Søren Kierkegaard

First published Mon May 22, 2023

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by John Lippitt and C. Stephen Evans replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

Søren Aabye Kierkegaard (1813–1855) was an astonishingly prolific writer whose work—almost all of which was written in the 1840s—is difficult to categorize, spanning philosophy, theology, religious and devotional writing, literary criticism, psychology and social critique. Kierkegaard’s mode of philosophizing opposes system-building and owes more in its approach to the ancients, particularly his hero Socrates, though his work also draws strongly and creatively on the Bible and other Christian sources. The opposition to system-building means that Kierkegaard has often been understood as an arch opponent of Hegel, but scholarship in recent decades has challenged and complicated this view, suggesting both that some of Kierkegaard’s central ideas are creative developments of Hegel’s ideas, and that the main target of his critique is certain Danish Hegelians influential in his day, rather than Hegel himself (see especially Stewart 2003 and section 4 below). Also often dubbed the “father of existentialism”, this label obscures at least as much as it reveals, especially to those who associate existentialism with atheistic figures such as Sartre. Kierkegaard’s thought has certainly influenced thinkers in the phenomenological and existential traditions (including Heidegger, Sartre, Jaspers, Marcel, and Lévinas), but also thinkers in very different philosophical traditions, such as Wittgenstein (who famously described him as a “saint” and “by far the most profound thinker” of the nineteenth century). In addition to influencing philosophers and theologians—inside and outside his own Lutheran tradition—Kierkegaard’s thought has also influenced various novelists and poets (including Henrik Ibsen, Franz Kafka, Miguel de Unamuno, August Strindberg, W. H. Auden, Walker Percy, John Updike, Richard Wright, R. S. Thomas, and Haven Kimmel); artists and filmmakers (including Edvard Munch and Carl Theodor Dreyer); psychiatrists and psychotherapists (including Ludwig Binswanger, Carl Rogers, Rollo May, R. D. Laing, and Irvin Yalom). (For articles on several of these influences in philosophy, theology and literature, see Carlisle 2013, Welz 2013, Shakespeare 2013, Rudd 2013, Lippitt 2013b, Barrett 2013, Lisi 2013, and Pyper 2013.) One reason why Kierkegaard has had an impact upon such a diversity of figures is his focus on the question of what it means to be an existing, finite human being, a concern he associates with “inwardness”, and which contrasts with what he takes to be the misguided idea that one can understand reality in a disengaged manner and from no particular point of view. He believed that his age had in various ways forgotten this fundamental truth, an enormous failing manifested in both its philosophy and its theology.

1. Life and Works

Søren Kierkegaard was born to Michael Pedersen Kierkegaard and Anne (Lund) Kierkegaard in Copenhagen on 5 May 1813, the youngest of seven children. He spent most of his life in and around the Danish capital, traveling abroad on only a handful of occasions (mostly to Berlin, including to hear Schelling’s lectures). Kierkegaard’s father, who had been born to a poor family in Jutland, had become wealthy as a merchant in Copenhagen. Michael was devoutly religious, and young Søren was brought up as a Lutheran but was also shaped by a Moravian congregation in which his father played a prominent role. Kierkegaard was in turn deeply influenced by his father, about whose “melancholy” much has been written. One alleged cause of this, much speculated upon, concerns the story that Kierkegaard’s father believed he and his family to have been living under a curse because of his having cursed God as a cold and hungry child.

After a prolonged period of study at the University of Copenhagen, Søren received a first degree in theology and a Magister degree in philosophy, with a dissertation dealing with irony as practiced by Socrates (On the Concept of Irony with Continual Reference to Socrates). The Magister degree was the equivalent of a contemporary doctorate, the title being changed to “doctor” some years later. He then completed the pastoral seminary program that qualified him to become a priest in the Lutheran state church. However, Kierkegaard was never ordained and never became a pastor, though he preached on occasions in various Copenhagen churches.

In 1840 Kierkegaard became engaged to the eighteen-year-old Regine Olsen. He quickly came to believe that he had made a terrible mistake and that he could not marry her. His reasons are not fully known but have been the subject of a great deal of speculation, much of it bound up with Kierkegaard’s own “melancholy” and relationship to his by then deceased father. In the letter returning her ring, Kierkegaard asks Regine to forgive him, the one who “whatever else he was capable of could not make a girl happy” (cited in Hannay 2001: 155). In his journals, he expands on this, reflecting several years later that within six months of marriage to him she would have “gone to pieces”, as there was “something spectral about me”, which would make a “real relationship” with him impossible (PJ 421–2). Regine vigorously opposed ending the engagement. After fruitlessly seeking to change her mind, Søren embarked on a misguided (and unsuccessful) scheme to free her from attachment to him by pretending to be a scoundrel who had trifled with her affections. Finally, in 1841 he broke the engagement for good and fled to Berlin for a brief time, perhaps in part to escape the public scandal of the whole affair. Kierkegaard remained unmarried for the rest of his life, his will bequeathing to Regine what remained of his worldly goods, to make the point that to him the engagement was just as binding as a marriage. Regine—or rather, her husband on her behalf—declined to accept the bequest, except for a few personal items that Regine wanted.

The period following the end of the engagement was one of the most productive of Kierkegaard’s authorship. Work on the text that he considered properly to begin his authorship, Either/Or, began almost as soon as he arrived in Berlin, and it was published in 1843. Between that year and 1846, several other works appeared: Fear and Trembling (1843), Repetition (1843), Philosophical Fragments (1844), The Concept of Anxiety (1844), several collections of Upbuilding Discourses (1843, 1844), Prefaces (1844), Three Discourses on Imagined Occasions (1845), Stages on Life’s Way (1845), Concluding Unscientific Postscript (1846), and A Literary Review, better known in English as Two Ages (1846).

It is clear enough that some of Kierkegaard’s early writings contained disguised communications to Regine, who soon married another man (Johan Frederik Schlegel, later Governor-General of the Danish West Indies), which meant that Kierkegaard could not communicate directly with her. He hoped she might come to realize that he still loved her, but also understand why he could not go through with the marriage. Biographies of Kierkegaard often focus on the broken engagement in detail, and commentators have sometimes gone to great lengths to find “messages to Regine” in Kierkegaard’s texts, some more plausible than others. However, Regine was far from the only person who could be described as “that individual” to whom Kierkegaard dedicated many of his works.

Two other biographical episodes are worth mentioning. First, in 1845–6 Kierkegaard became embroiled in a controversy with The Corsair, a satirical literary magazine that included cartoons mocking many of Denmark’s most prominent public figures. Initially Kierkegaard was spared this treatment, and indeed was on friendly terms with Meir Goldschmidt, a Jewish intellectual who was the magazine’s editor. However, after Kierkegaard (in the persona of one of his pseudonyms) goaded the magazine by attacking P. L. Møller, an aspiring scholar who wrote for The Corsair, Kierkegaard became the object of a series of nasty attacks, which included mocking his personal appearance. This might seem inconsequential, but all the main figures involved had their lives dramatically changed. Søren, whose chief recreational occupation had been daily walks around Copenhagen, in which he conversed with many people, taking what he called “people baths”, became reclusive, unable to endure the curious and sometimes jeering groups of people who stared at him. As a result, he gave up the idea of becoming a pastor, feeling a call to “remain at his post” as an author. Following the “Corsair affair”, Kierkegaard—who had intended the Concluding Unscientific Postscript to bring his authorship to an end—embarked upon a second, highly productive period of writing, the fruits of which include Upbuilding Discourses in Various Spirits (1847), Works of Love (1847), Christian Discourses (1848), The Sickness Unto Death (1849), Practice in Christianity (1850) and several more discourses (for the full list, see the Chronology below).

Second, in the last two years of his life, Kierkegaard, known as a defender of Christian faith, embarked on a controversial attack on the Danish state church, a target that symbolized all that he thought was wrong with “Christendom” as a whole. The attack on the Church was made in the name of “New Testament Christianity”, which Kierkegaard thought the Church had betrayed. The war was waged in newspapers and in a pamphlet (Øjeblikket, variously translated as The Moment or The Instant) that Kierkegaard himself founded and for which he wrote ten issues. These writings are markedly different from the rest of his work. Obviously intended for a broad audience, they employed searing wit and satire, making no attempt to be subtle or nuanced. Amid this public battle, Kierkegaard collapsed on the street, paralyzed, and was taken to hospital. He died there a few weeks later, on 11 November 1855. A tentative diagnosis of the cause was tuberculosis of the spine marrow. Towards the end, Kierkegaard affirmed to Emil Boesen—a lifelong friend and a priest in the church that Kierkegaard had attacked—that he was still a believer in Christ.

