Karl Leonhard Reinhold

First published Wed Apr 30, 2003; substantive revision Wed Sep 21, 2022

Karl Leonhard Reinhold (1757–1823), Austrian philosopher and first occupant of the chair on Critical Philosophy established at the University of Jena in 1787, first achieved fame as a proponent of popular Enlightenment and as an early and effective popularizer of the Kantian philosophy. During his period at the University of Jena (1787–94), Reinhold proclaimed the need for a more “scientific” and systematic presentation of the Critical philosophy, one based upon a single, self-evident first principle. In an effort to satisfy this need, he expounded his own “Elementary Philosophy” in a series of influential works between 1789 and 1791. Though Reinhold’s Elementary Philosophy was much criticized, his call for a more coherent and systematic exposition of transcendental idealism exercised a profound influence upon the subsequent development of post-Kantian idealism and spurred others (such as J. G. Fichte) to seek a philosophical first principle even more “fundamental” than Reinhold’s own “Principle of Consciousness.” After moving to the University of Kiel, Reinhold became an adherent, first of Fichte’s Wissenschaftslehre and then of C. G. Bardili’s “rational realism,” before finally proposing a novel “linguistic” approach to philosophical problems.

1. Reinhold’s Life and Work

Karl Leonhard Reinhold was born in Vienna October 26, 1757 (though many older sources erroneously give 1758 as his year of his birth). He studied at the Jesuit Seminary in Vienna for a year, until the order was suppressed in 1773, at which time he entered the Barnabite seminary. Following his ordination, he became a Barnabite monk and served for several years as a parish priest and teacher of philosophy. Reinhold’s first publications were book reviews and short essays in popular newspapers, in which he showed himself to be a zealous advocate of Josephite reforms and an enthusiastic exponent of radical Enlightenment and religious toleration.

In 1783 Reinhold moved to Leipzig and converted to Protestantism. He also became a Freemason and a member of the Illuminati, and he remained an active Freemason until the end of his life. Possessed of a restless, inquiring spirit, Reinhold’s early intellectual trajectory led him from orthodox Catholicism, to reformed Catholicism, to materialism and atheism, and then to Leibnizianism and to Humean skepticism. Yet he always remained true to the ideal of “Enlightenment,” at least as he understood that ideal, and he never ceased to insist that philosophy ought to make a practical difference in the world. For all of his forays into the most technical and arcane philosophical debates and issues, he never wavered in his insistence that true “popularity” must remain the goal of philosophy, and that the ultimate test of any system is its capacity for convincing everyone of its truth. Enlightenment, for Reinhold, was no abstract pursuit of truth, but a program of religious, moral, social, and political reform. Coupled with this commitment to popularity, was a pedagogic zeal to do everything in his power to spread the message of popular Enlightenment—whether in its materialist, its neo-Leibnizian, its skeptical, its Kantian, its Fichtean, its Bardilian, or its distinctively “Reinholdian” form—as widely and as effectively as possible.

In 1784, after studying philosophy for a semester in Leipzig, Reinhold moved to Weimar, where he became a confidant (and son-in-law) of C. M. Wieland and a regular contributor to Wieland’s widely read Der Teutsche Merkur. It was in this journal that his famous series of “Letters on the Kantian Philosophy” began to appear in 1786. It is with these “Letters,” which were subsequently published in revised and expanded form in two volumes, that Reinhold’s name enters the history of philosophy. What Reinhold found in Kant is clearly expressed in the first of his many private letters to the latter: namely, a way to resolve the debilitating conflict between faith and reason, “superstition” and “disbelief,” “heart” and “head.” And this is precisely the aspect of the new, Critical philosophy that is emphasized in his Letters on the Kantian Philosophy: not Kant’s radical new account of space and time, nor his audacious effort to provide a transcendental deduction of the pure categories of the understanding, but rather the conclusions and implications of the “transcendental dialectic.”

Kantianism was recommended by Reinhold, above all, for its allegedly salubrious and enlightened practical consequences, particularly with respect to religion and morality. It was not for nothing that Reinhold described this new philosophy to readers of Die Teutscher Merkur as “the gospel of pure reason.” Rational belief in God, in the immortality of the soul, in the reality of free will: such are the articles of this new “gospel”—a gospel promulgated, everyone agreed, far more effectively and popularly by Reinhold than by Kant himself. Even Kant professed to be charmed by Reinhold’s effort and gratified by his success.

On the strength of his newfound fame as author of the Letters, Reinhold was invited to be the inaugural occupant of the first professorial chair devoted exclusively to the new Kantian philosophy, and thus he began lecturing at the University of Jena in 1787. First at Jena, and then later at the University of Kiel, Reinhold proved to be an immensely popular and influential teacher, much beloved by his students. (Of the approximately 860 students enrolled in Jena in the Spring Semester of 1794, 600 were enrolled in Reinhold’s three lecture courses.) Indeed, Reinhold was largely responsible for making Jena the center of German philosophy, which it remained for the next several decades.

In his published Letters on the Kantian Philosophy Reinhold had excused himself from the task of presenting and examining the theoretical foundations of Kant’s Critical philosophy, in order to concentrate instead upon the practical consequences of the same. But once he arrived at Jena he set himself to the former task, the surprising result of which was not so much the popularization of another aspect of Kant’s thought as a first, historically momentous effort to revise and recast the theoretical foundations of the new transcendental idealism in a new, allegedly more coherent and systematic form. The fruit of this revisionist effort was Reinhold’s own “Elementary Philosophy” (see below), which, though only a passing phase in Reinhold’s own development as a philosopher, remains his most substantial and effective contribution to the historical development of German Idealism.

Reinhold’s Elementary Philosophy is most fully expounded in three works he published in rapid succession during his tenure at the University of Jena: Versuch einer neuen Theorie des menschlichen Vorstellungsvermögens [Attempt a New Theory of the Human Faculty of Representation] (1789), Beyträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnisse der Philosophen, Erster Band [Contributions toward Correcting the Previous Misunderstandings of Philosophers, Vol. I] (1790), and Ueber das Fundament des philosophischen Wissens [On the Foundation of Philosophical Knowledge] (1791).

Reinhold’s radical revision and implicit critique of orthodox Kantianism exercised an immediate and immense influence upon his contemporaries, and particularly upon the philosopher who followed him at Jena in 1794, namely Johann Gottlieb Fichte. But though Fichte was thoroughly convinced by Reinhold’s arguments for the incompleteness of Kant’s own presentation of the Critical philosophy and by his demand for an immediately certain “first principle” of the same, he was not satisfied with Reinhold’s own efforts to satisfy these demands and, in the Aenesidemus review and elsewhere, made public his own criticisms of the Elementary Philosophy and of Reinhold’s “Principle of Consciousness.” For a few years following Fichte’s arrival in Jena and Reinhold’s transfer to Kiel, the two men engaged in a wide-ranging and stimulating philosophical correspondence, though they never met.

The final upshot of Reinhold’s Auseinandersetzung with Fichte was the former’s recantation of his own Elementary Philosophy and transference of his allegiance to the standpoint of Fichte’s Wissenschaftslehre. This conversion was made public in early 1797, in the preface to Reinhold’s Auswahl Vermischster Schriften, Zweyter Band [Selection of Various Writings, Volume II] and in his revised 1795 Prize Essay, featured in that work. It was elaborated in a lengthy review essay in the Allgemeine Literatur-Zeitung of Fichte’s recent writings, and again, the following year, in Reinhold’s Ueber die Paradoxien der neuesten Philosophie [Concerning the Paradoxes of the most recent Philosophy], in which he explicitly acknowledged the inadequacy of his own Principle of Consciousness as the foundation of philosophy as a whole and endorsed Fichte’s proposal for a more “active” first principle (the Tathandlung, or “fact-act” of the I’s self-positing), which would be capable of fully integrating theoretical with practical reason, as well as uniting theoretical and practical philosophy.

As his contribution to the Atheism Controversy of 1798/99, which led to Fichte’s departure from Jena, Reinhold published a pamphlet in Fichte’s defense. However, it was not long before he grew dissatisfied with what he perceived to be the “one-sidedness” of Fichte’s philosophy—and indeed, of transcendental idealism as a whole—and publicly sought some “third way,” which could reconcile the opposing positions of Fichte and Jacobi (whose contribution to the Atheism Controversy was an influential “Open letter,” criticizing philosophy in general and Fichte’s transcendental idealism in particular as “nihilism.”) This effort on Reinhold’s part to mediate the differences between the transcendental idealist “philosopher of freedom” (Fichte) and the common-sense “non-philosopher of faith” (Jacobi) pleased neither party, and signaled the quick and abrupt end of Reinhold’s short-lived “Fichte phase.”

