limit in space. The antithesis counters that it is infinite with regard to both space and time. The second antinomy concerns the ultimate constitution of objects in the world, with the thesis arguing for ultimately simple substances, whereas the antithesis argues that objects are infinitely divisible. In this, the thesis positions are each concerned to bring the explanatory effort to a close, by arguing for ultimate or, as Kant says, “intelligible beginnings” (cf. A466/B494). The claim that there is a “first beginning” or an ultimately simple substance is sustained only by abstracting from the spatio-temporal framework. The alleged proponent of the antithesis arguments, on the other hand, refuses any conclusion that goes beyond the sensible conditions of space and time. According to the antithesis arguments, the world is infinite in both space and time (these being infinite as well), and bodies are (in accordance with the infinite divisibility of space) also infinitely divisible.

In each of these antinomial conflicts, reason finds itself at an impasse. Satisfying the demands placed by our rational capacity to think beyond experience, the thesis arguments offer what appears to be a satisfying resting-place for explanation. The antithesis charges that such a strategy fails to find any confirmation, and, citing the unjustified flight into an intelligible realm, lodges itself squarely in the domain of “experience.” In each of these cases, the conflicts are resolved by demonstrating that the conclusions drawn on both sides are false.

How does Kant demonstrate this? Both the thesis and antithesis arguments are apagogic, i.e., that they constitute indirect proofs. An indirect proof establishes its conclusion by showing the impossibility of its opposite. Thus, for example, we may want to know, as in the first antinomy, whether the world is finite or infinite. We can seek to show that it is finite by demonstrating the impossibility of its infinitude. Alternatively, we may demonstrate the infinitude of the world by showing that it is impossible that it is finite. This is exactly what the thesis and antithesis arguments purport to do, respectively. The same strategy is deployed in the second antinomy, where the proponent of the thesis position argues for the necessity of some ultimately simple substance by showing the impossibility of infinite divisibility of substance, etc.

Obviously, the success of the proofs depends on the legitimacy of the exclusive disjunction agreed to by both parties. Both parties, that is, assume that “there is a world,” and that it is, for example, “either finite or infinite.” Herein lies the problem, according to Kant. The world is, for Kant, neither finite nor infinite. The opposition between these two alternatives is merely dialectical. In the cosmological debates, each party to the dispute falls prey to the ambiguity in the idea of the world.

Kant thus structures his analysis of the mathematical antinomies by appealing to the general dialectical syllogism presented at the end of section 4.0 (If the conditioned is given, the unconditioned is given, Objects of the senses are given as conditioned....etc.). Problems stem from the application of the principle expressed in the first premise to the objects of the senses (appearances). Here again, Kant diagnoses the error or fallacy contained in this syllogism as that of ambiguous middle. He claims that the major premise uses the term “the conditioned” transcendentally, as a pure concept, whereas the minor premise uses the term ‘empirically’ – that is as a “concept of the understanding applied to mere appearances” (cf. A499–500/B527–528). What Kant means is that the major premise uses the term “the conditioned” in a very general way, one that considers things in abstraction from the sensible conditions of our intuition. The minor premise, however, which specifically refers to objects in space and time (appearances), is committed to an empirical use of the term. Indeed, such an empirical use would have to be deployed, if the conclusion is to be reached. The conclusion is that the entire series of all conditions of appearances is actually given. Put in other terms, the conclusion is that there is a world, understood as the sum total of all appearances and their conditions (A420/B448).

4.2 The Dynamical Antinomies

In the dynamical antinomies, Kant changes his strategy somewhat. Rather than arguing (as in the mathematical antinomies) that both conclusions are false, Kant suggests that both sides to the dispute might turn out to be correct. This option is available here, and not in the two mathematical antinomies, because the proponents of the thesis arguments are not committing themselves solely to claims about spatio-temporal objects. In the third antinomy, the thesis contends that in addition to mechanistic causality, we must posit some first uncaused causal power (Transcendental Freedom), while the antithesis denies anything but mechanistic causality. Here, then, the debate is the standard (though in this case, the specifically cosmological) dispute between freedom and determinism. Finally, in the fourth antinomy, the requirement for a necessary being is pitted against its opposite. The thesis position argues for a necessary being, whereas the antithesis denies that there is any such being.

