Notes to Kant’s Account of Reason

1. See also the entry on rationalism vs. empiricism.

2. We might also note Kant’s view of logical reasoning. In the Introduction to the Transcendental Dialectic, Kant distinguishes “logical” from “real” or “pure” uses of reason. The logical use of reason represents a “subordinate faculty” (A305/B362) of drawing inferences (syllogisms), and Kant says relatively little about it in the Critique. It is the “pure” use, whereby reason “itself contains the origin of certain concepts and principles” (A299/B355), that demands critique: hence, of course, the book’s title. For extended discussion of this distinction, see Patrone 2008: Ch. 3.

3. See the following related comments: “the systematic unity of the understanding’s cognitions… is the touchstone of truth of rules” (A647/B675); “it can never be permitted to ascribe [freedom] to substances in the world itself, because then the connection of appearances necessarily determining one another in accordance with universal laws, which one calls nature, and with it the mark of empirical truth, which distinguishes experience from dreaming, would largely disappear” (A451/B479); “What is connected with a perception according to empirical laws, is actual” (A376). See also Bxli, A492/B520f.

4. This neglect is less surprising given Kant’s disparaging remarks about attempted answers to the question, “What is truth?” – “the ridiculous sight… of one person milking a billy-goat while another holds a sieve underneath” (A58/B82ff).

5. O’Neill (1984) illustrates this using Jean Piaget’s studies of young children’s beliefs. When asked whether the number of beads will stay the same when they are spread out over a longer distance, for instance, children below a certain age will assume that the number of beads has increased. As O’Neill notes, it is difficult to say just what the child believes in this case. In Kant’s terms, their beliefs do not meet the formal conditions of truth.

6. It is easy to miss the role that others’ judgments play when reading the first Critique, since Kant’s concern is largely with the conditions of experience in general. However, as Gelfert 2006 persuasively argues, testimony (and hence communication: cf. §3.2 & §3.3 of the main entry) are fundamental to Kant’s analysis of knowledge among actual human beings. For example, Kant’s lectures on logic refer to “the criterion of truth: to compare one’s opinions with those of other people… The principle of indifference etc. to the judgments of others in comparison with my own is [by contrast] the principle of logical egoism” (24.2:740, as quoted/translated by Gelfert 2006: 644). See also Mikalsen 2010.

7. Compare the example of whether the planets move back and forth (as “represented by the senses”) or elliptically (on a scientific understanding of their motion)—Prolegomena 4:291.

8. This raises the problem of induction—see Allison 2004: Ch. 15 and Kant and Hume on causality, §2.

9. Since Kant emphasizes the role of teleological explanation in biology, it is worth noting how evolutionary theory satisfies this demand. By showing how purposiveness emerges through natural selection, evolutionary theory integrates mechanical and teleological explanation, revealing the unity behind apparently conflicting scientific principles.

10. O’Neill 1989: Ch. 1 emphasizes this passage, as well as the epigraph that Kant added to the second edition of the Critique from Francis Bacon’s Great Instauration. Bacon deploys the same imagery of making trial, secure founding, planning, construction, modesty and limits that Kant uses.

11. Kant often uses the disparaging verb “vernünfteln,” akin to “rationalise” (Vernunft being the German word for reason)—cf Sticker 2021.

12. Compare Kant’s sarcastic comment in the Prolegomena: “High towers and the metaphysically-great men who resemble them, around both of which there is usually so much wind, are not for me.” (4:373n)

13. Kant states this clearly in “What Does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?”: “if reason will not subject itself to the laws it gives itself, it has to bow under the yoke of laws given by another; for without any law, nothing—not even nonsense—can play its game for long.” (8:145)

14. As he puts it in the second Critique: “But who would even want to introduce a new principle of morality and, as it were, first invent it? Just as if, before him, the world had been ignorant of what duty is or in thoroughgoing error about it.” (5:8n)

15. Kant was already clear about this in the so-called “Prize essay,” an “Inquiry concerning the distinctness of the principles of natural theology and morality” (1764). He expands on the point in the first Critique’s Doctrine of Method, in the section entitled, “The Discipline of Pure Reason”; cf. Bx ff.