After resolutely turning his back on the new post-Kantian idealist philosophy that he himself had done so much to instigate, Reinhold now presented himself to the public, in the six issues of his own Beyträge zur leichtern Uebersicht des Zustandes der Philosophie beym Anfange des 19. Jahrhunderts [Contributions to a Simpler Overview of the State of Philosophy at the Beginning of the Nineteenth Century] (1801–1803), as a partisan of C.G. Bardili’s “logical realism,” which Reinhold dubbed “rational realism.” This system attempted to base philosophy upon pure logic and upon an appeal to what Bardili called “thinking qua thinking.” It was this effort on Reinhold’s part, in the first issue of the Beyträge, “to reduce philosophy to logic” that drew the sarcastic ire of Hegel in his notorious appendix to his Differenz des Fichte’schen und Schelling’schen Systems der Philosophie [Difference between the Fichtean and Schellingian System of Philosophy] (1801).

Soon enough, however, Reinhold became dissatisfied with Bardili’s position as well, and began publicly to criticize the same “from the standpoint of language” and to reject all efforts to ground philosophy in pure formal logic. Reinhold’s final project as a philosopher can be described as a pioneering effort to take seriously the implications of ordinary language for philosophy itself and to insist upon the intimate relationship between speaking and thinking. These writings of Reinhold’s final years went nearly unnoticed during his own lifetime and have generally remained unknown until very recently; yet they would appear to merit the attention of contemporary philosophers and scholars, inasmuch as they anticipate in certain ways the “linguistic turn” of so much subsequent philosophy.

After a lifetime of philosophical inquiry, during which he influenced countless readers and students, while himself moving restlessly from one theoretical standpoint to another, Reinhold died in Kiel in 1823.

2. The “Elementary Philosophy”

No sooner did he begin lecturing on the first Critique than Reinhold began to have serious doubts about the completeness of Kant’s philosophy, the soundness of its theoretical foundations, and the adequacy of Kant’s own arguments and deductions. With remarkable alacrity and considerable ingenuity, he took it upon himself to remedy these perceived defects in Kant’s own presentation and to construct his own, allegedly more systematic, well-grounded, and “universally acceptable” version of the new Critical philosophy.

Though Reinhold sometimes referred to his new system simply as “philosophy without a nickname,” it soon became known by another name that he used for it, namely: “Elementary Philosophy” or “Philosophy of the Elements” [Elementarphilosophie]. After introducing his new philosophical ideas in his own lectures, Reinhold began laying them before the public in a series of essays in popular and professional journals, essays which were then revised and expanded as chapters of the three books which together constitute his “official” exposition of the Elementary Philosophy: Versuch einer neuen Theorie des menschlichen Vorstellungsvermögens (1789), Beyträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnisse der Philosophen, Erster Band (1790), and Ueber das Fundament des philosophischen Wissens (1791).

Reinhold introduced his presentation of the Elementary Philosophy with the following “metaphilosophical” questions: How is philosophy possible as a strict science, and what is the distinguishing feature of such a science? Following Kant, as well as the entire rationalist tradition, Reinhold maintained that the essence of science lies in universality and necessity. But these are properties of thought, not of sensation or intuition. Only through thinking and judging can we recognize universality and necessity, a recognition that is, in turn, formulated and expressed in concepts and propositions. The business of philosophy is therefore to establish “universally valid” [allgemeingültig] propositions in a manner that allows their necessity and universality to be universally recognized as binding upon everyone [allgemeingeltend]. This last requirement reveals the intimate link between Reinhold’s earlier efforts at “popularizing” the Kantian philosophy and his subsequent efforts to expand and to ground this same system. One of the constant hallmarks of Reinhold’s philosophical efforts was his conviction that a genuinely scientific philosophy must be capable of being understood and recognized as true by everyone.

What makes philosophy “scientific,” according to Reinhold, is not simply that it consists of propositions arrived at by thinking, but rather, the logical connection between the propositions in question—that is, their systematic form. Over and over again, in one forum after another, Reinhold trumpeted the same declaration: scientific philosophy is systematic philosophy. Accordingly, he embarked upon an influential analysis of systematic form as such, in order to gain insight into how Kantianism could be made rigorously systematic and therefore genuinely “scientific.”

The fundamental hallmarks of systematic form, according to Reinhold, are consistency and completeness, but it was the former of these that attracted most of Reinhold’s attention. The only way to be sure that any two propositions are truly consistent with one another—and hence, the only way to determine whether a number of philosophical propositions actually constitute a “system”—is to show that they can all be traced back to the same first principle or foundation [Grundsatz]. And the only way to show that they can indeed be “traced back” to such a first principle is by actually “deriving” them therefrom. (Despite his efforts to clarify this point, Reinhold’s conception of philosophical “derivation”—which is apparently not to be understood as simple logical deduction—nevertheless remains extraordinarily murky.)

It follows that a philosophical system must begin with a single first principle, which “determines” all the other propositions of the system. (Here again, there is a certain obscurity in Reinhold’s claim, inasmuch as he insisted that the first principle “determines” only the “form” and not the “content” of all the other, subordinate propositions, yet he also described the relationship between the first principle and the subordinate principles as a “syllogism,” in which the latter are “derived” from the former.) Only if propositions are logically related to one another in this manner can they constitute a “system.” A system with two or more “first principles” is not a system at all, but several different systems. As for the completeness problem, Reinhold’s implicit solution seems to have been to seek an a priori first principle that could be known in advance to encompass the entire domain of experience, and hence of philosophy.

What, however, can one say about the truth (or, as Reinhold was more likely to say, the “validity” [Gültigkeit]) of the proposed first principle itself? If the validity of a philosophical proposition is determined by its systematic, logical connection to other propositions, then what determines the truth of the first principle, from which the system as a whole is generated or derived? The answer, Reinhold thought, is obvious: the first principle and systematic starting point of philosophy must be self-evident. It must be immediately certain.

Despite reservations concerning the capacity of the first principle to determine the content, as opposed to the form, of the propositions derived from it, Reinhold unequivocally maintained that the first principle of all philosophy had to be a material as well as a formal principle. Otherwise, “scientific philosophy” would be identical to formal logic and would have no content of its own, which Reinhold (at this point anyway) staunchly denied. Moreover, according to Reinhold, the establishment of such a universally valid and immediately certain first principle is not merely a pressing requirement of theoretical reason, but also a matter of the utmost practical urgency, inasmuch as in the absence of such a foundational first principle “philosophy itself is impossible as a science, in which case the basis for our ethical duties and rights — as well as those duties and rights themselves—must remain forever undecided” (Beyträge I, p. 367; 2003: 248).

Granted, then, that a system of philosophy must begin with a single, immediately certain, synthetic first proposition or “grounding principle”: where might one turn in order to discover and to recognize the first principle in question, a proposition that alone can serve as the foundation or “ground” of all other philosophical propositions and cannot itself be established by any argument? The answer is, we must turn within—to the consideration of consciousness itself. This, Reinhold maintained, is precisely what Kant (not to mention Descartes) had done, albeit he did not succeed in presenting the fruits of his inquiries in an adequately scientific and systematic form.

What then is the “first principle” of the Elementary Philosophy? It is the “Principle of Consciousness,” namely, the proposition that “in consciousness, the subject distinguishes the representation from the subject and the object and relates the representation to both” (Beyträge I, p. 167; 2003: 113). In this proposition, the term “representation” [Vorstellung] designates the basic synthetic unity between subject and object, which is constitutive of consciousness; the term “subject” designates the one who “is conscious” of whatever one is conscious of (the “conscious subject” or “subject of consciousness”); and the term “object” designates that “of which” the representation is a representation. Reinhold distinguishes between three senses of “object”: object as thing [Ding], that to which the representation refers; object as represented [Vorgestelltes], the intentional object of the representation; object as thing in itself [Ding an sich], i.e. considered in abstraction from the representation (Beyträge I, p. 171; 2003: 116).