In both cases the thesis opts for a position that is abstracted from the spatio-temporal framework, and thus adopts the broadly Platonic view. The postulation of freedom amounts to the postulation of a non-temporal cause, a causality outside the series of appearances in space and time (A451/B479). Similarly, in its efforts to argue for a “necessary being,” reason is forced (against its own argument) into a non-sensible realm. If there is a necessary being, it will have to be “outside” the series of appearances: “Either, therefore, reason through its demand for the unconditioned must remain in conflict with itself, or this unconditioned must be posited outside the series, in the intelligible” (A564/B592). The rational necessity of postulating such a necessary being or a causality of freedom satisfies the rational demand for intelligible explanation. Against this, the antithesis rightly notes that the conception of transcendental freedom, or a necessary being, again represents an attempt to abstract from “nature’s own resources” (A451–2/B479–80). Insofar as the antithesis denies the justification for doing this, of course, it is said to adopt a broadly Epicurean standpoint. The problem here, however, is that in refusing to move beyond “nature’s own resources,” the antithesis surreptitiously smuggles in spatio-temporal conditions as the basis for a universal ontological claim that nevertheless transcends all experience. If space and time were things in themselves, then of course the application of the demand for this unconditioned would be warranted. Kant’s view, however, is that space and time are not conditions of things in themselves.

The resolution to these antinomies here consists in giving each side its due, but simultaneously limiting the domain over which the claims hold. The thesis demand for an absolute causal beginning or a necessary being might well be allowed to stand, but certainly not as “part of” or as an explication of appearances in nature. Similarly, the antithesis conclusions can stand, but only in relation to objects in nature, considered as appearances. Here, the conflict seems irresolvable only on the assumption that appearances are things in themselves. If appearances were things in themselves, for example, then it would certainly seem true that either they are one and all subject to mechanistic causality, or not. In such a case, it makes sense both to argue for a non-temporal beginning and to deny such a beginning. Left unresolved, then, this antinomy leaves us wit the following dilemma: on the assumption of transcendental realism, both nature and freedom seem to be undermined. To avoid this, Kant appeals to transcendental idealism, which is supposed to rescue reason from the conflict. Given transcendental idealism (with its distinction between appearances and things in themselves) it remains possible that in addition to the mechanism of nature, or contingent existence, there is an intelligible causal power, or a necessary being.

Detailed discussions of Kant’s antinomies can be found in Al-Azm (1972), Bennett, (1974), Grier (2001, 2006, forthcoming), Guyer (1987), Heimsoeth (1967), Strawson (1966), Thiel (2006), Watkins (1998, 2000), Van Cleve (1984). See also Allison (1983), and Walsh (1975). See also Bird (2006), Wood (2010), Wuerth (2021), Willaschek (2018).

5. God and Rational Theology

The metaphysical drive, and the demand for the unconditioned, seem to find their natural resting place in the idea of God, an absolutely necessary and supremely real being, the concept of which “contains a therefore for every wherefore” (A585/B613). It is here, in the concept of God, that the demands for systematic unity and completeness of knowledge find their “objective correlate.” Kant refers to this idea as an Ideal, suggesting it defines itself as a “concept of an individual object which is completely determined through the mere idea” (A574/B602). The Ideal represents the highest singular manifestation of reason’s demand for the unconditioned.

The last area of metaphysics under attack, then, is Rational Theology. Kant’s criticism of rational theology is complicated by his desire to elucidate the sources of the dialectical errors, which he will expose in relation to the specific arguments for God’s existence. (“…Merely to describe the procedure of our reason and its dialectic does not suffice; we must also endeavor to discover the sources of this dialectic, that we may explain…the illusion to which it has given rise” (A581/B607).) Kant thus spends a considerable amount of time tracing the idea of God back to its rational, speculative, sources. According to Kant, “….the Ideal …is based on a natural, not a merely arbitrary idea” (A581/B607). On this score, Kant wants to tell us that we are compelled to think the idea of God (the ens realissimum) when pursuing certain speculative or philosophical interests. More specifically, the idea of a supremely real being (the ens realissimum) is one to which we are inevitably led during our attempts to account for the pure possibility of things in general. The upshot that the idea of the ens realissimum is not an arbitrary or easily dispensable one. Instead, Kant suggests that reason is philosophically constrained to move to such an idea in its efforts to thoroughly determine every thing. Such efforts require thinking the totality, or “All” of reality (the omnitudo realitatis). Such an idea is philosophically required because, in our efforts to thoroughly determine each thing (to know it completely, specify it exhaustively), we must be able to say, of every possible predicate and its contradictory (p v ˜p) which of the two holds of the thing in question. (For every object, it is either A or not A, either B or not B, etc., and this process is iterated until each predicate pair (each positive reality) is exhausted — Kant clearly has a Leibnizian procedure of complete determination in mind here.) This process is parasitic upon the idea of “sum total of all predicates of things in general.” Or, put in another way, we represent “every thing as deriving its own possibility from the share it has in the whole of possibility” (A572/B600). Such an idea, the All of reality, however, defines itself as an individual thing, and leads us to the representation of the “supremely real being.” The problem seems to come in, according to Kant, when the “All” of reality gets hypostatized, and (eventually) personified, thus yielding the ens realissimum (cf. A583/B611n). Here again, Kant thinks that this idea itself gets transmuted into the notion of a given object by virtue of a unique subreption, whereby we dialectically substitute for a principle that is only meant for empirical employment one which holds of things in general. The argument Kant offers is excruciating, but the essential point is that, just as the idea of the soul involved the subreption of the hypostatized consciousness, so too, the idea of the ens realissimum is generated by both a subrepted principle and a hypostatization.