16. Alongside the metaphor of scientific experiment, Kant also uses legal imagery. For example, he pictures reason as a tribunal, where reason must give account of itself. In this case, reason is both judge and accused! Several authors have examined Kant’s juridical and political metaphors: see O’Neill 1989, Saner 1967, Stoddard 1988 as well as Møller 2020. Ruffing 2015 also discusses the “voice of reason.”

17. A number of writers have stressed the more modest, defensive idea of vindication at work in Kant. His general ambition is not usually to provide positive proofs that permit no doubt, but to offer defenses that address the specific worries of specific audiences. This means remaining open to the possibility that other audiences will raise other worries. Cf. Ameriks 2003, or this claim from Łuków (1993: 221): “It is neither sufficient nor possible to prove law and freedom, but it is sufficient and possible to defend them by identifying the practical constraint which testifies to their instantiation in actual lives.”

18. Some passages (e.g. A310/B358, A316/B373) anticipate the central principle of legal order explored in his much later work, the Metaphysics of Morals (1797). But the more fundamental idea of the Categorical Imperative is not present.

19. Please see the note at the beginning of the bibliography for an explanation of these references to Kant’s moral writings.

20. Strictly speaking, reason provides two ends. To follow the Categorical Imperative, I must adopt these “obligatory ends”—my own moral perfection, and other people’s happiness (Metaphysics of Morals 6:385-389).

21. Put in different terms, hypothetical imperatives are really a form of theoretical reasoning. They tell you which actions are best to produce a specific result—a matter of cause and effect. Such knowledge is only “practical” if you already want to produce that result. For Kant, reason is fully practical only when it governs our ends and gives principled (not just causal) guidance on the means we may use to pursue them.

22. We might add another reason. We also have an interest in the unity of philosophy. This would be frustrated if practical and theoretical reason did not stand in a definite hierarchy. Cf. Guyer 1989.

23. Note that freedom has a special status in Kant’s system, just as it does in the “Antinomies” of the first Critique. The postulates only appear after Kant thinks he has demonstrated the practical reality of freedom, which is made known by the second Critique’s “fact of reason.” See also Critique of the Power of Judgment 5:468.

24. Kant argues that other people’s happiness is an “obligatory end”—an end that everyone must adopt (Metaphysics of Morals 6:385-389; see also Herman 2007: Ch. 11). Kant’s point is not that our efforts to promote happiness are doomed to fail, just that we lack guarantees of success. In his Lectures on Ethics, he comments, “if only all men together were unanimously willing to promote their happiness, we might make a paradise of Novaya Zemlya” (Collins, 27:285f). Novaya Zemlya is a Russian arctic archipelago—ironically, one later used as a nuclear test site. (My thanks to Jens Timmermann for this reference and information.)

25. Kant refers to different forms of “the” highest good. The following quotation refers to a person’s highest good. He sometimes refers “a moral world” whereby fully virtuous agents bring about one another’s happiness” (A809/B837 ff). He calls this the highest “derived” good, in contrast to God’s existence as the highest “original” or “independent” good—A810/B838, 5:125, 132; “What Does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” 8:139. See further Kleingeld 2016.

26. Lea Ypi argues that Kant’s earlier arguments struggle with a notion of “purposiveness as design,” so that his “efforts to distinguish critique from metaphysics, end up with a more refined version of the God of traditional metaphysics” (2021: 173). By contrast, the later Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790) develops an account of “purposiveness as normativity.” This notion is more truly critical: the “question is no longer what nature can do for humans, but what humans can do with nature,” “so as to create institutions that enable them to realize the cosmopolitan purpose of philosophy” (175, 173).