Though “self-evident” and “universally valid,” the proposition asserting this tripartite character of consciousness is, according to Reinhold, not analytic but synthetic. The Principle of Consciousness is not a tautology, yet anyone who reflects upon what is asserted by this principle will immediately recognize its truth and universal validity, inasmuch as it expresses what Reinhold called a “universally recognized fact of consciousness.”

Self-evidence alone, however, is not enough. One of the chief merits of the Principle of Consciousness, according to Reinhold, is that from it one can then derive the starting point of Kant’s own philosophy, which appears to begin with a sheer, ungrounded assumption of the distinction between intuiting and thinking, the difference between theoretical and practical reason, etc. From this point, Reinhold assures us, one can then proceed to the derivation of a complete system of philosophy as a whole, as envisioned but never actually accomplished by Kant himself. (One must recall that Reinhold’s work on Elementary Philosophy preceded Kant’s third Critique.)

With the Principle of Consciousness Reinhold believed he had uncovered that “common root” of thought and sensibility, which Kant had declared to be unknowable (CPR A 15/B 29). By commencing his analysis at the level of “representations as such,” Reinhold was convinced that he had, so to speak, hit philosophical rock bottom, inasmuch as all consciousness is self-evidently “representational” in character. (Fichte, however, in his Aenesidemus review and his early writings on the Wissenschaftslehre, would subsequently challenge precisely this claim.) Thus, Reinhold’s “Theory of Representation” (which is the first part of the Elementary Philosophy) purports to provide Kant’s Critical philosophy with the very foundation it so sorely lacks. And the Principle of Consciousness is, in turn, the foundational or first principle of this new Theory of Representation—and hence the first principle of philosophy as a whole.

By far the most original and influential portion of the Elementary Philosophy is its first part, the Theory of Representation, which is devoted entirely to an analysis of our fundamental faculty of the mind—the faculty of representation itself [Vorstellungsvermögen]—in an effort to determine “everything that can be known a priori concerning the representations of sensibility, understanding, and reason.” This foundational portion of the Elementary Philosophy thus purports to provide a thorough and complete analysis of the necessary features of representation qua representation, an analysis that claims to show “that space, time, the twelve categories, and the three forms of the ideas are originally nothing but properties of mere representations” (Fundament, pp. 72–73; RGS 4, 47). This same analysis of our faculty of representation also claims to establish the distinction between the form and content of representations, the necessity of both receptivity and spontaneity on the part of the faculty of representation, the necessary multiplicity of sensations, and the unknowability of things in themselves.

If Reinhold displays considerable originality and ingenuity in deriving the above mentioned results from his first principle (the Principle of Consciousness), the same cannot be said of the subsequent part of the Elementary Philosophy, the “Theory of the Faculty of Cognition,” which follows Kant’s own exposition much more closely than the Theory of the Faculty of Representation and becomes increasingly schematic—and less convincing—as it advances. (Reinhold’s sole attempt at a complete exposition of his “Theory of the Faculty of Cognition” is roughly sketched in Book 3 of the Versuch, whereas the “Theory of the Faculty of Representation” is treated in elaborate detail in all three of his book-length presentations of the Elementary Philosophy.)

One may recall that Reinhold’s intention was to provide a new foundation not merely for the “theoretical philosophy” expounded by Kant in the first Critique, but for the Critical philosophy as a whole, including Kant’s practical philosophy. In fact, however, Reinhold provided his readers with only the barest hints of how his Elementary Philosophy might embrace Kant’s account of will and of practical reason. Significantly, this occurs in the final, 19-page section of his “Theory of the Faculty of Cognition,” entitled “Theory of the Faculty of Desire,” in which Reinhold limits himself to what he describes as the mere “outline” of a strategy for demonstrating the unity of theoretical and practical reason: if willing is the condition for the possibility of actual, as opposed to merely possible representation and cognition, then the “faculty of desire” conditions the faculties of cognition and representation.

Unfortunately, Reinhold never fleshed out this fascinating outline, never provided any arguments for the same, and never indicated how this provocative claim concerning the relation of willing to knowing could be reconciled with the “immediate certainties” of his starting point. And this was precisely what provoked his most brilliant and critical reader, J. G. Fichte to attempt his own version of an Elementary Philosophy—a version that would begin with the unity of the theoretical and the practical and that would, with the act of “positing” or Setzen, claim to have discovered a starting point even more “basic” than that of mere “representation.” (It is significant that Fichte’s unpublished notebook of 1793/94, in which he first sketched what would subsequently be known as the Wissenschaftslehre or “Theory of Scientific Knowledge,” was titled “Private Meditations on Elementary Philosophy/Practical Philosophy.”)

It would be difficult to exaggerate the influence of Reinhold’s inquiries into systematicity and first principles upon an entire generation of philosophers. Though some recent research on Reinhold and the “Jena circle” of the late 1780s has stressed the degree to which Reinhold himself soon came to have doubts about the project of “philosophy from a single principle” (see the work of Dieter Henrich and his students, such as Marcello Stamm), this project was nevertheless enthusiastically embraced by Fichte and the young Schelling, and inspired others, notably Hegel, to re-examine (and to question) the alleged connection between systematic form and self-evident first principles. Reinhold’s subsequent reservations about his own Elementary Philosophy notwithstanding, the Elementary Philosophy remains one of the clearest examples of a thoroughgoing “foundationalist” project in the history of European philosophy.

3. Fichte Phase

Initially impressed with the brilliance Fichte displayed in his early writings on revelation and the French Revolution, Reinhold called Fichte the “new star on the horizon of philosophy” (Fichte im Gespräch 1, p. 62) and “one of the greatest minds and noblest human beings of our time” (Fichte im Gespräch 1, p. 66). However, these rosy beginnings would give way to rocky times. Reinhold and Fichte’s storied friendship was mired with recurrent estrangement and reconciliation, until they parted ways—both professionally and personally—over Reinhold’s defection from the Wissenschaftslehre to the standpoint of rational realism (for details, see Breazeale 2020).

Fichte agreed with Reinhold’s programmatic demands for the systematic completeness of philosophy and its foundation in the form of a first principle. Although Fichte admitted the validity of Reinhold’s Principle of Consciousness, he denied that it could serve as a first principle, since it presupposes a subject and object to be related and distinguished in representation. According to Fichte, the first principle of philosophy must be a non-propositional self-positing, which, by its very activity is simultaneously factive, a Tathandlung. However, Reinhold was initially unphased by these and similar criticisms by Salomon Maimon, taking himself to anticipate them in the first essay of his 1794 Beyträge II. It would be several more years before Reinhold conceded the superiority of Fichte’s Wissenschaftslehre.

In the first public announcement of his conversion to the Wissenschaftslehre, Reinhold discusses three primary issues deficient in the Elementary Philosophy, for which the Wissenschaftslehre is supposed to account: first, the a priori possibility of consciousness; second, objective matter; and third, the unconditioned unity of theoretical and practical reason. Concerning the first point, Reinhold had previously regarded Fichte’s pure I as an inconceivable basis of philosophy, if the Principle of Consciousness were not presupposed. However, by early 1797 Reinhold realized “that the possibility of consciousness determined a priori [...] can by no means be traced to the mere subject of consciousness” (Vermischter Schriften II, p. vii; RGS 5/2, 4). This is because the subject of consciousness, as it relates to an object in representation, can be only the “empirical I,” and therefore cannot serve as an a priori condition of consciousness (Vermischter Schriften II, p. x; RGS 5/2, 5). Instead, the synthetic unity between subject and object in consciousness presupposes an original activity of the absolute subject.

Second, Reinhold claims that the Elementary Philosophy presupposes “the wretched thing in itself” (Vermischter Schriften II, p. 359; RGS 5/2, 139) and cannot account for the objective matter of our representations. In the Elementary Philosophy, the “matter” of a representation is that through which the representation has objective reference (Beyträge I, p. 182f.; 2003: 124f.). It is supposed to be given in outer sensation by something distinct from the subject, namely a thing in itself (Versuch, pp. 244–255; RGS 1, 164–171). Since the thing in itself stands outside the synthetic unity of subject and object constitutive of representation, it cannot be represented. So, the material aspect of representation presupposes something that cannot be given in consciousness (the thing in itself) and that therefore stands outside the purview of the Principle of Consciousness. This is problematic because the Principle of Consciousness is supposed to be the first principle of philosophy; thus, the Elementary Philosophy cannot account for the ground of the objective matter of representation. Reinhold had attempted to deal with this issue by distinguishing between the thing in itself and the noumenon (which he sometimes calls “noumen”). While the thing in itself cannot be represented, we may represent the mere idea of the putative ground of objective matter, the noumenon (Fundament, p. 191n; RGS 4, 107n; Beyträge I, p. 216f; 2003: 151). By his conversion to the Wissenschaftslehre, Reinhold considered this distinction futile: the external ground of sensation cannot be posited in the noumenon, since the latter is a “mere product of reason” (Vermischter Schriften II, p. x; RGS 5/2, 4) and thus cannot account for the objectivity of the matter presupposed by consciousness (Vermischter Schriften II, p. 322f; RGS 5/2, 126).