As in the cases of both rational psychology and rational cosmology, then, one central problem thus has to do with the assumption that pure (speculative) reason yields any access to a transcendent object (in this case, God) about which it is entitled to seek a priori knowledge. Despite his insistence that the idea of God is indispensable and “inescapable” (cf. A584/B612), Kant again denies that we can acquire any theoretical knowledge of the alleged “object” thought through such an idea. On the one hand, then, the idea of God is “the crown of our endeavors.” On the other, as in the cases of both rational psychology and cosmology, the idea answers to no given and theoretically knowable object (A339/B397). Indeed, according to Kant, the idea of God should not lead us to “presuppose the existence of a being that corresponds to this ideal, but only the idea of such a being, and this only for the purpose of deriving from an unconditioned totality of complete determination the conditioned totality. i.e., the limited…” (A578/B606). As in the other disciplines of metaphysics, Kant suggests that we are motivated (perhaps even constrained) to represent the idea as a real object, to hypostatize it, in accordance the demand for the unconditioned:

Notwithstanding this pressing need of reason to presuppose something that may afford the understanding a sufficient foundation for the complete determination of its concepts, it is yet too easily conscious of the ideal and merely fictitious character of such a presuppostion to allow itself, on this ground alone, to be persuaded that a mere creature of its own thought is a real being — were it not that it is impelled from another direction to seek a resting place in the regress from the conditioned, which is given, to the unconditioned (A584/B612)

This demand for the unconditioned, according to Kant, links up with a demand for some ultimately necessary being. Reason, that is, ceaselessly demands the ground of all the contingent beings in existence, and will not rest until it settles on the absolutely necessary being which grounds them. The idea of the ens realissimum plays a singular role in satisfying this desire of reason, for of all concepts, it is that “which best squares with the concept of an unconditionally necessary being” (A586/B614). In fact, according to Kant rational theology is based on the coincidence of the rational demands for a supremely real being and for a being with absolutely necessary existence. If the movement to the idea of God, as the unconditioned ground, is inevitable, it is nevertheless as troublesome as the other rational ideas:

This unconditioned is not, indeed, given as being in itself real, nor as having a reality that follows from its mere concept; it is, however, what alone can complete the series of conditions when we proceed to trace these conditions to their grounds. This is the course which our human reason, by its very nature, leads all of us (A584/B612; cf. A584/B612n).

Thus, although Kant is most well known for his attacks on the specific arguments for God’s existence, his criticisms of rational theology are in fact more detailed, and involve a robust critique of the idea of God itself. This account of the rational origin and the importance of the idea of God clears the way for Kant’s rejection of the metaphysical arguments about God’s existence. Kant identifies three traditional arguments, the ontological, the cosmological, and the physico-theological (the argument from design). What all such arguments do is attempt to wed the idea of the ens realissimum with the notion of necessary existence. Whereas the Ontological argument moves from the concept of the ens realissimum to the claim that such a being exists necessarily, the Cosmological and physico-theological arguments move from some necessary being to the conclusion that such a being must be the ens realissimum.

5.1 The Ontological Argument

Kant’s formulation of the ontological argument is fairly straightforward, and may be summarized as follows:

  1. God, the ens realissimum, is the concept of a being that contains all reality/predicates.
  2. Existence is a reality/predicate.
  3. Therefore God exists.

Kant’s identification of the errors involved in this argument are so varied that it seems surprising that he is so often simply said to have argued against the use of “existence” as a predicate. His first complaint is that it is “contradictory” insofar as it introduces “existence” into the “concept of a thing which we profess to be thinking solely in reference to its possibility” (A597/B625). This suggests that he thinks that in taking “all reality” to mean or include “existence,” the rational theologist begs the question, and already posits the analytic connection between the concept of the ens realissimum and necessary existence.