Kierkegaard’s biographers paint dramatically different pictures of these events. Walter Lowrie’s early biography (Lowrie 1938) is a work of loving devotion, as Lowrie spent a great deal of his later life translating Kierkegaard into English. Joakim Garff’s portrait (2000, English translation 2005) is far more critical and provides unflattering interpretations of many of the key events in Kierkegaard’s life. The biographies by Alastair Hannay (2001), Stephen Backhouse (2016), and Clare Carlisle (2019) all fall somewhere in between these two extremes.

Although Kierkegaard died aged only 42, his writings are vast. One aspect of these writings likely to strike those encountering him for the first time as peculiar is the fact that—aside from the “attack upon Christendom” writings of the final years and a voluminous body of journal and notebook entries—the authorship divides broadly into two distinct kinds of text: those written under a variety of pseudonyms (the “pseudonymous” authorship) and those written under his own name (the “signed” or “veronymous” authorship). Several of the pseudonymous authors, some of whose names are significant, represent different life-views, such as the contrast between the “aesthetic” and “ethical” lives sketched through the multiple voices of Either/Or (more of which below). Others represent figures who explore the life of faith from perspectives outside Christianity (such as Johannes de silentio, the author of Fear and Trembling) and Johannes Climacus (a self-described “humorist” whose two books, Philosophical Fragments and its Concluding Unscientific Postscript, are written from a standpoint that falls short of the paradoxical “Religiousness B” that represents Christianity in the latter work). One way of characterizing this pseudonymous authorship is to think of it as one vast novel, with the various pseudonymous authors who figure in the works being characters therein. Although some (e.g., Mackey 1986) have claimed that “S. Kierkegaard” is ultimately just another pseudonym, this remains a minority view.

Amongst the signed literature, there are different types of texts, such as “upbuilding” or “edifying” discourses (Taler: speeches; talks); “deliberations;” (Overveielser) and reviews. In the early 1840s, Kierkegaard often published a collection of such discourses at the same time as a pseudonymous work, describing them as offered with the right and left hand respectively. Scholars have sometimes distinguished these earlier religious discourses from later, explicitly Christian discourses, which latter group would include one of the most important works of Kierkegaard’s mature ethics, Works of Love. Technically, the essays about Christian love that make up that text consist not of “discourses” (Taler) but “deliberations” (Overveielser). According to Kierkegaard’s own explanation of the distinction in his journals, whereas an upbuilding “discourse” presupposes that people know what, say, love is and aims to win them over to it, a “deliberation” must first unsettle a comfortable way of thinking, and so also aims to awaken; provoke; and sharpen thought. As noted, in addition to his published works Kierkegaard kept extensive journals and notebooks, clearly expecting—correctly—that these too would eventually be published.

The use of pseudonyms gives the reader the additional—some would say prior—task of wondering where Kierkegaard stands in all this. One figure with a peculiar status amongst the pseudonyms is Anti-Climacus, the only pseudonym other than Johannes Climacus to author more than one book (The Sickness Unto Death and Practice in Christianity). Many scholars have treated Anti-Climacus as only “weakly” pseudonymous, taking him to articulate views Kierkegaard himself holds, but which he considers himself to lack the authority to pronounce in his own name. In this sense, Anti-Climacus has often been read as the “highest” Kierkegaardian voice.

Some strategies have been defended as giving a window into Kierkegaard’s own views in relation to the pseudonyms. One is to look for common themes and conceptual perspectives that are shared by most or (in some cases) nearly all the pseudonyms, such as the view that there are distinct “stages” or “spheres” of existence (to be discussed below). It is reasonable to see these common elements as distinctively “Kierkegaardian”. Another strategy is to compare the pseudonymous works to the signed works, on the assumption that the latter provide a baseline because they embody what Kierkegaard wanted to put forward under his own name. This sometimes makes it possible to have some idea of what Kierkegaard himself thought of the pseudonyms. Some, such as Johannes Climacus, seem closer to Kierkegaard than others, such as Judge William and the Seducer in Either/Or. Part of the evidence for this is that Kierkegaard inserted his own name on the title page as editor of the two Climacus books, describing this as a “hint” for those who care about such things.

It certainly seems rash to attribute all the things said by the pseudonyms to Kierkegaard, especially since Kierkegaard himself explicitly requested that anyone citing these works should make the attribution to the pseudonyms rather than himself (CUP I 627/SKS 7, 571). On the other hand, even if the pseudonyms had been actual individuals distinct from Kierkegaard, it would not follow that they never say things he would agree with, and it seems reasonable to think that Kierkegaard had some ends of his own that he seeks to accomplish by the creation of the pseudonyms.

What were those ends? In The Point of View for My Work as an Author (written 1848, published posthumously) Kierkegaard—in his own voice—claims that he was from first to last a religious author, and thus that the pseudonymous works also serve religious ends, despite the fact that many of those works are not explicitly religious in character. This claim has been hotly contested, with some critics arguing that The Point of View represents what Kierkegaard later wanted his readers to think rather than being an honest account of his intentions—and that other elements of his writings, such as the journals, are similarly unreliable (see, e.g., Fenger 1976 [1980], Mackey 1986, Garff 2000 [2005]). Interestingly, Kierkegaard seems in part to concede his critics’ point, since he admits that the unity he sees in the authorship was not one he had in mind from the beginning, but rather one that he came to understand as the authorship developed. In any case, Kierkegaard agrees that an author’s assertions about his work should not always be taken at face value, and he asks his readers to discern for themselves whether the unity he claims to be present helps to make sense of the whole. A rough characterization of the unity Kierkegaard himself sees could be summarized as follows: Kierkegaard believes that genuine religious faith requires “inwardness” or “subjectivity” as its presupposition. The pseudonymous works, including those not explicitly religious, can be seen as intended “indirectly” to encourage readers to “become subjective”, thus providing a better possibility of an understanding of religious existence. One piece of evidence Kierkegaard brings forward in support of the religious character of the writings is the fact that the early pseudonymous works were always “accompanied” by signed religious works. Thus, one cannot reasonably claim that the religious is something that only emerges relatively late in the course of his authorship.

One can therefore understand why, at least in retrospect, Kierkegaard saw the whole of his authorship, including the pseudonymous works, as devoted to the cause of “reintroducing Christianity into Christendom”, one of the characteristic ways he describes the goal of his writings. This phrase captures both the idea that Kierkegaard saw himself as a defender of “New Testament Christianity” and the way he saw himself as a critic of the “cultural Christianity” found in Denmark at the time, which assumed that virtually every Dane was a Christian and thus—Kierkegaard thought—conflated even lukewarm “nominal” Christianity with genuine faith. Kierkegaard’s critique of “Christendom” led to tensions with his older brother, Peter Christian Kierkegaard, who was a follower of N. F. S. Grundtvig, a hugely influential Danish pastor and author who had, in Søren’s eyes, blended Scandinavian culture and Christian faith in a way that was detrimental to the latter.

One interesting feature of Kierkegaard’s reception is that, despite his own Christian motivations, the writings have often had a huge influence on non-Christian thinkers, who have found inspiration in elements of his thought—such as the analysis of human existence (see section 2 below)—that can be detached from Kierkegaard’s own religious framework. These would include such figures as Heidegger and the Swiss psychiatrist and pioneer of existential psychotherapy, Ludwig Binswanger, who judged The Sickness Unto Death as a text which more than any other had the potential to “advance the existential-analytic interpretation of schizophrenia” (Binswanger 1958: 297; cf. also Laing 1960). It is also intriguing that Kierkegaard was translated into Japanese before he was translated into English (albeit initially via German rather than directly from Danish). The influence of Kierkegaard is clear in later Japanese thinkers such as Kitaro Nishida’s attempt to create a synthesis between eastern Buddhist thought and European philosophy. (On Kierkegaard in Japan, see Otani 1957 [2011], Mortensen 1996, Giles 2008; for Kierkegaard’s reception in other non-western European/north American contexts, see Stewart 2007–17, Vol. 8 Tome III.) In some ways this breadth of reception is not surprising since the “inwardness” Kierkegaard sought to cultivate is human inwardness, and many of his analyses and descriptions do not presuppose any dogmatic foundations.