27. Remarkably, O’Neill’s work is not considered in one of the key studies on Kantian reason to appear since this entry was first written. Ferrarin 2015 emphasizes the autonomy and activity of reason, and some of the same metaphors as O’Neill. He also mentions (at 262) the “common principle” that Kant says is shared by speculative and practical reason. But he does not consider what this might be, or consider the place or justification of the Categorical Imperative in Kant’s account. Chapter 1 of his study is valuable for the close attention it pays to Kant’s “cosmic” conception of philosophy (A838/B866 f; see also Ypi 2021: Ch. 1) and the central role of “ideas of reason.” This is an important corrective to readings of the first Critique that dwell on everyday knowledge and sideline the broader project that Kant announces with his own book title—to make sense of pure (theoretical or philosophical) reason. Ferrarin’s work is also useful for reconciling two of Kant’s metaphors for reason, which may seem at odds: the constructive, architectural metaphor (also emphasized by O’Neill) and the biological image of an organism with its own unity, interests, needs and ends.

28. Rescher 2000: Ch. 9 similarly emphasizes the “isomorphism” of theoretical and practical reason. Rauscher 1998 notes that Kant’s own use of the “primacy” of practical reason is more limited than O’Neill’s, while endorsing O’Neill’s overall case. Klemme 2014 disputes the idea the claim that the Categorical Imperative is the highest principle of practical and theoretical reason. However, he only considers some passing remarks by Patricia Kitcher, and not O’Neill’s extensive arguments.

29. One might also cite the fact that Kant links autonomy not only to practical but also theoretical reason: “the power to judge autonomously—that is, freely (according to principles of thought in general)—is called reason” (Conflict of the Faculties, 7:27). Marcus Willaschek rejects the analogy between thinking and acting, suggesting that Kant actually offers three supreme principles of reason: “1. Only adopt principles that can hold for everyone. 2. Seek the totality of conditions. 3. Avoid inconsistencies” (Willaschek 2022: 263). In my view, this disagreement is superficial: 1. is simply the generalized version of the Categorical Imperative that O’Neill advocates. Principles opposing 2. or 3. obviously cannot hold for all—such contrary principles would make it legitimate to refuse explanation-seeking and to accept inconsistency. 1. is fundamental; 2. and 3. are derivative.

30. Kant sometimes uses Verstand (“understanding”) as a general term for rational thinking, rather than the more specific word Vernunft (“reason”)—see the long quotation from “What is Enlightenment?” in §3.2. He uses both words for these maxims. In Kant’s first formulation, before the publication of the first Critique, they appear as “maxims of reason”: unpublished note R1486, 15:715f (1775-77). The maxims also appear at R1508, 15:820, 822 (1780-84) and in the Lectures on Logic, 9:57, where they are described as “general rules and conditions for avoiding error.”

31. Kant’s words repay close reading: To think for oneself “is the maxim of reason that is never passive. The tendency [to passivity], hence to heteronomy of reason, is called prejudice; and the greatest prejudice of all is representing reason as if it were not subject to the rules of nature, i.e. superstition. Liberation from superstition is called enlightenment, since, although this term is also applied to liberation from prejudices in general, it is superstition above all… that deserves to be called a prejudice, since the blindness to which superstition leads… is what makes most evident the need to be led by others, hence the condition of a passive reason.” (5:294f)

32. “What Does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” 8:144. Cf.: “…if this freedom [of the pen] is denied, we are deprived at the same time of a great means of testing the correctness of our own judgments, and we are exposed to error” (Anthropology, 7:129). Universal communicability is also central to Kant’s account of aesthetic judgment, following his discussion of the three maxims in the third Critique (5:295–7).

33. See note 30.

34. Kant makes an analogous claim about the duties of states. Rulers may not transgress existing borders—that is, they may not wage aggressive or punitive or colonial wars. At the same time, so long as they act peaceably, states may raise disputes and negotiate about territory or other mutual arrangements. See Ripstein 2021: Ch. 9.

35. Hieronymi 2021 offers an insightful account of reasoning that ties it closely to rational agency. Her account responds to other contemporary accounts that frame reasons simply (?) as considerations that “count in favor” of an action or conclusion.

36. Schadow 2022 emphasizes the role of the “practical syllogism” in Kant’s idea of maxims and his philosophy of action. A maxim represents a general policy—the “major premise” of practical reasoning. Specific circumstances supply the “minor premise.” An action should be understood as a logical (“syllogistic”) inference from these premises. If there are contradictions between these, then the syllogism is invalid—or more bluntly, we have reasoned badly.

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