At the heart of this complaint is a more general one, to wit, that there is a problem with the attempt to infer anything as necessarily existing. Although, according to Kant, reason is unavoidably led to the notion of an absolutely necessary being, the understanding is in no position to identify any candidate answering to the idea. (cf. A592/B620). Clearly, the ontological argument is designed to show that, in fact, there is one (and only one) candidate answering to this idea, namely, the ens realissimum. But it does so by deducing the necessary existence from the concept of the ens realissimum (a being that contains all reality or predicates) only via the minor premise that “existence” is a predicate or reality. Kant, however, famously denies that existence is a “real predicate,” or determination. Thus, one criticism is that the argument conflates merely logical with real (determining) predicates. A real (determining) predicate is one that enlarges the concept to which it is attached. It seems clear that the locus of the error here, as in the other metaphysical disciplines, is the view that the idea of the ens realissimum provides us with a concept of an “object” to which it would be appropriate to apply categories or concepts in a determining way. Thus, included in Kant’s criticism is the claim that the category of existence is being subject to a transcendental misemployment (A598/B626). This misapplication of the category is problematic precisely because, according to Kant, we are dealing only with an object of pure thought, whose existence cannot be known (A602/B630).

5.2 The Other Proofs

If the ontological argument seeks to move from the concept of the ens realissimum to the concept of an absolutely necessary being, both the cosmological and physicotheological proofs move in the opposite direction. Each, that is, argues that there is something that must exist with absolute necessity and concludes that this being is the ens realissimum. Because these proofs aim to identify the ens realissimum with the necessary being, and because the attempt to do this requires an a priori argument (it cannot be demonstrated empirically), Kant thinks that they are both (ultimately) vitiated by their reliance on the ontological proof. More specifically, they are both mitigated by their assumption that the ens realissimum is the only object or candidate that can do the job of existing necessarily. Since he thinks that the ontological argument is in some sense implicitly relied upon in making such a claim, these arguments stand or fall with it. On Kant’s view, as we shall see, they fall.

The cosmological proof has, according to Kant, two parts. As above, the proponent of the argument first seeks to demonstrate the existence of an absolutely necessary being. Second, the rational cosmologist seeks to show that this absolutely necessary being is the ens realissimum.

As Kant formulates it, the cosmological argument is as follows:

If something exists, then an absolutely necessary being must also exist.

I myself, at least, exist.

Therefore an absolutely necessary being exists.

As above, the theist will ultimately want to identify this necessary being with the ens realissimum, an identification which Kant thinks surreptitiously smuggles in the (dialectical) ontological argument. The claim here is that the proponent of the cosmological argument is committed ultimately to accepting the ontological argument, given her attempt to identify the necessary being with the ens realissimum. Although this suggests that the cosmological argument relies on the ontological, Kant also indicates that the effort to produce a purely a priori argument for God’s existence (the ontological argument) itself gets momentum from reason’s need to find the necessary ground for existence in general, a need expressed in the cosmological argument (cf. A603–04/B631–32). This suggests that Kant takes the ontological and cosmological arguments to be complementary expressions of the one underlying rational demand for the unconditioned.

Even aside from its alleged commitment to the ontological argument, Kant has a number of complaints about the cosmological argument. Indeed, according to Kant, the cosmological argument is characterized by an “entire nest of dialectical presumptions” which must be illuminated and “destroyed” (A609/B637). These dialectical presumptions include the attempt to infer from the contingent (within experience) to some cause lying outside the world of sense altogether, an effort involving a transcendental misapplication of the categories. It also includes, Kant claims, the dialectical effort to infer from the conceptual impossibility of an infinite series of causes to some actual first cause outside of sense. Such efforts involve a “false self-satisfaction” according to which reason feels itself to have finally landed on a truly necessary being. Unfortunately, according to Kant, this is only achieved by conflating the merely logical possibility of a concept (that it is not self-contradictory) with the transcendental (real) possibility of a thing. In short, the cosmological argument gets its momentum by confusing rational or subjective necessities with real or objective ones, and thus involves transcendental illusion (cf. A605/B633).

We come finally to the physicotheological proof, which argues from the particular constitution of the world, specifically its beauty, order, and purposiveness, to the necessary existence of an intelligent cause (God). Such an argument goes beyond the cosmological one by moving not from existence in general but from some determinate experience in order to demonstrate the existence of God (A621/B649). Although this might seem to be a strength, this strategy is doomed to fail, according to Kant. No experience could ever be adequate to the idea of a necessary, original being: “The transcendental idea of a necessary all-sufficient original being is so overwhelmingly great, so sublimely high above everything empirical, which is at all times conditioned, that partly one can never even procure enough material in experience to fill such a concept, and partly if one searches for the unconditioned among conditioned things, then one will seek forever and always in vain” (A621/B649).