One theme that can be found in both the pseudonymous and signed writings is the distinction between direct and indirect communication. Kierkegaard consistently maintains that ethical and religious truth cannot be directly or “immediately” communicated to others. Understanding such truths requires a “double reflection”. Since they are truths that pertain essentially to existence or how life should be lived, it is possible to have a purely verbal or conceptual understanding of such truths that is nonetheless a misunderstanding. To successfully grasp such communications, the recipient must not only understand the sentences communicated, but must think through what it would mean to embody or “reduplicate” those ideals in existence. Kierkegaard thinks that the communicator must keep this in mind and artistically attempt to communicate in a manner that will discourage purely verbal understanding and encourage appropriation. The use of the pseudonyms is in part an attempt to do this. Rather than simply tell us in a didactic manner about the various forms human existence can take, such as the aesthetic, ethical, and religious lives, the pseudonyms embody these various ways of understanding human life. Kierkegaard hopes that readers who engage with the pseudonymous characters might come to understand their own lives better, in much the same way as encountering the characters in a great novel can foster greater self-understanding, whether one sees oneself as like those characters or as very different from them. There is thus a strong novelistic or “poetic” character to the pseudonymous authorship, and it seems right to pay attention to the literary form of Kierkegaard’s work, just as Plato scholars often pay close attention to the literary form of Plato’s dialogues.

2. Kierkegaard’s Analysis of Human Existence: Despair, Social Critique, and Anxiety

Kierkegaard does not think of the human self predominantly as a kind of metaphysical substance, but rather more like an achievement, a goal to strive for. To be sure, humans are substances of a sort; they exist in the world, as do physical objects. However, what is distinctive about human selves is that the self must become what it is to become, human selves playing an active role in the process by which they come to define themselves. This idea is familiar from existentialist thinkers such as Sartre, and we can thereby understand why Kierkegaard is often described as the “father of existentialism” (however unhelpful that label may otherwise be). However, as we shall see below, one important difference from Sartre is that for Kierkegaard the idea of existentialist “self-creation” (or, perhaps better, “self-shaping”) needs to be synthesized with “self-acceptance:” a recognition that the self is in some sense given by our limitations and certain facts of biology and history (for this terminology, see Rudd 2012).

Kierkegaard’s picture of selfhood is perhaps most clearly on display in The Sickness Unto Death, one of two works in his authorship described on the title page as “psychological”. Although Sickness is attributed to the “higher” pseudonym Anti-Climacus, much of its account of the structure of the human self can be found in other Kierkegaardian writings, both signed and pseudonymous. Like Hegel, Anti-Climacus holds both that human beings are to be understood as “spirit”, and that spirit must become itself through a process. The major difference is that Hegel sees spirit as manifested in all of reality and particularly in humanity as a whole, whereas Anti-Climacus focuses on the individual human self.

Perhaps another similarity to Hegel is that there is a “dialectical” character to the human self understood as spirit. Becoming spirit is seen as an on-going “synthesis” of contrasting fundamental characteristics: the finite and the infinite, the temporal and the eternal; the necessary and the possible. Much about the self is fixed and cannot be chosen. Humans are born with particular biological characteristics, in a particular place and time, into a world that is not of their own making. However, as self-conscious beings, humans still contain possibilities to be actualized. The Sickness Unto Death describes various ways in which humans fail to synthesize these contrasting features and thus fall into despair, which is seen not merely as an emotion but as the state in which the self fails to become a self in truth. For instance, the person in the grip of the “despair of possibility” loses contact with necessity and thus lives in a world of imagination that is disconnected from actuality. While such a person recognizes that concrete possibilities must be chosen from a range of options, they misuse their imagination to generate an endless series of possibilities, thus postponing (and evading) the need for choice and action. The task is somehow to actualize “the eternal” (possibilities) as a temporal being. The person in the “despair of necessity” is on the other hand a fatalist of sorts who, having lost hope, sees no imaginative possibilities that can be incorporated into his or her life. Necessity alone, Anti-Climacus claims, is suffocating. Possibility is, spiritually speaking, like oxygen: one cannot breathe pure oxygen, but neither can one breathe without it.

There is in Kierkegaard’s view of the human self as spirit one other fundamental difference from Hegel’s concept of spirit. Hegel’s dialectic (at least on some interpretations) comes to rest when the conflicting moments are reconciled in a final, higher unity. For Kierkegaard, however, the human self is fundamentally temporal and (at least prior to death) is always an unfinished project. The task of balancing the elements of human selfhood (necessity and possibility, eternity and temporality) so as to avoid despair is never completed short of the grave.

Despite Kierkegaard’s reputation as an “individualist”, he does not see the process of becoming a self as one that is carried out by an autonomous, isolated self. As self-conscious beings, humans can “step back” from themselves and “relate themselves to themselves”. However, Anti-Climacus insists that the human self cannot “relate itself to itself” alone, but always by “relating … to another”. All of us in some ways live in relation to ideals, but those ideals come from outside the self and provide a basis for self-definition. Anti-Climacus clearly thinks that for the human self to be healthy, free from the despair that is “the sickness unto death”, the “other” who is the basis for the self must be God, who created the self but gave it a kind of freedom by “releasing it from his hand, as it were” (SUD 16/SKS 11, 132). However, both Kierkegaard and Anti-Climacus recognize that in reality most human selves are defined by “others” very different from God. We attempt to ground our identities in “worldly distinctions” such as riches and fame or define ourselves by our devotion to abstractions that have the potential to become idols, such as nation, race or class. On Kierkegaard’s view, only when one is defined by a commitment to what is absolute and infinite (God) can one be freed from the constricting labels and conformist roles that society attempts to impose on all of us. This is particularly so in a modern society that is shaped by “the press”, and which seeks to “level” the distinctive individual who dares to be faithful to an individual calling. This influential critique of modern societies is found in such essays as A Literary Review. There, Kierkegaard describes the aspects of disengagement mentioned above in connection with certain modes of philosophizing (see further §3.1 below) as part of a broader problem with the culture of his age. He contrasts the passionate “age of revolution” with “the present age”—indolent; excessively reflective; apathetic; and envy-fueled. Each age has its risks, but one of the problems with the present age is precisely that it is one of “leveling”, in which genuine excellence is stifled by the “monstrous abstraction” (TA 90/SKS 8, 86) which Kierkegaard labels “the public”, an unaccountable “phantom” created by “the press” and in whose name all kinds of injustices are perpetuated. While Kierkegaard was surely influenced here by the “Corsair affair”, his analysis of “the present age” has often been taken as an astute anticipation of concerns later critics have raised about the mass media (and, latterly, elements of social media: one might think of the “algorithms” of Facebook and Twitter as the kind of faceless, anonymous “phantoms” that Kierkegaard had in mind).

As already noted, Kierkegaard believes that the task of becoming a self requires “inwardness” or “subjectivity”, and that merely amassing objective knowledge or taking a detached perspective on intellectual questions by itself leads one away from selfhood. In Concluding Unscientific Postscript Johannes Climacus argues that reflection, though a crucial and necessary element in human life, by itself cannot lead to choices (see Evans 2006: 311–326). In an argument that resembles David Hume’s claim that “reason is, and ought only to be the slave of the passions…”, (Hume 1739–40 [1888: 415]) Climacus says that reflection itself has a kind of inner infinity. A person thinking about a decision can always go on thinking and so long as that is happening, cannot decide. What must happen is that the person must desire to make a choice, and thus will to stop the process of reflection by identifying with a possibility to be actualized.

Prior to the analysis of despair given in The Sickness Unto Death, Kierkegaard’s pseudonym Vigilius Haufniensis (a Latinized version of “The Watchman of Copenhagen”) provided an influential treatment of another significant human psychological state in The Concept of Anxiety. On the surface this book is an inquiry into the nature of original or “hereditary” sin, but in reality it probes the nature of human choice in general, particularly the origins of evil. While Haufniensis claims that evil or sin cannot be scientifically explained because it has its origins in freedom, he nonetheless believes that anxiety helps us to understand how sin is possible. Anxiety is not merely a pathological condition which is a symptom of disease, but part of the human condition itself. It is an awareness of freedom. When we are anxious, we feel a “sympathetic antipathy” or an “antipathetic sympathy” (CA 42/SKS 4, 348) in which we are both drawn towards and repelled by some possibility. How exactly freedom comes to be misused is not made altogether clear by Haufniensis, who says that

anxiety is the dizziness of freedom, which emerges when the spirit wants to posit the synthesis and freedom looks down into its own possibility, laying hold of finiteness to support itself. (CA 61/ SKS 4, 365)

This “looking down” produces anxiety, which is the state that precedes sin, though Haufniensis is clear that a morally free action always comes from a “leap” and cannot be seen as necessary (CA 48–51/SKS 4, 353–7). Perhaps the best scholarly treatment of these matters is found in Michelle Kosch (2006), who convincingly argues that Kierkegaard is responding to Kant-inspired debates about human freedom and autonomy in Fichte and Schelling, and usefully shows the relevance of Kierkegaard’s views to contemporary debates about the human will. Haufniensis does claim that when freedom is misused, anxiety takes on a pathological character, but the cure is not the total elimination of anxiety. Rather, what is crucial is to learn to be anxious properly: “Whoever has learned to be anxious in the right way has learned the ultimate” (CA 155; SKS 4, 454).