Third, Reinhold takes the Elementary Philosophy to entail an unbridgeable gap between theoretical and practical reason. The task of unifying theoretical and practical philosophy in a comprehensive system had been a major stumbling block for Reinhold (see Gerten 2003; Imhof 2012). In his 1789 Versuch, Reinhold had tenuously attempted to unify the theoretical and practical sides of the Elementary Philosophy by making the faculty of desire an actualizing condition of the faculty of representation. In the second volume of the Letters on the Kantian Philosophy, one of Reinhold’s most extensive endeavors in practical philosophy, he makes no attempt to systematically connect the “results” of his investigation with the Elementary Philosophy, promising instead to derive them on another occasion. By his conversion to Fichte, Reinhold realized that practical philosophy could not be systematically integrated into the Elementary Philosophy, but only conjoined to it as an “annex” (Vermischter Schriften II, p. 324; RGS 5/2, 127).

Ever committed to the Enlightenment ideal of making philosophy universally recognizable, Reinhold’s conversion to the Wissenschaftslehre was coupled with a missionary zeal to impart its truth (cf. Reinhold to Fichte, 17 February 1797: GA III/2, 50). Nevertheless, there is widespread consensus that Reinhold’s commitment to Fichte’s philosophy was lukewarm at best (e.g. Breazeale 2020; Bondeli 1995; Bondeli 2020; Klemmt 1958: 537). In particular, it is doubtful that Reinhold fully understood the Wissenschaftslehre; much of his omnibus review of Fichte’s system evinces only a superficial understanding of it. Furthermore, by 1799 Reinhold adopted a middle position between Fichte and Jacobi. In his Ueber die Paradoxien and open letters to J.C. Lavater and Fichte, Reinhold addresses the apparent paradox between the validity of the Wissenschaftslehre and the impossibility of grasping its results by means of ordinary understanding (see Breazeale 2020:29ff; di Giovanni 2003). He attempts to resolve this tension by prioritizing faith and moral conscience, arguing that philosophy depends on these for its certainty. Yet, this effort to mediate between Fichte and Jacobi was short-lived: by the end of 1799, Reinhold had become enthralled with J.G. Bardili’s logical realism and his relationship with Fichte soon came to an end.

4. Rational Realism

After intense study of Bardili’s Grundriß der Ersten Logik, gereinigt von den Irrthümmern bisheriger Logiken überhaupt, der Kantischen insbesondere; Keine Kritik sondern eine Medicina mentis, brauchbar hauptsächlich für Deutschlands Kritische Philosophie [Outline of First Logic, Cleansed of the Errors of Previous Logics in General and of the Kantian Logic in Particular. Not a Critique but a Medicine for the Mind, Especially Useful for Germanys Critical Philosophy], Reinhold declared his allegiance to Bardili’s system in December 1799. Reinhold’s explicit commitment to rational realism would last until his “linguistic turn.” However, this final phase of Reinhold’s philosophical development, focused on language, was still strongly informed by rational realism.

Rational realism can be conceived of as a kind of ontological logic insofar as the logical laws of thought are constitutive of nature. It foregrounds the concept of thinking qua thinking (Denken als Denken). Thinking qua thinking is not to be understood representationally as involving the relation between subject and object, but as an original unity of thought and being. The principle of thinking qua thinking is expressed formally as “A as A in A and through A.” This principle indicates the essence, or “inner character,” of thinking qua thinking, namely “eternally absolute identity” (BzÜ 1, p. 103). Absolute identity excludes all distinguishability, distinction, and difference. For this reason, the essence of thinking qua thinking cannot consist in concepts, judgments, or inferences, and cannot admit of categorial determinations of quantity, quality, relation, or modality. These hold only for the application of thinking qua thinking to some matter. This matter is not derived directly from the principle of thinking qua thinking but is postulated (BzÜ 1, p. 111), since it is the condition of something being thought (BzÜ 2, p. 182f; Bardili 1800: 67). Formally, matter is represented as C, which, in relation to reality (B) and possibility (–B), yields a determinate object (b). These terms are—somewhat obscurely—employed in various mathematical operations (addition, multiplication, division) to derive the forms of intuition, the essence of a “thing qua thing,” the essence of judgment, organisms, life, and the categories of substance, cause, and ground (BzÜ 2, pp. 182–199). For Reinhold, the manifestation of pure thinking in nature is to be conceived of theologically: at bottom, rational realism represents “the manifestation of the original being in the essence of things, or the revelation of God in nature” (BzÜ 4, p. 219; for discussion of rational realism’s Neo-Platonist and religious overtones, see Ahlers 2012).

Reinhold and Bardili’s joint project faced significant criticism. Fichte was quick to rebuke his former disciple in his two-part review of Bardili’s Grundriß, where he also attacked Reinhold’s earlier review of the same work. Despite his critical stance toward rational realism, lecture notes from 1804–1807 indicate that Fichte incorporated some of its elements into his own system (see Ferraguto 2020). Hegel, too, lost no time in joining the fray, assailing Reinhold in his Differenzschrift of 1801. Hegel would join forces with Schelling, co-editing the Kritisches Journal der Philosophie, which contained fierce criticisms of rational realism. Reinhold replied to these onslaughts in subsequent issues of his Beyträge, taking aim especially at Schelling. The exchanges between these thinkers were bitter, leading Reinhold to call the dispute a “war of annihilation” (BzÜ 5, iii). This debate did not go unnoticed by the philosophical public, Joseph Kurz addressing the incendiary discourse in a short treatise in 1803, Der philosophische Vertilgungskrieg [The Philosophical War of Annihilation]. Marked by considerable mutual misunderstanding, the controversy also highlights implicit lines of influence and important contrasts in the protagonists’ conceptions of the relationships between thought and being, form and matter, and subjectivity and objectivity (for studies of this constellation, see: Ahlers 2006; Ahlers 2012; Bondeli 1995a: 314–414; Bondeli 1995b; Bondeli 1997a; and Di Giovanni 2006).

5. Linguistic Turn

A definitive starting point for Reinhold’s philosophy of language, the final phase of his philosophical development, is difficult to determine. He is reported to have spoken of a “new standpoint” in 1805 (Ernst Reinhold 1825: 337; cf. Bondeli 1995: 267), and in 1806 he published Versuch einer Critik der Logik aus dem Gesichtspunkt der Sprache [Attempt at a Critique of Logic from the Perspective of Language]. In this work, Reinhold asserts the indispensable relationship between thought and language, which would become a hallmark of his mature works in philosophy of language. However, at this point, the relationship between thought and language is assumed to be undeniable and is not further developed, with the bulk of the 1806 Critik focusing on establishing a hierarchy of logical concepts. Reinhold appears to break with Bardili in the preface to his 1808 Die Anfangsgründe der Erkenntnis der Wahrheit in einer Fibel für noch unbefriedigte Forscher nach dieser Erkenntnis [Foundations of the Cognition of Truth in a Primer for Still Dissatisfied Inquirers of this Cognition], making this a convenient marker for the end of Reinhold’s phase of rational realism and the beginning of his linguistic turn. Yet, the preface to his Grundlegung einer Synonymik für den allgemeinen Sprachgebrauch in den philosophischen Wissenschaften [Groundwork of a Synonymic for the Universal Use of Language in the Philosophical Sciences] (1812) suggests that this work signals a new direction in his philosophical thought since his endorsement of rational realism. Whatever difficulties there might be in sharply categorizing distinct phases of Reinhold’s late philosophical development, so much is clear: linguistic concerns garnered Reinhold’s attention for some time and his project of basing philosophy on a critique of language comes to fruition in the Grundlegung einer Synonymik and subsequent works, including Das menschliche Erkenntnißvermögen aus dem Gesichtspunkt des durch die Wortsprache vermittelten Zusammenhang zwischen der Sinnlichkeit und dem Denkvermögen [The Human Faculty of Cognition from the Perspective of the Connection, Mediated by Spoken Word, Between Sensibility and the Faculty of Thought] (1816) and Die Alte Frage: Was ist die Wahrheit? [The Old Question: What is Truth?] (1820).