Kant’s claim is that even if we could grant that the order and purposiveness of nature gives us good reason to suppose some intelligent designer, it does not warrant the inference to an ens realissimum. At most, Kant tells us, the proof could establish a “highest architect of the world…., but not a creator of the world.” (A627/B655). The last inference, that to the ens realissimum, is only drawn by moving far away from any consideration of the actual (empirical) world. In other words, here too, Kant thinks that the rational theologist is relying on a transcendental (a priori) argument. Indeed, according to Kant, the physicotheological proof could never, given its empirical starting point, establish the existence of a highest being by itself alone, and must rely on the ontological argument at crucial stages (cf. A625/B653). Since, according to Kant, the ontological argument fails, so does the physicotheological one.

Although Kant rejects the physiciotheological argument as a theoretical proof for God’s existence, he also sees in it a powerful expression of reason’s need to recognize in nature purposive unity and design (cf. A625/B651). In this, the physicotheological argument’s emphasis on the purposiveness and systematic unity of nature illuminates an assumption that Kant takes to be essential to our endeavors in the natural sciences. The essential role played by the assumption of purposive and systematic unity, and the role it plays in scientific inquiries, is taken up by Kant in the Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic. To this topic we now turn.

For some discussions of the Ideal of Pure Reason and Rational Theology, see Caimi (1995). England (1968), Grier (2001, forthcoming), Henrich (1960), Longuenesse (1995, 2005), Rohs (1978), Walsh (1975), and Wood (1978), Chignell (2009), Grier (2010), Chignell (2014), Wuerth (2021), Willaschek (2018)

6. Reason and the Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic

The criticisms of the metaphysical arguments offered in the Transcendental Dialectic do not bring Kant’s discussion to a close. Indeed, in an “Appendix” to the Transcendental Dialectic, Kant returns to the issue of reason’s positive or necessary role. The curious “Appendix” has provoked a great deal of confusion, and not without reason. After all, the entire thrust of the Dialectic seemed to be directed at “critiquing” and curbing pure reason, and undermining its pretense to any real use. Nevertheless, Kant goes on to suggest that the very reason that led us into metaphysical error is also the source of certain necessary ideas and principles, and moreover, that these rational postulations play an essential role in scientific theorizing (A645/B673; A671/B699). Exactly what role they are supposed to play in this regard is less clear.

The Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic is divided into two parts. In the first, “On the Regulative Use of the Ideas of Pure Reason,” Kant attempts to identify some proper “immanent” use for reason. In its most general terms, Kant is here concerned to establish a necessary role for reason’s principle of systematic unity. This principle was first formulated by Kant in the Introduction to the Transcendental Dialectic in two forms, one prescriptive, and the other in what sounded to be a metaphysical claim. In the first, prescriptive form, the principle enjoins us to “Find for the conditioned knowledge given through the understanding the unconditioned whereby its unity is brought to completion.” The complementary metaphysical principle assures us that the “unconditioned” is indeed given and there to be found. Taken together, these principles express reason’s interests in securing systematic unity of knowledge and bringing such knowledge to completion.

Kant is quite clear that he takes reason’s demand for systematicity to play an important role in empirical inquiry. In connection with this, Kant suggests that the coherent operation of the understanding somehow requires reason’s guiding influence, particularly if we are to unify the knowledge given through the real use of the understanding into scientific theory (cf. A651–52/B679–80). To order knowledge systematically, for Kant, means to subsume or unify it under fewer and fewer principles in light of the idea of one “whole of knowledge” so that its parts are exhibited in their necessary connections (cf. 646/B674). The idea of the form of a whole of knowledge is thus said to postulate “complete unity in the knowledge obtained by the understanding, by which this knowledge is to be not a mere contingent aggregate, but a system connected according to necessary laws” (A646/B676). Having said this, it should be noted that Kant’s position is, in its details, difficult to pin down. Sometimes Kant suggests merely that we ought to seek systematic unity of knowledge, and this merely for own theoretical convenience (A771/B799-A772/B800). Other times, however, he suggests that we must assume that the nature itself conforms to our demands for systematic unity, and this necessarily, if we are to secure even an empirical criterion of truth (cf. A651–53/B679–81). The precise status of the demand for systematicity is therefore somewhat controversial.