3. The “Spheres of Existence” or “Stages on Life’s Way”

A common way to interpret Kierkegaard’s thought is in terms of three “existence-spheres”: the aesthetic, the ethical and the religious. The idea that there are precisely three such spheres is an over-simplification, as this reckons without important subdivisions in this schema (such as different kinds of aesthete; the different resonances of especially “the ethical” in different texts; sub-divisions in the religious (“Religiousness A” and “Religiousness B”); and the “boundary zones” of “irony” and “humor”.) Nonetheless, this structure does give some purchase on Kierkegaard’s view of different ways to become—or fail to become—a human “self”. Indeed, some have seen “becoming a self” as the key topic of Kierkegaard’s thought, and the existence-spheres as crucial to understanding this. One way of approaching the existence-spheres is to see them as different views of what gives a human life value. Kierkegaard often uses an imagery of height in describing the spheres, such as a famous passage in The Sickness Unto Death in which Anti-Climacus accuses most people of living in a multi-story house and yet preferring to live in the basement (in “sensate” categories as opposed to aiming to become “spirit”) (SUD 43/SKS 11, 158). That is, Kierkegaard often reads as if the existence-spheres operate in a hierarchy, with the aesthetic as “lowest” and Religiousness B as “highest”. However, this is arguably too simple: even if Kierkegaard does see the movement from the aesthetic and the ethical to the religious as progress, it would be a mistake to think of this in a purely linear way. There are ways in which an ethical character such as Judge William may be inferior to an aesthete such as “A”, and insights to be found in the aesthetes that are not repudiated or surpassed by what might be described as a “higher” pseudonym.

Kierkegaard also describes these spheres as “stages” (Stadier)—as in the title Stages on Life’s Way. The term “stage” might be taken as a psychological descriptive term, but this too can be misleading. Kierkegaard is certainly not simply providing an empirical description of how humans develop. It is true that children are natural aesthetes, and that this is where human existence always begins. So one might say that a typical human life would begin with aesthetic concerns, develop ethical commitments, and over time, reflecting on the problems posed by ethical existence, could struggle with religious questions which are linked to the problems of guilt and suffering that ethical life raises but does not solve. However, not everyone follows such a path, and even when someone does, the later stages do not simply replace the earlier ones. Kierkegaard consistently maintains that all human life contains an aesthetic dimension, so the aesthetic is never really left behind.

Furthermore, humans for Kierkegaard are spiritual creatures, and this means that the transitions from one stage to another do not happen automatically or inevitably. Rather, the transitions are achievements that require the transformation of the “passions” that shape a human life, what Kierkegaard calls “subjectivity” or “inwardness”. It is for this reason that, for instance, the aesthete can choose to remain an aesthete, making this way of life a rival to an ethical or religious life. When understood in this way the term “spheres” seems superior to “stages” as it recognizes that these different views of human existence can be rivals, with different views of what makes human life worthwhile and meaningful. Even though Kierkegaard himself clearly believed that deep and authentic forms of ethical life point towards the religious, he also recognizes that there are forms of ethical life that are at best religious in a conventional or superficial way (as illustrated, arguably, by Judge William, to be discussed in §3.2 below). Let us turn, then, to aspects of each of the “existence-spheres” in more detail.

3.1 The Aesthetic

The first volume of Either/Or consists of the papers of a nameless young man, known only as “A”, who in a series of sometimes witty, sometimes rambling, sometimes astute and sometimes despairing writings, presents a view of what it means to live “aesthetically”. As is clearest in his essay “Crop Rotation”, he sets himself the task of living to avoid boredom at all costs. On one level, the aesthetic life can be understood as the ceaseless pursuit of “the interesting”. But there is an irony in this: paralleling Kant’s notion of a judgment of beauty as involving disinterested satisfaction, the aesthete ultimately brings an attitude of disinterested, disengaged contemplation to life as a whole, viewing it as a spectacle to be savored rather than as involving “tasks” or projects to be fulfilled. His is the view of a spectator rather than a player. Often seen as a critique of German romanticism, this highlights a vital distinction in Kierkegaard’s thought, between the engaged and disengaged perspectives. Kierkegaard thinks that the disengaged, theoretical standpoint on life will necessarily overlook crucial existential problems, since these only properly come into view from a first-person perspective. To draw on one of Climacus’ examples, understanding in the abstract that since I am mortal, I will one day die, is very different from earnestly confronting what my certain death means for how I should live my life.

The aesthete emerges as an isolated figure, recommending the reader of “Crop Rotation” to avoid boredom and preserve freedom by rejecting anything which involves the self in relationships of inter-dependence, such as marriage, friendship, or useful career. While recognizing most people’s need to work for a living, he nevertheless counsels against allowing career or other people to be part of one’s identity-conferring commitments. In his critique of the aesthetic life, the ethicist Judge William goes on to argue that this is to cut oneself off from precisely the kind of freely chosen projects that give human life its value and purpose.

The two extremes of the aesthete life, contrasting sensuousness with misused imaginative reflection, are illustrated by two kinds of seducer. The first, illustrated by Don Juan (which “A” approaches through the version of the character in Mozart’s opera Don Giovanni in his essay “The Immediate Erotic Stages or the Musical Erotic”) has as the object of his desire the sensual alone, as opposed to the features of a woman which make her a distinct individual. Nor, on this account, is Don Juan himself an individual, since to be so is to be determined “by spirit”. Indeed, “A” claims, once we think of Don Juan as an individual—as opposed to a sensuous force that can only properly be expressed in music—he becomes a comical figure.

As his papers reveal, one way in which “A” differs from Don Juan is that “A” sees a far greater use for the imagination. “A” contrasts a “vulgar” understanding of crop rotation—always seeking new external stimuli—with tackling boredom through utilizing the capacity of the imagination. By standing back from the world, relating to it in a disengaged manner, one’s experiences become raw material for imaginative possibilities, such as by cultivating arbitrariness (reading part of a book; seeing the middle of a play). “A” himself fully realizes (see for instance the section entitled “Diapsalmata”) that his lifestyle has led to a kind of despair—he claims that living “artistically” is only possible once “hope has been thrown overboard” (EO I 292/SKS 2, 282)—but he sees aesthetic possibilities even in his despair. After all, tragedy is one of the great categories of drama, and “A” seems to have the capacity to step back from and observe his own life as a kind of tragic play. Perhaps “A” thinks that despair is preferable to boredom and can thus be a strategy in its avoidance.

The flaws of his worldview are writ large in the demonic author of the last and longest part of the first volume of Either/Or, the “Seducer’s Diary”. (The text leaves unclear whether we are supposed to take this to be “A” himself.) This second seducer—another Johannes—represents an extreme misuse of the imagination: someone so far gone in the life of the imagination as to have become damaged by it. Johannes gains his gratification from the art of planning seduction, with ultimate success sparking boredom and the desire to move on. The Diary’s painstaking account of the details of a particular seduction plot reveal him as deeply manipulative; thoroughly disengaged (viewing woman as—merely—an endlessly fascinating topic for his observations and reflections); and ultimately self-deceived, both about his motives and about whether a life lived almost entirely in the realm of the imagination is a defensible human life. Johannes the Seducer has embraced a reflective type of enjoyment, including “reflective grief”, as a form of aesthetic experience that can be sustained, perhaps recognizing that the “immediate” sensuousness of Don Juan cannot be realized in an actual person. Nevertheless, his turn away from “immediacy” does not seem to work; he constantly seems to need jolts of immediate enjoyment and desire to rejuvenate his projects. When his seduction of his quarry Cordelia finally succeeds, the actual sexual encounter seems strangely anti-climactic, and it is immediately followed by boredom and even cynicism. Yet one level of the Seducer’s self-deception subtly indicates the demands of the ethical: by convincing himself that he hasn’t really treated these women so badly, Johannes shows that on some level he recognizes that the ethical does make demands on him. Many of these points are subtly elaborated in Karsten Harries’ rich commentary on Either/Or (Harries 2010).