While Reinhold claims in the 1806 Critik that no one doubts thought is conditioned by language, he comes to appreciate that many philosophers hold a contrary, instrumentalist view of the relationship between thought and language (e.g. Fichte, Jakob Friedrich Fries, and Gottlob Ernst Schulze), according to which language merely expresses thought, where thought is independent of language. Reinhold rejects this instrumentalist view of language. In his view, language and thought are mutually conditioning and essentially intertwined (Grundlegung einer Synonymik, p. 3). As a result of this connection, ambiguities and inconsistencies in language carry over to thought. This, Reinhold maintains, explains philosophy’s lack of systematic consistency and the lack of unanimity among philosophers: philosophical disputes are attributable to linguistic ambiguities. Broadly following Johann Gottfried Herder and Johann Georg Hamann, Reinhold proposes a critique of language as a meta-critique of reason.

For Reinhold, critique of language consists in rectifying the ambiguities of language, an enterprise Reinhold calls “synonymic.” The “primary task” of this critique, and of “philosophy as science” more generally, is to define the “fundamental concepts of human cognition” (Grundlegung einer Synonymik, p. 185). There is a general consensus in the literature that synonymic promises more than it can deliver (Cloeren 1972; Cloeren 1988; Gerten 2006; Imhof 2015; Valenza 2003). One problem concerns the justification of the definitions Reinhold proposes and their hierarchical ordering: at times, these seem little more than arbitrarily stipulated. Another problem concerns the ontological underpinning of Reinhold’s system. In particular, he appeals to the rational realist notion of the unity of thought and being (on the prefiguration of Reinhold’s linguistic phase in his early correspondence with Bardili, see Valenza 2004). Thus, in addition to human, representational thought—which is inextricably tied up with language—Reinhold presupposes speechless thinking (sprachloses Denken), identified with God’s thinking. This non-representational thinking, which Reinhold variously calls “thinking in the narrowest sense” (Grundlegung einer Synonymik, p. 116) and—harking back to rational realism—“thinking qua thinking,” is to be understood as the “immutable, subordinating order of being in itself” (Das menschliche Erkenntniß, p. 57). Especially in Das menschliche Erkenntniß, Reinhold emphasizes the indispensable relationship between representational thought and language in order to distinguish the former from divine thinking qua thinking. However, it is unclear whether this ontological foundation, which draws on rational realism, is properly accounted for within the framework of Reinhold’s philosophy of language.

Despite these perceived shortcomings, scholars agree that Reinhold’s final philosophical phase offers many insights. Reinhold actively engages with various philosophers who thematize language: in addition to referring to thinkers in his proximity (e.g. Bernhardi, Bouterwek, Fichte, Fries, Hamann, Herder, Jacobi, and Schulze), he cites Leibniz as a forerunner of synonymic (Grundlegung einer Synonymik, p. 185f.) and draws on the British tradition in figures such as Bacon, Locke, and Hume. Reinhold anticipates Wilhelm von Humboldt’s rejection of instrumentalist views of language in support of the interdependence of thought and language, as well as aspects of Frege (Bondeli 1995: 271) and Wittgenstein (Bernecker 2018: 3374f.). There is still much to be investigated in the history of the philosophy of language in general (for studies of this history in German philosophy, see Cloeren 1988; Forster 2010; and Forster 2011) and Reinhold’s place in it in particular.

6. Reception of Reinhold’s Philosophy

During Reinhold’s own lifetime, or at least during certain phases of the same, he was among the more influential philosophers in Germany — first as an immensely successful popularizer of the Kantian revolution and then, with his effort to construct an Elementary Philosophy, as one of the founders of “post-Kantian idealism.” This, however, nearly exhausts his positive influence upon his contemporaries.

Following the heyday of German idealism, Reinhold’s name has generally been relegated to the history of philosophy, within which he is assigned the role of serving as a small, but not insignificant rung on the alleged ladder “from Kant to Hegel,” and this is precisely how he is still treated in most general histories of philosophy. In this context, Reinhold is usually credited with (or blamed for) putting the issues of systematic form and “philosophical foundations” at the center of philosophical concern. Even those, such as Fichte, who roundly criticized the details of his Elementary Philosophy professed sincere admiration for Reinhold’s “systematic spirit.” And many of those who rejected his contention that the Principle of Consciousness could serve as the first principle of a philosophy as a whole, nevertheless praised him as the philosopher who first recognized the need for some such principle and first sought to provide Kantianism with a solid “foundation.” In both of these respects, Reinhold served as an important catalyst or stimulus for further philosophical developments.

Given this situation, it his hardly surprising that until recently the only works of Reinhold familiar even to most scholars—with a few minor exceptions—were the Letters on the Kantian Philosophy and the three, above-mentioned volumes in which he expounded his Elementary Philosophy. This, however, is unfortunate, inasmuch as these texts represent only a small fraction of Reinhold’s literary output and do not include some of his most original ideas, projects, and literary productions, such as his final writings on philosophy and language and his pioneering, lifelong efforts to get philosophers to take seriously the history of their own discipline and to understand the “history of philosophy” philosophically.

This situation has begun to change, however. The first critical edition of Reinhold’s complete works, Karl Leonhard Reinhold: Gesammelte Schriften, was inaugurated in 2007. Furthermore, the critical edition of Reinhold’s voluminous and important philosophical correspondence, Karl Leonhard Reinhold: Korrespondenzausgabe, has resumed regular output since 2007, after a 25-year hiatus. Newly edited editions of some of Reinhold’s major works have also begun to appear, most notably the two volumes of his Beyträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnisse der Philosophen, edited by Faustino Fabbianelli, and an edition of Versuch einer neuen Theorie des menschlichen Vorstellungsvermögen, edited by Ernst-Otto Onnasch, all issued in the “Philosophische Bibliothek” series published by Felix Meiner.

For many years, the serious secondary literary on Reinhold was very sparse and was dominated by Alfred Klimmt’s monograph (see below). Recent years, however, have seen a spate of new articles and monographs devoted to Reinhold. Also worth mentioning is Alexander von Schönborn’s annotated bibliography of Reinhold’s writings, a fine example of scholarly detective work and an essential tool for further research. In conjunction with and as part of the renaissance of Fichte studies over the past decades, there have been numerous efforts to reexamine the relationship between Reinhold and Fichte, and, in particular, to reassess the precise debt of the Wissenschaftslehre to the Elementary Philosophy. Accordingly, the scholarly literature on Fichte includes numerous studies of this aspect of Reinhold’s achievement. Even more recently and for the first time ever, Reinhold’s ideas have begun to be expounded, criticized, and debated among Anglophone scholars and philosophers, including Karl Ameriks, Frederick C. Beiser, Daniel Breazeale, Paul Guyer, Paul Franks, Michelle Kosch, and Alexander von Schönborn.

Appreciation and discussion of Reinhold among Anglophone readers can be expected to spread more widely as more of Reinhold’s writings become available in English. Recently, several partial translations of works by Reinhold have appeared: one, by George di Giovanni, of excerpts from the Fundament; another, by Sabine Rohr, of portions of the Verhandlung über die Grundbegriffe und Grundsätze der Moralität aus dem Gesichtspunke des gemeinen und gesunden Verstandes; and two, by Jörg Noller and John Walsh, of excerpts from the Beyträge II and Vermischter Schriften II relevant to the post-Kantian debate on free will. In 2005 a fine translation of the first series of Reinhold’s “Letters on the Kantian Philosophy,” translated by James Hebbeler and edited by Karl Ameriks, was published in the series of “Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy.” Furthermore, a translation of the second volume of Reinhold’s Letters on the Kantian Philosophy is currently underway. The rest of Reinhold’s philosophical writings still await English translation.