Regardless of these more subtle textual issues Kant remains committed to the view that reason’s proper use is always only “regulative” and never constitutive. The distinction between the regulative and the constitutive may be viewed as describing two different ways in which the claims of reason may be interpreted. A principle of reason is constitutive, according to Kant, when it is taken to supply a concept of a real object (A306/B363; A648/B676). Throughout the Dialectic Kant argued against this (constitutive) interpretation of the ideas and principles of reason, claiming that reason so far transcends possible experience that there is nothing in experience that corresponds with its ideas. Although Kant denies that reason is constitutive he nevertheless, as we have seen, insists that it has an “indispensably necessary” regulative use. In accordance with reason’s demand, the understanding is guided and led to secure systematic unity and completion of knowledge. In other words, Kant seeks to show that reason’s demand for systematic unity is related to the project of empirical knowledge acquisition. Indeed, Kant links the demand for systematicity up with three other principles — those of homogeneity, specification and affinity — which he thinks express the fundamental presumptions that guide us in theory formation. The essential point seems to be that the development and expansion of empirical knowledge is always, as it were, “already” guided by the rational interests in securing unity and completion of knowledge. Without such a guiding agenda, and without the assumption that nature conforms to our rational demands for securing unity and coherence of knowledge, our scientific pursuits would lack orientation. Thus, the claim that reason’s principles play a necessary “regulative” role in science reflects Kant’s critical reinterpretation of the traditional rationalist ideal of arriving at complete knowledge.

It is connection with this that Kant argues, in the second part of the Appendix (“On the Final Aim of the Natural Dialectic of Human Reason” (A669/B697)), that the three highest ideas of reason have an important theoretical function. More specifically, in this section Kant turns from a general discussion of the important (regulative) use of the principle of systematicity, to a consideration of the three transcendental ideas (the Soul, the World, and God) at issue in the Dialectic. As examples of the unifying and guiding role of reason’s ideas, Kant had earlier appealed to the ideas of “pure earth” and “pure air” in Chemistry, or the idea of a “fundamental power” in psychological investigations (cf. A650/B678). His suggestion earlier was that these ideas are implicit in the practices governing scientific classification, and enjoin us to seek explanatory connections between disparate phenomena. As such, reason’s postulations serve to provide an orienting point towards which our explanations strive, and in accordance with which our theories progressively achieve systematic interconnection and unity. Similarly, Kant now suggests that each of the three transcendental ideas of reason at issue in the Dialectic serves as an imaginary point (focus imaginarius) towards which our investigations hypothetically converge. More specifically, he suggests that the idea of the soul serves to guide our empirical investigations in psychology, the idea of the world grounds physics, and the idea of God grounds the unification of these two branches of natural science into one unified Science (cf. A684/B712-A686/B714). In each of these cases, Kant claims, the idea allows us to represent (problematically) the systematic unity towards which we aspire and which we presuppose in empirical studies. In accordance with the idea of God, for example, we “consider every connection in the world according to principles [Principien] of a systematic unity, hence as if they had all arisen from one single all-encompassing being, as supreme and all-sufficient cause” (A686/B714). Such a claim, controversial as it is, illuminates Kant’s view that empirical inquiries are one and all undertaken in light of the rational goal of a single unified body of knowledge. It also points towards the Kantian view, later emphasized in the Transcendental Doctrine of Method, that reason’s theoretical and practical interests ultimately form a higher unity.

For discussions on the Appendix and the role of reason and systematicity, see Allison (2004), Brandt (1989), Buchdahl (1967), Britton (1978), Forster (2000), Friedman (1992), Ginsborg (1990), Grier (2001, forthcoming), Guyer (1990a, 1990b), Horstmann (1989), O’Neill (1992), Patricia Kitcher (1991), Philip Kitcher (1984), Nieman (1994), MacFarland (1970), Walker (1990), Walsh (1975), Wartenberg (1979, 1992), Rauscher (2010), Willaschek (2018).

For an important discussion on the “unity” of theoretical and practical reason, see again Forster (2000). See also Velkley (1989).