3.2 The Ethical

Kierkegaard’s most famous spokesman for the ethical life is known as Judge (or “Assessor”) William. In his two—very—long letters to his young friend “A”, William’s strategy has an “indirect” element: he aims to show how the ethical life provides what the aesthete claims to care about (for instance, romantic love) better than the aesthetic life itself can. (Witness the titles the book’s editor, Victor Eremita, gives to the letters: “The Aesthetic Validity of Marriage” and “Equilibrium between the Aesthetic and the Ethical in the Development of Personality”.) At the heart of the Judge’s worldview is the idea that living a fully human life necessarily involves the kind of commitments of which “A” is so wary: relationships and social roles can legitimately be identity-conferring in an important sense. This is a key respect in which the “ethical self” contrasts with the isolated “self” of the aesthete. (It also highlights the importance of love in Kierkegaard’s thought (see §3.3.3 below).) Part of William’s strategy is to try to show “A” that he has deeper desires than he recognizes. “A”’s namelessness has often been taken as a signal that the aesthete in an important sense lacks a self; the Judge aims to show that the aesthete’s living for “the moment” means that the self becomes nothing more than a series of such moments. The ethical self, by contrast, seeks a coherence and a kind of unity that can endure over time, rather than being a series of disconnected episodes. Relationships and social roles are, for the Judge, key to this.

In this approach, however, “the aesthetic” is not just something that is transcended, but rather something that is taken up into the higher existence-spheres in a transformed way. For instance, at the heart of William’s praise of marriage is the idea that this is the way in which romantic love endures—and is a better expression of love’s own demands. Marriage also illustrates the idea of the ethical as the sphere of “openness” or transparency: marriage embodies the ethical life insofar as it provides an environment in which two people can progressively reveal themselves to each other over a lifetime. (Fear and Trembling will go on to contrast the “openness” of the ethical with different forms of concealment found in both the aesthetic and the religious.)

The Judge’s second letter stresses the importance of choice. He urges “A” to “choose despair”, by which he means: recognize that despair arises from, and is essential to, the aesthetic life, and that an authentic self cannot be achieved thorough the aesthetic life alone. (As hinted at in section 2 above, aspects of the human self—possibility, necessity, finitude, infinitude—have their own characteristic forms of despair, each rooted either in a lack of imagination or in a misuse of the imagination.) His key theme is to try to persuade the aesthete that choosing “aesthetically” is not really choosing at all; that he needs to “choose choice itself:” take responsibility for the person he has become, as the first step in aiming to change it. One way of glossing the claim that “A” lacks a self is that the aesthetic life is one of self-alienation (the Judge alleges that “A” “continually hover[s] above” himself (EO II 198/SKS 3, 192)). By contrast, the ethical self contains elements of self-acceptance—the facticity of one’s life—as well as what might be called “self-shaping”—that which can be chosen (Rudd 2012). As the Judge puts it, “the I chooses itself—or, more correctly, receives [or ‘accepts’] itself [det modtager sig selv]” (EO II, 177/SKS 3, 172). In this way, the ethical self strives for a balance which avoids the despair of possibility (the excessive plenitude of choice that paralyses the will) and the despair of necessity (the complete absence of choice). At the heart of this notion of choice is the view that freedom is found in voluntary self-limitation, as illustrated by the Judge’s claim that his devotion to his work, his wife and his children is less a sacrifice than the source of his joy and satisfaction. Precursors of this view which are likely influences on Kierkegaard here include Luther’s idea that freedom is being able to transcend the demands of one’s baser inclinations willingly to obey God’s law (see especially “The Freedom of a Christian”), and Hegel’s recognition of our mutual interdependence in the thought that true freedom involves recognizing that what may initially appear to be a “constraining other” is, in a deeper sense, part of the self. Contemporary parallels which have interested Kierkegaard scholars include Harry Frankfurt’s idea that unlimited “freedom” would lead to the evaporation of identity (see for instance Frankfurt 1988: 177–190) and the importance of acquiring a “higher order” will (see the essays in Rudd and Davenport 2015).

In all this, we see that a key contrast is between a life viewed in terms of mere possibilities (the aesthetic) and in terms of “tasks” (the ethical). Insofar as a person recognizes “choice” as a task (as opposed to being an essentially arbitrary selection from an array of possibilities), she has effectively already chosen the ethical.

Interpreters of Kierkegaard have disagreed on whether the ethical is a necessary, if intermediate, stage on the route to a “higher” existence-sphere, or whether there is an element of naïveté to William’s valorization of conventional social norms (cf. Hegelian Sittlichkeit) which sophisticated aesthetes have already seen through and rejected. A related debate has arisen from Alasdair MacIntyre’s claim, in his A Short History of Ethics and After Virtue, that the choice between the aesthetic and the ethical is arbitrary or “criterionless”, (MacIntyre 1981 [1984]). MacIntyre’s view has been much discussed since, though Kierkegaard scholars have been almost unanimous in their rejection of it. MacIntyre subsequently amended his position, while nevertheless re-stating the “criterionless choice” charge in a different form (see MacIntyre 2001, esp. 344). Subsequent discussion has focused on whether Kierkegaard’s project is in fact far closer to MacIntyre’s own than the latter realized, one component of this debate being whether it is helpful to think of the ethical in terms of some sort of “narrative unity” (for contributions, see the essays in Davenport and Rudd 2001, Lippitt 2007, Rudd 2012, Davenport 2012, Lippitt 2013b [for an overview], Stokes 2015, the essays in Lippitt and Stokes 2015, and Compaijen 2018).

Certainly, the Judge’s somewhat complacent trust in Sittlichkeit raises several important questions. Do we really have such clearly defined positions and duties? Can Sittlichkeit do justice to individual uniqueness? What underlying principle can justify which roles and projects we “choose” to take on? Without an answer to this last question, some have seen there to be a hidden complicity between the aesthetic and the ethical, such that the ethical is not really the advance on the aesthetic that the Judge supposes. And this conception of the ethical certainly founders against conceptions of the religious existence-sphere envisaged elsewhere in the authorship. The Judge sees himself as a religious person, but his religiosity does not seem as central to his identity as his earthly commitments. Certainly, his religious faith does not challenge or unsettle his conventional lifestyle, as would be the case in Kierkegaard’s later descriptions of a religious life that is distinctly and radically Christian.

Of each of the three existence-spheres, the ethical is perhaps the hardest to pin down, the meaning of the term shifting across texts. In both Either/Or and Fear and Trembling (in the judgment of most scholars), the ethical is seen primarily as Sittlichkeit: grounded—as for Hegel—in social requirements and expectations. (That said, there has been considerable discussion about whether the conception of the ethical in Fear and Trembling is Kantian (e.g., Pojman 1984, Hampson 2013), Fichtean (Kosch 2006) or Hegelian (e.g., Evans 2004, Walsh 2009, Westphal 2014)). But there is an important difference between the two texts. Judge William seems mostly oblivious to the possibility that there could be a need for anything higher than this kind of ethical life. However, in Fear and Trembling Johannes de silentio is fascinated by the Biblical story of the akedah, the binding of Isaac by Abraham (Genesis 22: 1–18). Abraham is seen as embodying a life of faith that cannot be reduced to Sittlichkeit, for reasons that we shall see in the next section.

Concluding Unscientific Postscript offers an account of the ethical life that sees it as the beginning of a kind of “immanent” religious existence (“Religiousness A”) that is possible for humans apart from any transcendent revelation. Here the ethical life requires “an absolute relation to the absolute” that relativizes all earthly commitments, leading to resignation, suffering, and, ultimately, an encounter with guilt. Religiousness A, which is distinct from Christianity (what Climacus calls “Religiousness B”) is seen a providing the “pathos” or inwardness that is necessary for a person to become a Christian, though even here there is no direct or immediate transition possible to Christianity as a “transcendent” form of religious existence.

A price is paid, however, for focusing exclusively on the pseudonymous works for accounts of Kierkegaard’s account of “the ethical”. The most obvious exclusion would be Works of Love, arguably the most important work of Kierkegaard’s mature Christian ethics. But it would also overlook some profound reflections to be found in the upbuilding discourses on virtues needed for ethical as well as religious life (such as courage, forgivingness, gratitude, hope, humility, patience) as well as more unusual spiritual qualities (such as “joy” [glæde]) and, of course, faith itself. (For an in-depth treatment of Kierkegaard’s account of a number of virtues, see Roberts 2022.)

3.3 The Religious and the Life of Faith

While Kierkegaard does not explicitly explore faith, hope and love as the three theological virtues, all three notions play important roles in his thought, and can be used to amplify his view of the religious life.

3.3.1 Faith

Faith is a major theme across Kierkegaard’s authorship. It is the central issue of Fear and Trembling (which as noted explores the nature of faith through an investigation of one of its key biblical exemplars, Abraham), while in later writings Kierkegaard explores in various ways the nature of specifically Christian faith.