In 1998 Reinhold’s philosophy was the subject of an international academic conference—the first such conference ever to be devoted to Reinhold—in Bad Homburg, Germany. The second international Reinhold conference was held in Luzern, Switzerland in 2002; the third, in Rome, Italy in 2004; the fourth in Montreal, Canada in 2007; the fifth in Siegen, Germany in 2010; and the sixth in Kiel, Germany in 2017. (The proceedings of the first five of these conferences have been published.) The level of scholarship and philosophical acumen on display at these two events was very high and augurs well for the future. Indeed, one could argue that the future of Reinhold Studies is brighter today than at any time since Reinhold’s death.


Reinhold’s Works in German and English in Chronological Order

(Note that almost all of Reinhold’s books consist of revised versions of material that originally appeared in the form of journal articles. For a complete listing of all of Reinhold’s writings, see the bibliography by Alexander von Schönborn.) In this entry, citations to Reinhold’s works refer to the original pagination along with the page number corresponding to Karl Leonhard Reinhold: Gesammelte Schriften (RGS). Where texts have not yet been published in the RGS, additional page numbers are given from the most recent edition.

  • Schriften zur Religionskritik und Aufklärung, 1782–1784, ed. Zwi Batscha (Bremen: Jacobi-Verlag, 1977).
  • Briefe über die Kantische Philosophie[Erster Band] (1790). Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Band 2/1, 2007. (Both volumes reprinted in a single volume, ed. Raymund Schmidt [Leipzig: Reclam, 1921].
    • Translation of the first eight letters in the versions originally published in Der Teutsche Merkur, supplemented by “the major additions in the 1790 edition,” in Letters on the Kantian Philosophy, trans. James Hebbeler, ed. Karl Ameriks. [Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005].)
  • Versuch einer neuen Theorie des menschlichen Vorstellungsvermögens (1789; 2nd ed. 1795). Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Bd. 1, 2013. Two-volume ed., edited and with an introduction by Ernst-Otto Onnash. (Hamburg: Meiner/Philosophische Bibliotek nos. 500 a and 599b, 2010 and 2012). (Photomechanical reprint ed. Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1963.)
    • Essay on a new Theory of the Human Capacity for Representation, trans. Tim Mehigan and Barry Empson (Berlin: de Gruyter, 2013).
  • Beyträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnisse der Philosophen, Erster Band (1790). (New, two-volume edition, edited and with an introduction by Faustino Fabbianell. [Hamburg: Meiner/Philosophische Bibliothek 554a and 554b, 2003 and 2004]. A photomechancial reprint of Sect. V of this work, “Ueber die Möglichkeit der Philosophie als strenge Wissenschaft,” is included in the volume containing the photomechanical reprint edition ofUeber das Fundament des philosophischen Wissens, ed. Wolfgang H. Schrader [Hamburg: Meiner, 1978].)
  • Ueber das Fundament des philosophischen Wissens (1791). Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Band 4, 2011. (Photomechanical reprint edition, ed. Wolfgang H. Schrader [Hamburg: Meiner, 1978].
    • (Partial translation, The Foundation of Philosophical Knowledge, trans. George di Giovonni. In Between Kant and Hegel: Texts in the Development of Post-Kantian Idealism, ed. George di Giovanni and H. S. Harris [Albany: SUNY Press, 1985], pp. 52–106.)
  • Briefe über die Kantische Philosophie, Zweyter Band (1792). Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Bd. 2/2, 2008. (Both volumes of the Briefe were later reprinted in a single volume, ed. Raymund Schmidt [Leipzig: Reclam, 1921].)
  • Beyträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnisse der Philosophen, Zweyter Band (1794). (New edition, edited and with an introduction by Faustino Fabbianell. [Hamburg: Meiner/Philosophische Bibliothek 554b, 2004.])
    • (Partial translation in Jörg Noller and John Walsh, Kant’s Early Critics on Freedom of the Will [New York: Cambridge University Press, 2022], pp. 93–116.)
  • Auswahl vermischter Schriften [Erster Theil] (1796). Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Bd. 5/1, 2016.
  • Auswahl vermischter Schriften, Zweyter Theil (1797). Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Bd. 5/2, 2017.
    • (Partial translation in Jörg Noller and John Walsh, Kant’s Early Critics on Freedom of the Will [New York: Cambridge University Press, 2022], pp. 238–49.)
  • Review of Fichte’s, Ueber den Begriff der Wissenschaftslehre, Grundlage der gesammten Wissenschaftslehre, Grundrisse des Eigenthümlichen der Wissenschaftslehre in Rücksicht auf das theoretische Vermögen, and Philosophisches Journal einer Gesellschaft Teutscher Gelehrten, Band 5, Heft 1–6. (1798). (Rpt. in J. G. Fichte in zeitgenössischen Rezensionen, Band 2, ed. Erich Fuchs, Wilhelm G. Jacobs, and Walter Schieche, pp. 286–321 [Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1995].)
  • Verhandlung über die Grundbegriffe und Grundsätze der Moralität aus dem Gesichtspunke des gemeinen und gesunden Verstandes (1798). Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Bd. 6/1, 2008.
    • (Partial translation in Sabine Roehr, A Primer on German Enlightenment: With a Translation of Karl Leonhard Reinhold’s “The Fundamental Concepts and Principles of Ethics” [Columbia: University of Missouri Press, 1995], pp. 157–251.)
  • Ueber die Paradoxien der neuesten Philosophie (Hamburg, 1799).
  • Sendschreiben an J. C. Lavater und J. G. Fichte über den Glauben an Gott (1799).
  • Beyträge zur leichtern Uebersicht des Zustandes der Philosophie beym Anfange des 19. Jahrhunderts, Heft 1–3 (1801), Heft 4 (1802), Heft 5–6 (1803). (This journal was founded and edited by Reinhold, who also contributed most of the editorial content.)
  • C. G. Bardilis und C. L. Reinholds Briefwechsel über das Wesen der Philosophie und das Unwesen der Speculation (1804).
  • Prologomenen zur Analysis in der Philosophie (Berlin, 1804).
  • Etwas über den Widerspruch (Hamburg, 1804).
  • C. L. Reinhold’s Anleitung zur Kenntniß und Beurtheilung der Philosophie in ihren sämmtlichen Lehregebäuden (1805; 2nd ed. 1824).
  • Versuch einer Auflösung der von der philosophischen Classe der königl. Akademie der Wissenschaften in Berlin für 1805 aufgestellten Aufgabe: “Die Natur der Analysis und der analytischen Methode in der Philosophie genau anzugeben, und zu untersuchen: ob und was es für Mittel gebe, ihren Gebrauch sicher, leichter und nützlicher zu machen” (1805).
  • Versuch einer Critik der Logik aus dem Gesichtspunkte der Sprache (Kiel, 1806).
  • Die Anfangsgründe der Erkenntniß der Wahrheit in einer Fibel für noch unbefriedigte Forscher nach dieser Erkenntiß (Kiel, 1808).
  • Rüge einer merkürdigen Sprachverwirrung unter den Weltweisen (Weimar, 1809).
  • Grundlegung einer Synonymik für den allgemeinen Sprachgebrauch in den philosophischen Wissenschaften (Kiel, 1812).
  • Das menschliche Erkenntnißvermögen, aus dem Gesichtspunkte des durch die Wortsprache vermittelten Zusammenhang zwischen der Sinnlichkeit und dem Denkvermögen (Kiel, 1816).
  • Ueber den Begriff und die Erkenntniß der Wahrheit (Kiel, 1817).
  • Die alte Frage: Was ist die Wahrheit? bey den erneuerten Streitigkeiten über die göttliche Offenbarung und die menschliche Vernunft, in nähere Erwägung gezogen (Altona, 1820). Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Bd. 10/2, 2022.
  • Vorlesungsnachschriften. Logik und Metaphysik (1792/93), Darstellung der Kritik der reinen Vernunft (1792/93)), Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Bd. 12, 2015.
  • Karl Leonhard Reinhold Korrespondenzausgabe der österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, ed. Faustino Fabvienelli and Ives Radrizani (Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1983 ff). Five volumes have so far appeared in this series, with seven more projected.