Relevant Works by Kant (includes German editions and translations):

  • Critique of Practical Reason, 1956, trans. L. W. Beck, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Critique of Pure Reason, 1929, trans. N. Kemp Smith, New York: St. Martin’s Press
  • Gesammelte Schriften, 1922, Koniglich Preussischen Akademie der Wissenschaften edition, Berlin and Leipzig: de Gruyter
  • Kant: Philosophical Correspondence , 1759–99, 1970, ed. and trans. A. Zweig, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Kritik der reinen Vernunft, 1954, ed. R. Schmidt, Hamburg: Felix Meiner
  • Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, trans. J. Ellington, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics, 1950, trans. L.W. Beck, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Kant: Selected Pre-Critical Writings and Correspondence with Beck, 1968, trans. G. B. Kerferd and D. E. Walford, Manchester: Manchester University Press
  • Lectures on Philosophical Theology, 1978, trans. Allen Wood and Gertrude M. Clark, Ithaca: Cornell University Press
  • First Introdcution to the Critique of Judgment, 1965, trans. James haden, New York: Bobbs-Merrill Press
  • The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant: Lectures on Metaphysics, 1997, trans. and ed. Karl Ameriks and Steve Naragan, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant. Lectures on Logic, 1992, trans. and ed. J. Michael Young, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant: The Critique of Pure Reason, 1998, trans. and ed. Paul Guyer and Allen Wood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press