Since Fear and Trembling is probably the best-known and most read of Kierkegaard’s works, the views of its pseudonymous author are often taken to be Kierkegaard’s own. But since Johannes de silentio claims to be an outsider to “faith”, and repeatedly tells us he cannot understand Abraham, this is a dangerous move. Johannes’ focus is on the events of Genesis 22, wherein Abraham receives the shocking command to sacrifice his long-awaited son Isaac on Mount Moriah. Abraham shows his willingness to do so over a three-day journey, right up to the binding and drawing of the knife. Yet at the last minute God sends an angel to prevent the killing, Abraham instead sacrificing a ram caught by its horns in a thicket.

This is the exemplar of faith that Johannes struggles to understand. He tells and retells the story of Abraham in multiple versions, aiming to get closer to understanding faith by contrasting it with superficially similar but ultimately different cases of what-faith-is-not. One development in scholarly interpretation over the decades has been a shift away from a tendency in some earlier scholarship to leap instantly to the three Problems in the second part of the book (what Johannes calls its “dialectical” sections)—especially the first, as to whether the story of Abraham contains a “teleological suspension of the ethical”. The importance of paying attention to the earlier sections of the book is now widely recognized. This includes the early account, in the section entitled “Attunement” or “Tuning Up” (Stemning), of four different versions of the Abraham story. We might call them “sub-Abrahams” (cf. Lippitt 2016). All of them are prepared to obey God, but each differs in various ways from the Abraham who is the “father of faith”. This should warn us off readings which suggest that the central message of the text—and of faith—is simply the importance of being obedient to God. Another key contrast (in the section entitled “Preliminary Outpouring from the Heart”) is between faith and “infinite resignation”. The “knight of infinite resignation” has an openness and comprehensibility to Johannes that the enigmatic “knight of faith” lacks. In a strategy not uncommon in Kierkegaard’s authorship, faith is illustrated by drawing a parallel with love. Specifically, silentio illustrates the distinction between faith and infinite resignation through a story of two different versions of a young lad who falls in love with an unattainable princess (FT 34ff./SKS 4, 136ff.). Infinite resignation—the first move in the “double movement” of faith—involves the renunciation of important goods or commitments in favor of those considered to be “higher”. This sacrifice, while painful, contains a certain “peace and rest and consolation” (FT 38/SKS 4, 140). Yet the knight of faith manages fully to value finite goods (Isaac or the princess) in a way that his infinite resignation counterpart does not. Commentators have disagreed on how to interpret this (see, e.g., Mooney 1991, R. Hall 2000, and Davenport 2008; for a summary, see Lippitt 2016: 59–73). But a key notion seems to be that whereas infinite resignation is something that I can achieve through my own will, the knight of faith both recognizes his dependence upon a divine power beyond himself and trusts in God’s promises—even in the most extraordinary “trial” of the akedah—in a way that appears to an outsider like Johannes as “absurd”. Remarkably, the knight of faith is able to take a genuine joy in the finite world, receiving it back (in the form of Isaac or the princess) despite having given it up in “resignation”. Crucial here is the idea that God’s promises are for this life, not just an after-life. The true measure of Abraham’s faith is less his willingness to sacrifice Isaac than his trust and hope that he will “receive him back”—in this life, not just in eternity.

Each of the three Problems begins with the idea that “the ethical as such is the universal”, a different dimension of which is brought out in each Problem. Does Abraham’s faith contain a “teleological suspension of the ethical”? Abraham seems to offend against “the universal” in four ways, all closely related. First, he makes of himself an exception to what universality demands (one ought not to kill one’s innocent offspring). This—secondly—amounts to the “paradox” that the “single individual” stands higher than the universal. Hegelian concerns about the dangers of subjectivity—such that Moralität (concerning an individual’s inner will or intention) needs to be subordinated to Sittlichkeit (the customs, norms and institutions of a rational society)—are relevant here. The problem with Abraham is that his private relationship to God is given priority over his duties as a social creature. Thus—third—Abraham stands in a direct, unmediated relation to God and so—fourth—he cannot explain his actions in publicly available, shareable language. The radical privacy of his God-relationship is key to understanding the difference between the knight of faith and the “tragic hero”, the next on the list of what-faith-is-not. The stories of Agamemnon, Jepthah and Brutus (FT 50–2/SKS 4, 151–3) each offers another case of a father feeling the obligation to sacrifice his own offspring for a cause conceived of as “higher”. The key difference is that each of these can explain himself by giving a publicly comprehensible account of his actions (such as a military leader’s duties to the state overriding those to his own family). These explanations are within the realm of the ethical conceived of as the universal, whereas—according to Johannes—Abraham has no such explanation available to him. His faith is a “purely personal virtue” (FT 52/SKS 4, 153) as opposed to the virtue of Sittlichkeit embodied by the tragic hero. This relationship between the single individual and the universal is further explored in Problems II and III. The former focuses on whether our duty to God is absolute; and what that implies in the case of the kind of direct God-relationship exemplified by Abraham. The lengthy Problem III, which—focusing on Abraham’s silence—considers whether concealing his purpose from others (such as his son, wife and servant) was ethically defensible. Problem III in particular has divided commentators, some viewing it as somewhat rambling, others as crucially important—especially those who attribute significance to the book’s motto, and its apparent suggestion that the book may contain a hidden message not understood by the messenger (Johannes himself?). For these latter, the story of Agnete and the merman (FT 82ff./SKS 4, 183ff.), with its discussion of sin and repentance—important themes elsewhere in Kierkegaard’s authorship—has seemed particularly important (e.g., Green 1993, Mulhall 2001, Krishek 2009; for an overview, see Lippitt 2016: 196–206).

As noted above, what Climacus in the Postscript labels Religiousness A is a religion of immanence that requires no transcendent revelation. Genuine Christianity, on Kierkegaard’s view, emphatically does rest on such a revelation. Johannes Climacus, in Philosophical Fragments, provides a humorous and ironic attempt to “invent” something that looks suspiciously like Christianity. He begins with an account of the Socratic view (understood very much in terms of Plato’s Socrates) of “the Truth” and how it is obtained, and then seeks an alternative to the Socratic view that the Truth can be found through “recollection”. The alternative requires a teacher who is divine, but who out of self-giving love becomes human. (The irony and humor consist in a mock attempt to “invent” something whose essence is that it cannot be a human invention.)

Fragments offers the first delineation in Kierkegaard’s authorship of the idea that Christian faith is centered on the incarnation (“the God-man”). The incarnation is claimed to be the “the Absolute Paradox”, and it is variously described as “a contradiction”, or “the most improbable” (PF 52/ SKS 4, 256) of all things. Although both Climacus and Kierkegaard, in later writings, insist that the incarnation must be seen as an historical event, since otherwise we are “back to Socrates”, they reject any attempt to base faith in the God-man on historical evidence. Rather, faith in the incarnation is seen as something that is given directly to the disciple by the God-man, though the encounter (for later generations) is mediated through historical testimony. (Kierkegaard’s non-evidentialist account of faith can be usefully compared to the externalist account of faith found in contemporary “Reformed epistemology” (Evans 2006: 169–182, 183–205)). Though Kierkegaard does not write about epistemology in a systematic manner, he writes about knowledge and belief in many places (see Piety 2010 for a good overview of his thoughts on such matters). His views of moral and religious knowledge can also be compared to the contemporary development of virtue epistemology, which puts more emphasis on the character of the knower in the acquisition of knowledge, in contrast to most modern epistemologies, which have focused largely on evidence and said little about the traits or characteristics that might make it possible for a person to grasp the truth.

Calling the incarnation a “contradiction” has suggested to some that Kierkegaard is a radical fideist who sees Christian faith as requiring a rejection of reason by believing what is logically contradictory, a view applauded by some (e.g., Shestov 1936 [1969]), and decried by others (e.g., Pojman 1984). However, it is far from obvious that Kierkegaard saw Christian faith this way. To Kierkegaard’s Danish contemporaries, the term for “contradiction” (Modsigelse) would not have meant only or even mainly a logical contradiction. Rather, Kierkegaard frequently uses the term to describe a tension or incongruity. Human existence itself is described as involving the same “contradiction” as the incarnation, the synthesizing of temporality and eternity, and Kierkegaard also says that all humor focuses on contradictions (by which he clearly means something like incongruity (Lippitt 2000: 8–11)). Kierkegaard certainly sees the incarnation as something that human reason cannot understand; as such it poses “the possibility of offense” for a person who is unwilling to recognize that there could be truth that transcends immanent human capacities. However, Kierkegaard also insists that offense is not more rationally justified than is faith. Faith and offense are opposite and rival passions, and neither can be fully justified by reason. (For more on these issues, see Evans 1992.)

In Kierkegaard’s later writing, both in signed works and in the writings of Anti-Climacus, the offense of faith is often described more in ethical than intellectual terms. In these writings the barriers to faith are seen as pride and selfishness, since faith in Christ requires a radical willingness to love the neighbor, a category which even includes one’s enemies.