Selected Secondary Literature About Reinhold

  • Adam, Herbert, 1930. Carl Leonhard Reinholds philosophischer Systemwechsel. Heidelberg: Carl Winter.
  • Ahlers, Rolf, 2003. “Fichte, Jacobi und Reinhold über Speculation und Leben,” Fichte-Studien, 21: 1–25.
  • –––, 2006. “Differenz, Identität und Indifferenz im Gespräch des Deutschen Idealismus um 1802, besonders bei Reinhold und Schelling,” in K.L. Reinhold: Am Vorhof des Idealismus, P. Valenza (ed.), Pisa/Rome: Instituti Editoriali e Poligrafici Internazionali, pp. 285–312.
  • –––, 2012. “Reinhold on Being, Appearance, and Ursein and Some Consequences,” in Wille, Willkür, Freiheit: Reinhold’s Freiheitskonzeption im Kontext der Philosophie des 18. Jahrhunderts, S. Stolz, M. Heinz, M. Bondeli (eds.), Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 471–512.
  • Ameriks, Karl, 2000. Kant and the Fate of Autonomy: Problems in the Appropriation of the Critical Philosophy, New York: Cambridge University Press. (On Reinhold, see Pt. II, pp. 81–159.)
  • Beiser, Frederick C., 1987. The Fate of Reason: German Philosophy from Kant to Fichte, Cambridge: Harvard University Press. (On Reinhold, see Ch. 8, pp. 226–65.)
  • Bernecker, Sven, 2018. “Reinholds linguistischer Schematismus,” in Natur und Freiheit: Akten des XII. Internationalen Kant-Kongresses, V. Waibel et al. (eds.), Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 3369–3377.
  • Bondeli, Martin, 1994. “Geschmack und Vergnügen in Reinholds Aufklärungskonzept und philosophischem Programm während der Phase der Elementarphilosophie,” in Evolution des Geistes: Jena um 1800, F. Strack (ed.), Stuttgart: Klett-Cotta, pp. 328–49.
  • –––, 1995a. Das Anfangsproblem bei Karl Leonhard Reinhold. Eine systematische und entwicklungsgeschichtliche Untersuchung zur Philosophie Reinholds in der Zeit von 1789 bis 1803, Frankfurt: Klostermann.
  • –––, 1995b. “Hegel und Reinhold,” Hegel-Studien, 30: 45–87.
  • –––, 1997a. “Hegels Identitätsphilosophie in Auseinandersetzung mit Reinholds Rationalem Realismus,” in Hegels Jenaer Naturphilosophie, K. Vieweg (ed.), Paderborn/München: W. Fink, pp. 163–74.
  • –––, 1997b. “Zu Fichtes Kritik an Reinholds ‘empirischem’ Satz des Bewußtseins,” Fichte-Studien, 9: 199–213.
  • –––, 1997c. “Reinhold im Lichte Kants und Hegels. Zu G.W. Fuchs: C.L. Reinhold – Illuminat und Philosoph; P. Valenza: Reinhold e Hegel,” Hegel-Studien, 31: 159–66.
  • –––, 1998a. “Hegel und Reinholds Rationaler Rationalismus,” in Hegels Jenaer Naturphilosophie, Munich: Fink Verlag.
  • –––, 1998b. “Von Herder zu Kant, zwischen Kant und Herder, mit Herder gegen Kant – Karl Leonhard Reinhold,” in Herder und die Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus, M. Heinz (ed.), Amsterdam, Atlanta: Rodopi, pp. 203–34.
  • –––, 2001. “Freiheit im Anschluss an Kant. Zur Kant-Reinhold-Kontroverse und ihren Folgen,” in Akten des IX Internationalen Kant-Kongresses, V. Gerhardt, R.-P. Horstmann, and R. Schumacher (eds.), Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • –––, 2020. “Reinhold’s Transition to Fichte,” in Reinhold and Fichte in Confrontation. A Tale of Mutual Appreciation and Criticism, M. Bondeli and S. Imhof (eds.), Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 123–49.
  • Bondeli, Martin and Silvan Imhof, 2020. Reinhold and Fichte in Confrontation. A Tale of Mutual Appreciation and Criticism. Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter.
  • Bondeli, Martin and Alessandro Lazzari (eds.), 2003. Philosophie ohne Beinamen. System, Freiheit und Geschichte im Denken C.L. Reinholds, Basel: Schwabe-Verlag, 2003. (Proceedings of the second international Reinhold conference, held in Lucerne in 2002.)
  • Bondeli, Martin and W. H. Schrader (eds.), 2003. Die Philosophie Karl Leonhard Reinholds. (Beiträge der Internationalen Reinhold-Tagung von Bad Homburg, März 1998), Amsterdam: Rodopi.
  • Breazeale, Daniel, 1982. “Between Kant and Fichte: Karl Leonhard Reinhold’s ‘Elementary Philosophy,’” Review of Metaphysics, 35: 785–821.
  • –––, 1998. “Putting Doubt in its Place: Karl Leonhard Reinhold on the Relationship between Philosophical Skepticism and Transcendental Idealism,” in The Skeptical Tradition around 1800, J. van der Zande and R. H. Popkin (eds.), Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 119–32.
  • –––, 2020. “Wie der blinde von der Farbe. Reinhold’s Misappropriation of the Wissenschaftslehre: A Narrative,” in Reinhold and Fichte in Confrontation. A Tale of Mutual Appreciation and Criticism, M. Bondeli and S. Imhof (eds.), Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 7–48.
  • Cloeren, Hermann-Joseph, 1972. “Philosophie als Sprachkritik bei K. L. Reinhold. Interpretative Bemerkungen zu seiner Spätphilosophie,” Kant-Studien, 63: 225–36.
  • –––, 1988. Language and Thought: German Approaches to Analytic Philosophy in the 18th and 19th Centuries, Berlin/New York: De Gruyter. (On Reinhold, see Ch. 8, pp. 67–77.)
  • Fabbienelli, Faustino (ed.), 2003. Die zeitgenössischen Rezensionen der Elementarphilosophie K. L. Reinhold, Hildesheim: Olms.
  • –––, 2016. Karl Leonhard Reinhold’s Transcendental Psychology, Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • Ferraguto, Federico, 2020. “Rhythmus and Setzen: Fichte’s Answer to Rational Realism,” in Reinhold and Fichte in Confrontation. A Tale of Mutual Appreciation and Criticism, M. Bondeli and S. Imhof (eds.), Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 215–32.
  • Fichte, Johann Gottlieb, 1794. “Recenzion des Aenesidemus” (“Review of Aenesidemus”), trans. Daniel Breazeale, in Fichte: Early Philosophical Writings, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1988, pp. 59–77.)
  • Frank, Manfred, 1997. “Unendliche Annäherung”: Die Anfänge der philosophischen Frühromantik, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp. (On Reinhold, see Pt. II, pp. 112–662.)
  • Franks, Paul, 2000. “All or Nothing: Systematicity and Nihilism in Jacobi, Reinhold, and Maimon,” in The Cambridge Companion to German Idealism, Karl Ameriks (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 95–116.
  • Frketich, Elise, 2016. “Reinhold’s Elementarphilosophie: A Scholastic or Critical Philosophical System?” Kant Yearbook, 8: 17–38.
  • Fuchs, Gerhard W., 1994. Karl Leonhard Reinhold, Illuminat und Philosoph: eine Studie über den Zusammenhang seines Engagements als Freimaurer und Illuminat mit seinem Leben und philosophischen Wirken, Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang.
  • Fugate, Courtney, 2012. “On a Supposed Solution to the Reinhold/Sidgwick Problem in Kant’s Metaphysics of Morals,” European Journal of Philosophy, 23 (3): 349–73.
  • Gerten, Michael, 2006. “Sprache und System. Zu K.L. Reinholds viertem, sprachphilosophischem Systemwechsel,” in K.L. Reinhold: Am Vorhof des Idealismus, P. Valenza (ed.), Pisa/Rome: Instituti Editoriali e Poligrafici Internazionali, pp. 167–91.
  • Guyer, Paul. “The Struggle for Freedom: Freedom of Will in Kant and Reinhold,” in Kant on Persons and Agency, E. Watkins (ed.), New York: Cambridge University Press, pp. 120–37.