Selected Secondary Readings on Topics in Kant’s Dialectic

  • Al-Azm, S., 1972, The Origins of Kant’s Argument in the Antinomies, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ameriks, K., 1992, “The Critique of Metaphysics: Kant and Traditional Ontology,” in Cambridge Companion to Kant, ed. Paul Guyer, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2006, “The Critique of Metaphysics: The structure and Fate of Kant’s Dialectic,” in P. Guyer (ed.), Kant and Modern Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 269–302.
  • –––, 1982, Kant’s Theory of Mind, Oxford: Clarendon Press
  • Allison, H., 1983, Kant’s Transcendental Idealism, New Haven: Yale University Press
  • –––, 2004, Kant’s Transcendental Idealism, revised and expanded version, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Bennett, J., 1974, Kant’s Dialectic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bird, G., 2006, The Revolutionary Kant, Chicago: Open Court.
  • Bird, G. (ed.), 2006, A Companion to Kant, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Buroker, J., 2006, Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason: An Introduction, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Brandt, Reinhardt, 1989, “The Deductions in the Critique of Judgment: Comments on Hampshire and Horstmann,” in Kant’s Transcendental Deductions, Eckhard Forster (ed.), Stanford: Stanford University Press, pp. 177–190.
  • Brook, A., 1994, Kant and the Mind, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • Brittan, Gordon G., 1978, Kant’s Theory of Science, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Buchdahl, Gerd, 1969, Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Science. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Butts, R., 1997, “Kant’s Dialectic and the Logic of Illusion,” in Logic and the Workings of the Mind, ed. Patricia Easton, Atascadero, California: Ridgeview,
  • Caimi, M., 1995, “On a Non-Regulative Function of the Ideal of Pure Reason,” Proceedings of the Eighth International Kant Congress, ed. Hoke Robinson, Volume 1, Part 2 (3A-3L): 539–549.
  • Dyck, C., 2014, Kant and Rational Psychology, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • England, F. E., 1968, Kant’s Conception of God, New York: Humanities Press.
  • Forster, Eckhard, 2000, Kant’s Final Synthesis: An Essay on the Opus Postumum, Cambridge and London: Harvard University Press.
  • Friedman, M., 1992, “Causal Laws and Foundations of Natural Science,” in Cambridge Companion to Kant, ed. Paul Guyer, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press: 161–199.
  • Ginsborg, H., 1990, The Role of Taste in Kant’s Theory of Cognition. New York and London: Garland Publishing Company.
  • Grier, M. , 2001, Kant’s Doctrine of Transcendental Illusion, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • –––, 2006, “The Logic of Illusion and the Antinomies,” in Bird (ed.) 2006, Oxford: Blackwell: 192–207.
  • –––, 2010, “The Ideal of Pure Reason,” in P. Guyer (ed.) 2010, pp. 266–289.
  • –––, forthcoming, “The Transcendental Dialectic,” in S. Baiasu and M. Timmons (eds.), The Kantian Mind, London: Routledge.
  • Guyer, P., 1987, Kant and the Claims of Knowledge, Cambridge: Cambridge University press
  • –––, 1990a, “Kant’s Conception of Empirical law,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Supplementary Volume), 64: 220–242.
  • –––, 1990b, “Reason and Reflective Judgment: Kant on the Significance of Systematicity,” Noûs, 24: 17–43.
  • Guyer, P. (ed.), 1992, The Cambridge Companion to Kant, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • ––– (ed.), 2010, The Cambridge Companion to the Critique of Pure Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Heimsoeth, H., 1967, Transzendentale Dialektik. Ein Commentar su Kants Kritik d. reinen Vernunft. Berlin: de Gruyter
  • Henrich, D., 1960, Der Ontologische Gottesbeweis. Sein Problem und seine Geschichte In der Neuzeit, Tubingen: Morh.
  • Horstmann, Rolph P., 1989, “Why must there be a Deduction in Kant’s Critique of Judgment?” in Kant’s Transcendental Deductions, ed. E. Forster, pp. 157–176. Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Kitcher, P., 1990, Kant’s Transcendental Psychology, Oxford: Oxford University Press
  • Longuenesse, B., 1995, “Transcendental Ideal and the Unity of the Critical System,” in Proceedings of the Eighth International Kant Congress, ed. Hoke Robinson, Volume 1, Part 2 (3A-3L), Milwaukee: Marquette University Press.
  • –––, 2005, Kant on the Human Standpoint, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Loparic, Z., 1990, “The Logical Structure of the First Antinomy,” Kant-Studien, 81: 280-303.
  • MacFarland, P., 1970, Kant’s Concept of Teleology. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University press.
  • Nieman, S., 1994, The Unity of Reason, New York: Oxford University Press
  • O’Neill, Onora, 1992, “Vindicating Reason,” in The Cambridge Companion to Kant, ed. Paul Guyer. Cambridge: Cambridge Unviersity press.
  • Rauscher, F., 2010, “The Appendix to the Dialectic and the Canon of Pure Reason: The Positive Role of Reason,” in P. Guyer (ed.) 2010, pp. 290–309.
  • Rohs, P., 1978, “Kants Prinzip der durchgangigen Bestimmung alles Seienden,” Kant-Studien, 69: 170-180.
  • Sellers, W., 1969, “Metaphysics and the Concept of a Person,” in The Logical Way of Doing Things, ed. K. Lambert, New Haven: Yale University Press: 219–232
  • –––, 1971, “…This I of He or It (the Thing) which Thinks…” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 44: 5–31
  • Powell, C. T., 1990, Kant’s Theory of Self-Consciousness, Oxford: Clarendon Press
  • Proops, I., 2010, “Kant’s First Paralogism,” Philosophical Review, 119: 449–95.
  • Strawson, P.F., 1966, The Bounds of Sense: An Essay on Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason, London: Methuen.
  • Theis, R., 1985, “De L’illusion transcendentale,” Kant-Studien, 76: 119-137.
  • Theil, U., 2006, “The Critique of Rational Psychology,” in Bird (ed.) 2006: 207–222.
  • Van Cleve, J., 1981, “Reflections on Kant’s Second Antinomy,” Synthese, 47: 481–494.
  • Velkley, R. 1989, Freedom and the End of Reason: On the Moral Foundations of Kant’s Critical Philosophy, Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press.
  • Walker, R., 1990, “Kant’s Conception of Empirical Law,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Supplementary Volume), 64: 243–258.
  • Walsh, W. H., 1975, Kant’s Criticisms of Metaphysics, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Wartenberg, T., 1979, “Order Through Reason,” Kant-Studien, 70: 409-424.
  • –––, 1992, “Reason and the Practice of Science,” in Cambridge Companion to Kant, ed. Paul Guyer, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press: 228–248.
  • Watkins, E., 1998, “Kant’s Antinomies: Sections 3–8,” Kooperativer Kommentar zu Kants Kritik der reinen Vernunft, G. Mohr & M. Willaschek (eds.), Berlin: Akademie Verlag: 445–462
  • –––, 2000, “Kant on Rational Cosmology” in Kant and the Sciences, ed E. Watkins, New York: Oxford University Press: 70–89.
  • Wilson, M., 1974, “Leibniz and Materialism,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 3: 495–513
  • Willaschek, M., 2018, Kant on the Sources of Metaphysics: The Dialectic of Pure Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wuerth, J., 2010, “The Paralogisms of Pure Reason,” in P. Guyer (ed.) 2010, pp. 210–244.
  • –––, 2021, The Cambridge Kant Lexicon, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wolff, Robert Paul, 1963, Kant’s Theory of Mental Activity, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press
  • Wood, A., 1975, “Kant’s Dialectic,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 5 (4): 595–614.
  • –––, 1978, Kant’s Rational Theology, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 2010, “The Antinomies of Pure Reason,” in P. Guyer (ed.) 2010, pp. 245–265.
  • Wood, A. (ed.), 1984, Self and Nature in Kant’s Philosophy, Ithaca: Cornell University Press

Copyright © 2022 by
Michelle Grier <mgrier@sandiego.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free