3.3.2 Love

Scholarship over the last two decades or so has increasingly recognized the importance and profundity of Kierkegaard’s thought on love (see, e.g., R. Hall 2000, Ferreira 2001, A. Hall 2002, Evans 2004, Furtak 2005, Krishek 2009, Lippitt 2013a, 2020, Strawser 2015). The question of what it means to love well is one that runs through many of his writings, pseudonymous and signed. As alluded to above, Either/Or contrasts the aesthetic picture of erotic love as immediate immersion in the infatuation of “first love” or hyper-reflective seduction (“love” as a kind of game) with married love as preserving love in time (living simultaneously in “hope” and “recollection:” developing a shared history, properly related to a shared past and a shared future, and thus making love “historical”.) For the Judge, such love may be made “eternal” by being freely taken upon as one’s duty. Related themes are also explored in Stages on Life’s Way. Fear and Trembling, often approached as being about a clash of duties (between Abraham’s duty to his God and ethical duties conceived of in terms of “the universal”), may just as well be approached as an apparent clash of loves (for God; for Isaac).

However, Kierkegaard’s most significant text on love is the signed Works of Love, a series of fifteen “deliberations”, typically on a key New Testament passage on love. A central issue in this text is the love that is at stake in the command to love our neighbors as ourselves. The form of love that for Kierkegaard is at the root of all true love is Kjerlighed, which in many of its uses can reasonably be understood as “neighbor-love” and as a form of agape—provided we understand this as a quality that human beings are capable of manifesting (albeit with a divine source), not just a quality of God himself. Several deliberations contrast neighbor-love with forms of “preferential” love (erotic love [Elskov] and friendship). Contrary to what has often been claimed (e.g., Adorno 1939 [2003], Løgstrup 1956 [1997]), Kierkegaard is not opposed to erotic love and friendship, but concerned about the risks inherent within them, chiefly the way in which they may often manifest “selfish” forms of self-love. The key difference between them and neighbor-love is that the preferential loves arise “naturally” for humans, whereas neighbor-love does not. “The neighbor” includes everyone, and we are to strive to love all—including our enemies. This is so counter-intuitive to the “natural” human, Kierkegaard claims, that it needs to be commanded (WL 24–5, SKS 9, 32–3). Furthermore, the duty to love must be grounded in divine authority; no human authority is sufficient. Neighbor-love—in which God is the “middle term”—is often portrayed as a kind of purifying agent, which is capable of transforming otherwise potentially disordered kinds of love and preserving “the equality of the eternal” in love. Precisely how has been a matter of recent scholarly controversy (for contributions, building on a dispute between Ferreira 2001 and Krishek 2009, see for instance Lippitt 2013a, Davenport 2017, Hanson 2022). Nevertheless, Kierkegaard stresses that love is still genuine even when one needs to be loved: in this sense, his conception of love is very different from those who would draw a hard and fast distinction between, say, agape and eros (e.g., Nygren 1930–36 [1953]).

Kierkegaard’s focus on the works (or deeds) of love is also key. He does not approach love simply as an occurrent feeling, but as a “passion”, which for him is something like a powerful basic disposition that can give shape to a whole life, expressing itself in actions as well as in emotions. Underlying this passion is a certain way of seeing: Kierkegaard’s is a “vision” view of love (Ferreira 2001, esp. 99–116). Far from being a generalized form of benevolence or compassion, neighbor-love requires paying attention to the particular neighbor we encounter, seeing the other in all her distinctive concreteness and specificity, and desiring what is good for that individual in particular. Relatedly, love has its own epistemic standards rooted in a certain generosity of spirit, a recognition that underpins important discussions on how attitudes of trust or mistrust; hope or despair, can help or hinder our interpretation of ambiguous evidence about people (cf. the deliberations “Love Believes all Things—and Yet Is Never Deceived” and “Love Hopes All Things—and Yet Is Never Put to Shame”.) Another important theme—at the heart of the second love commandment—is how we should love ourselves. The commandment takes it as a given that we do: like others who have written on self-love (from Aristotle and Aquinas to Harry Frankfurt), Kierkegaard is interested in “proper” and “improper” ways of doing so. To love oneself properly—in a non-selfish way—is not only allowed but required. The neighbor, remember, includes everyone—and everyone includes you. An appropriate kind of hope for and trust in oneself, plus self- forgiveness, properly understood, may be taken to be important modes of proper self-love (Lippitt 2013a: 136–80).

3.3.3 Hope and Other Virtues

Despair—discussed in §2, §3.1, and §3.2 above—has long been recognized as a key Kierkegaardian theme. Along with anxiety, it remains one of Kierkegaard’s key psychological-religious concepts. Hope—which Kierkegaard most commonly discusses under the name of “expectancy” (Forventning)—may be seen as despair’s antithesis. Indeed, it has been argued that despair is at root the unwillingness to hope, and that hope is essential to the task of becoming a self (Bernier 2015, cf. Lippitt 2015a). On such a view, faith contrasts with despair because faith includes a willingness to hope.

In the discourse literature, Kierkegaard explores the structure of various other virtues of the ethical and—particularly—religious life. Aside from extensive discussions of faith and love, he also explores hope, courage, humility, patience, honesty, gratitude and meekness (Sagtmodighed), amongst others. There are also extensive discussions of such qualities as joy and contrition, and peculiarly Kierkegaardian qualities such as (spiritual) sobriety and “earnestness” (Alvor). The philosophical task of unpacking these qualities is almost always in the service of the role they play in the religious or specifically Christian life. While Kierkegaard’s approach to these qualities is often not explicitly to talk of them as virtues (perhaps because of the negative resonances of talk of “virtue” in his native Lutheran tradition—but see Vos 2020), it makes sense to do so given that each may be thought of as contributing to the formation of character. Broadly in line with the classical tradition, he typically sees each such quality as involving certain ways of thinking, feeling and seeing correctly. One significant difference with the classical Greek tradition, however, is that Kierkegaard holds, along with many other Christian thinkers, that some of these human excellences cannot be achieved merely through human willing but require divine grace and assistance. There is a growing recognition of Kierkegaard as being a largely untapped source of insight into understanding the role of numerous virtues in the task of allowing oneself to be “built up”. (See, e.g., Lippitt 2020, Roberts 2022: for a contrary view, skeptical about associating Kierkegaard with the virtue tradition, see Walsh 2018.)

Kierkegaard’s theological concerns often influence what he says about human character. One example illustrating this is his view of forgiveness. While forgiveness is not (unlike say anxiety or despair) a topic to which he devotes an entire book, it is a theme that emerges in many places in the authorship. Although Kierkegaard’s interest seems to be in what it means to be a forgiving person (an aspect of what it means to be a loving person), the primary lens through which he views forgiveness is the divine forgiveness of sins. This means that he is as interested in the difficulty of our accepting forgiveness as the difficulty of our being able to forgive. To accept forgiveness requires “sin-consciousness:” an awareness of oneself as being in the wrong. For Kierkegaard, this is extremely difficult for such prideful creatures as we are. The capacity to forgive sin per se (as opposed to individual wrongs) is the “chasmal qualitative abyss” (SUD 122/SKS 11, 233) between God and humanity. The refusal of God’s forgiveness is itself a manifestation of pride, rooted in a misguided sense of our self-sufficiency and a failure to recognize our radical dependency. In The Sickness Unto Death, Anti-Climacus claims that the despair of the forgiveness of sins is itself a sin (“offense”,) which can only be transcended in faith. This theological background plays an important role in what Kierkegaard goes on to claim about self-forgiveness and interpersonal forgiveness (such as the need to avoid such vices as pride and self-righteousness, and the need to cultivate “before God” such capacities as generosity of spirit, humility and hope). His fundamental approach to these forms of human forgiveness, as well as the divine forgiveness in which they have their origins, is to explore them as “works of love” (see Lippitt 2020).

4. Trajectories in Kierkegaard Scholarship

The vast range of Kierkegaard’s influences makes the task of summarizing the most important secondary literature close to impossible. For the literature selected would depend upon which approaches to Kierkegaard the author finds most fruitful. In this section, we aim to sketch some key trajectories of interpretation, giving sample references of each kind of approach.