  • di Giovanni, George, 2003. “1799: The Year of Reinhold’s Conversion to Jacobi,” in Die Philosophie Karl Leonhard Reinholds, M. Bondeli and W.H. Schrader (eds.), Amsterdam: Rodopi, pp. 259–282.
  • –––, 2006. “Reinhold’s Criticism of Fichte and Schelling: The Commonality at a Distance between Reinhold’s Late Thought and Hegel’s Logic,” in K.L. Reinhold: Am Vorhof des Idealismus, P. Valenza (ed.), Pisa/Rome: Instituti Editoriali e Poligrafici Internazionali, pp. 271–84.
  • ––– (ed.), 2010. Karl Leonhard Reinhold and the Englightenment, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Hegel, G.W.F., 1801. Differenz des Fichte’schen und Schelling’schen Systems der Philosophie. (The Difference Between Fichte’s und Schelling’s System of Philosophy, ed. and H. S. Harris and Walter Cerf (trans.), Albany: SUNY Press, 1977.)
  • Henrich, Dieter, 1991. Konstellationen. Probleme und Debatten am Ursprung der idealistischen Philosophie, Stuttgart: Cotta.
  • Horstmann, Rolf-Peter, 1972. “Maimon’s Criticism of Reinhold’s Satz des Bewusstseins,” in Proceedings of the Third International Kant Congress, Dordrecht: Reidel, pp. 350–8.
  • Imhof, Silvan, 2015. “Karl Leonhard Reinholds Kritik der philosophischen Sprache,” in Philosophie der Sprache im Vormärz, S. Markewitz (ed.), Bielefeld: Aisthesis, pp. 47–73.
  • Kersting, Wolfgang and Dirk Westerkamp (eds.), 2008. Am Rande des Idealismus: Studien zur Philosophie Karl Leonhard Reinhold, Paderborn: Mentis.
  • Kim, Yun Ku, 1996. Religion, Moral und Aufklärung: Reinholds philosophischer Werdegang, Frankfurt: Peter Lang.
  • Klemmt, Alfred, 1958. Karl Leonhard Reinholds Elementarphilosophie. Eine Studie über den Ursprung des spekulativen deutschen Idealismus, Hamburg: Meiner.
  • Kosch, Michelle, 2006. Freedom and Reason in Kant, Schelling, and Kierkegaard, New York: Oxford University Press. (On Reinhold, see Ch. 2, pp. 55–65.)
  • Lauth, Reinhold (ed.), 1974. Philosophie aus einem Prinzip. Karl Leonhard Reinhold, Bonn: Bouvier. (A collection of essays by seven different scholars.)
  • Lazzari, Alessandro, 2004. “Das Eine, was der Menscheit Noth ist” Einheit und Freiheit in der Philosophie Karl Leonhard Reinholds (1789–1792), Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Fommann-Holzboog.
  • Leopoldsberger, Jürgen, 1968/69. “Anfang und Methode als die Grundprobleme der systematischen Philosophie. Reinhold, Fichte, Hegel,” Salzburger Jahrbuch für Philosophie, 12/13: 7–48.
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  • Marx, Karianne J., 2011. The Usefulness of the Kantian Philosophy: How Karl Leonhard Reinhold’s Commitment to Englightenment Influenced his Reception of Kant, Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • Perconti, Pietro, 1999. Kantian Linguistics. Theories of Mental Representation and the Linguistic Transformation of Kantism. Münster: Nodus. (For Reinhold, see Chs. 2 and 5.)
  • Pinkard, Terry, 2002. German Philosophy 1760–1869; The Legacy of Idealism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. (For Reinhold, see Ch. 4, pp. 96–104.)
  • Pupi, Angelo, 1966. La formazione della filosofia di K. L. Reinhold 1784–1794, Milan: Society Editrice Vita e Pensioro.
  • Reinhold, Ernst (ed.), 1825. Karl Leonhard Reinhold’s Leben und litterarisches Wirken, nebst einer auswahl von Briefen Kant’s, Fichte’s, Jacobi’s und andrer philosophierender Zeitgenossen a ihn, Jena: Frommann.
  • Röttgers, Kurt, 1974. “Die Kritik der reinen Vernunft und K. L. Reinhold. Fallstudie zur Theoriepragmatik in Schulbildungsprozessen,” in Akten des 4. Internationalen Kant-Kongresses, Vol. II, Part 2, Berlin: de Gruyter, pp. 789–804.
  • Schrader, Wolfgang H., 1979. “Philosophie als System — Reinhold und Fichte,” in Erneuerung der Transzendentalphilosophie im Anschluß an Kant und Fichte, Klaus Hammacher and Albert Mues (eds.), Stuttgart-Bad Cannstaatt, pp. 331–42.
  • –––, 1990. “‘Wir denken über keinen einzigen Begriff gleich.’ Die Auseinandersetzung zwischen Reinhold und Maimon,” in Zur Architektonik der Vernunft, Lothar Berthold (ed.), Berlin: Akademie Verlag, pp. 525–52.
  • –––, 1993. “C. L. Reinholds ‘Systemwechsel’ von der Wissenschaftslehre zum rationalen Realismus Bardilis in der Auseinandersetzung mit J. G. Fichte,” in Transzendentalphilosophie und Spekulation, (Band 2: Der Streit um die Gestalt einer Ersten Philosophie (1797–1807)), Walter Jaeschke (ed.), Hamburg: Meiner, pp. 85–104.
  • Schönborn, Alexander von, 1991. Karl Leonard Reinhold. Eine annotierte Bibliographie, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog.
  • –––, 1997. “Fichte und Reinhold über die Begrenzung der Philosophie,” Fichte-Studien, 9: 241–55.
  • –––, 1999. “Karl Leonhard Reinhold: ‘... Endeavoring to keep up the pace mit unserem Zeitalter.’” In The Emergence of German Idealism, Michael Baur and Daniel O. Dahlstrom (eds.), Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, pp. 33–62.
  • Selling, Magnus, 1938. Studien zur Geschichte der Transcendentalphilosophie. I. Karl Leonhard Reinholds Elementarphilosophie in ihrem philosophiegeschichtlichen Zusammenhang, Lund: Olsen, 1938.
  • Stamm, Marcello, 1995. “Das Program des methodologischen Monismus; Subjekttheoretische und methologische Aspekte der Elementarphilosophie K. L. Reinholds,” Neue Hefte für Philosophie, 35: 18–31.
  • Stolz, Violetta, Marion Heinz, and Martin Bondeli (eds.), 2012. Wille, Willkür, Freiheit: Reinhold’s Freiheitskonzeption im Kontext der Philosophie des 18. Jahrhunderts, Berlin/Boston: de Gruter.
  • Stolzenberg, Jürgen, 2003. “‘Geschichte des Selbstbewußtseins.’ Reinhold–Fichte–Schelling,” Internationales Jahrbuch des Deutschen Idealismus/International Yearbook of German Idealism (Konzepte der Rationalität/Concepts of Rationality), Karl Ameriks and Jürgen Stolzenberg (eds.) Berlin: de Gruyter, pp. 93–113.
  • Teichner, Wilhelm, 1976. Rekonstruktion oder Reproduktion des Grundes. Die Begründung der Philosophie als Wissenschaft durch Kant und Reinhold , Bonn: Bouvier.
  • Valenza, Pierluigi, 1994. Reinhold e Hegel, Padua: Cedam.
  • –––, 2003. “Das Verhältnis zwischen Denken und Sprache in der Spätphilosophie Reinholds,” in Die Philosophie Karl Leonhard Reinholds, M. Bondeli and W.H. Schrader (eds.), Amsterdam: Rodopi, pp. 283–301.
  • –––, 2004. “Reinholds Abschied vom logischen Realismus,” in Philosophie ohne Beinamen. System, Freiheit und Geschichte im Denken C.L. Reinholds, M. Bondeli and A. Lazzari (eds.), Basel: Schwabe-Verlag, pp. 215–35.
  • Walsh, John, 2020. “The Fact of Freedom: Reinhold’s Theory of Freedom Reconsidered,” in The Concept of Will in Classical German Philosophy: Between Ethics, Politics, and Metaphysics, M. Kisner and J. Noller (eds.), Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 89–104.
  • Zynda, M. von, 1910. Kant – Reinhold – Fichte. Studien zur Geschichte der Transzendentalphilosophie, Kantstudien-Ergänzungshefte, Berlin; reprinted Ruggell/Liechtenstein: Topos, 1980.


  • K. L. Reinhold. Alle Soglie Dell’Idealismo, Special (487 pp.) triple issue of Archivio di Filosofia/Archives of Philosophy, LXXIII (2005), Nos. 1–3. (Contains the proceedings of the third international Reinhold conference, held in Rome in 2004.)

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