Notes to Kant’s View of the Mind and Consciousness of Self

1. All further references to Kant will be to this work unless otherwise noted. ‘A’ refers to passages in the first edition, ‘B’ to passages in the second. ‘=’ means that the passage occurs in both editions.

2. Section 3 largely repeats things said in Section 2, indeed twice, once beginning at A115, and a second time beginning just before A120, so we will focus on Section 2.

3. In this context, the term ‘aesthetic’ sounds strange to our ears. Kant is using it in a now-archaic sense in which it contrasts with ‘anaesthetic’.

4. On the relationship of a prioricity and necessity in Kant's thought and the question of whether and if so where and how he argued for the necessity of the propositions of mathematics and physics, see Brook, 1993.

5. This argument is a fine example of a transcendental argument.

6. There has been an enormous debate about what the argumentative structure of the transcendental deduction is. Henrich and Guyer both claim that Kant had two (or more) starting points for this deduction, for example. Many aspects of the debate are orthogonal to the issue of Kant’s model of the mind. We have discussed only the aspects relevant to this issue.

7. This unifying move may seem fairly unexciting but in fact it has some far-reaching implications. If right, we have no need of a higher-order thought in order to be conscious of our own psychological states, for example (Rosenthal 1991). (For a fuller discussion of this topic, see Brook and Raymont forthcoming, Ch. 5 and 6.)

8. (2) is often taken to be closely related to another putative peculiarity of consciousness of self, what Shoemaker calls immunity to error through misidentification with respect to the first person (Shoemaker 1970, who claims to have found the core of the idea in Wittgenstein 1933-4, pp.66-70). We will not explore this issue here (see Brook 2001).

9. One can compare what Kant says about reference to self to his doctrine that existence is not a predicate (A598=B626). In the same way that to be conscious of something's existence is not to be conscious of any quality of it, being conscious of oneself as oneself could be something over and above being conscious of qualities of oneself. In his criticism of Leibniz's Amphiboly, Kant says much the same thing about space and time — to be conscious of space and time is to be conscious of something over and above the qualities of space and time (A276=B332; see A281=B337).

Copyright © 2020 by
Andrew Brook
Julian Wuerth <>

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