One axis along which Kierkegaard commentators may be divided is between those for whom the primary task in understanding Kierkegaard involves locating him accurately in his historical context (e.g., understanding his complex relationship to German idealism and romanticism, and to contemporaries such as the Danish Hegelian Hans Lassen Martensen), and those for whom Kierkegaard is interesting primarily because of the ability his texts have to contribute to issues of more recent or contemporary interest (philosophical; theological; literary; social or political; etc.). An excellent example of the former approach would be much of the work of Jon Stewart. For many years, Niels Thulstrup’s Kierkegaard’s Relation to Hegel (1967 [1980]) was thought to have decisively shown that Kierkegaard took little from Hegel. However, Stewart’s Kierkegaard’s Relations to Hegel Reconsidered (2003)—note the plural in the title—argues convincingly that many of the targets Kierkegaard had in mind in his attacks on Hegelianism were Danish followers of Hegel who may have misunderstood or misapplied Hegel in significant ways. Thus, Kierkegaard’s relation to Hegel is much more complex and nuanced than has sometimes been thought. Stewart aims to show that Kierkegaard was responding specifically to debates in 1830s and 1840s Denmark about Hegel’s philosophy (especially its significance for theology), a milieu in which Martensen was a crucial figure.

This does not mean, nor does Stewart claim, that there are no disagreements between Kierkegaard and Hegel. Stewart divides the Kierkegaard corpus into three main periods: up to and including Either/Or (where Kierkegaard is most open to Hegel’s philosophy); from Fear and Trembling to the Postscript (where the attacks on “Hegelianism” are most pronounced and polemical); and Works of Love onwards, where the waning of Hegel’s influence in Denmark means that Kierkegaard’s criticism diminishes. Here a certain positive influence of Hegel re-emerges, for example in the method of The Sickness Unto Death.

Critics have disagreed as to whether Stewart’s analysis closes the gap between Kierkegaard and Hegel excessively, for instance regarding the two figures’ different views of the relationship between philosophy and religion. One central issue concerns the proper attitude of the philosopher. As we have noted, Kierkegaard opposes a kind of disengaged “objective” standpoint, while Hegel at least in some places maintains that such an attitude is necessary for philosophy to be “scientific”. Hegel famously claims that “philosophy should beware of the wish to be edifying” (Hegel 1977: 6; originally published 1807), which seems directly contrary to the Kierkegaardian claim at the end of Either/Or II: “Only the truth that edifies is truth for you” (EO II, 354, translation modified/ SKS 3,331). Another point of tension is the Hegelian aim to produce a “system” encompassing the whole of reality, whereas Kierkegaard’s pseudonym Johannes Climacus insists that a system of existence is impossible for anyone but God (CUP I, 118–125/SKS 7, 114 -120).

Stewart later went on to become general editor of a monumental series: Kierkegaard Research: Sources, Reception, and Resources, which includes a huge amount of work of this historically oriented type (amongst others). Michelle Kosch’s work on Kierkegaard in relation to German idealism (Kosch 2006) is another exemplary instance of historically oriented work, while Fred Rush’s book on Kierkegaard in relation to romanticism (esp. Schlegel) and idealism (esp. Hegel) also provides helpful historical context (Rush 2016).

Examples of the less historically oriented type of Kierkegaard scholarship are highly varied. Some have looked to Kierkegaard as a kind of proto-Derrida, a deconstructionist avant la lettre (e.g., Poole 1993; for an overview of deconstructionist and postmodernist readings of Kierkegaard which does not conflate the two, see Shakespeare 2013). Similarly, the question has been raised as to whether Kierkegaard can plausibly be read as a proto-phenomenologist despite preceding Husserl (e.g., Hanson 2010; see also Welz 2013). Others have seen some intriguing commonalities between Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein, either the Tractatus or later writings, sometimes focusing on the ostensibly narrow but (it is claimed) ultimately deeply significant question of how we should read the “revocation” of the Postscript, and what this reveals about the proper method of philosophy with regard to religious questions (e.g., Cavell 1969; Conant 1989, 1993, 1995; Lippitt & Hutto 1998; Phillips 1999; Mulhall 2001; Schönbaumsfeld 2007). MacIntyre’s claims about Kierkegaard’s proper place in the history of philosophy—allegedly, as a critical figure in the failure of the Enlightenment’s attempt to offer a rational justification of morality—spawned a veritable scholarly sub-industry, not only aiming to show where MacIntyre was wrong in his interpretation of Kierkegaard, but of how Kierkegaard in fact anticipated many highly MacIntyrean themes. As noted above, a central focus of debate has been whether Kierkegaard may be read—like MacIntyre—as a proponent of a narrative-based account of practical identity, where a “narrative structure” is needed to make a human life intelligible, actions and intentions needing to be located in a temporal, social and teleological context in order to be understood. However, this may be seen as part of a broader school of interpretation, which finds some intriguing parallels between Kierkegaard and several major recent anglophone moral philosophers. Besides MacIntyre, these would include Harry Frankfurt (see, e.g., Mooney 1996, esp. 65–76 and the essays in Rudd and Davenport 2015); Iris Murdoch (e.g., Martens 2012); Charles Taylor (e.g., Khan 2012) and Bernard Williams (e.g., Mooney 1996, esp. 65–76, Compaijen 2018). The shift in moral philosophy during the later decades of the twentieth century and into the twenty-first—from mid-1900s concerns about the nature of ethical language and debates about realism versus anti-realism in ethics, to broader concerns about what makes human lives meaningful, the nature of human flourishing, and the moral psychology of the virtues—has been seen by many Kierkegaard scholars as a move (albeit mostly an unwitting one) in the direction of more “Kierkegaardian” concerns. Within this school of interpretation, some key claims have been that Kierkegaard holds a teleological view of the self; a belief that the quest for “narrative unity” is an important element in achieving ethical selfhood; and a rich view of the virtues (Davenport and Rudd 2001; Davenport 2012; Rudd 2012). Even skeptics about the second view (e.g., Lippitt 2007, 2015b) have tended to agree on the first and third.

Another major fault line in Kierkegaard scholarship concerns the divide between scholars who take Kierkegaard’s Christian commitments seriously and those who find them something of an embarrassment, and whose approach to the texts seems to be to ask what can be salvaged despite these commitments. The former approach is exemplified in much of the work of Evans (1983, 1992, 2009, 2019), which has consistently tried to show that Kierkegaard’s writings can be helpful in making sense of the religious life in general and Christianity in particular. The latter type of work has sometimes taken the form of reading Kierkegaard “against Kierkegaard” (e.g., Adorno 1933 [1989], Theunissen 1993 [2005]). Finally, quite a bit of work has also been done on Kierkegaard’s view of women and gender (see for instance Walsh 2022.)

5. Conclusion

Kierkegaard is a beguiling but frustrating thinker, full of provocations and insights but also difficult to nail down. He has thus been interpreted in many—often incompatible—ways, and this is likely to continue to be so. Much of his thought remains highly relevant to our day, including his critique of mass society and conformism, and his attempt to show emotions and passions as essential elements of authentic human life. In his writings on ethical and religious life, he tries to show that a disengaged, objective stance, far from facilitating knowledge, is a barrier to knowing the truth. His perspective on religion and society is likely to elicit objections from opposite sides of the contemporary political spectrum, since he sharply criticizes “Christendom”, including contemporary versions of Christian nationalism (see, e.g., Backhouse 2011), while also rejecting the claim of some liberals that religion should be excluded from our common life, which requires a supposedly neutral, disengaged stance that Kierkegaard sees as neither possible nor desirable. If the “analytic”—“continental” distinction still has any value, then Kierkegaard has appealed to philosophers on both sides, sometimes providing fine conceptual analyses yet also doing philosophy in a highly literary mode. He himself can be seen as “that individual” to whom he dedicated many of his works, a writer who succeeded in his goal of communicating “indirectly”, in a manner that demands “subjective” engagement if his work is to be read to maximum advantage.

Chronology of Kierkegaard’s Works

  • From the Papers of One Still Living. Published against his Will by S. Kierkegaard (Af en endnu Levendes Papirer)
  • On the Concept of Irony with Continual Reference to Socrates (Om Begrebet Ironi med stadigt Hensyn til Socrates)

    Kierkegaard’s Magister dissertation.

  • Either-Or: A Fragment of Life edited by Victor Eremita (Enten-Eller. Et Livs-Fragment)
  • Two Upbuilding Discourses by S. Kierkegaard (To opbyggelige Taler)
  • Fear and Trembling: A Dialectical Lyric by Johannes de silentio (Frygt og Bœven. Dialektisk Lyrik)
  • Repetition: A Venture in Experimenting Psychology by Constantine Constantius (Gjentagelsen. Et Forsøg i den experimenterende Psychologi)

    Published the same day as Fear and Trembling.

  • Three Upbuilding Discourses by S. Kierkegaard (Tre opbyggelige Taler)
  • Four Upbuilding Discourses by S. Kierkegaard (Fire opbyggelige Taler)
  • Two Upbuilding Discourses by S. Kierkegaard (To opbyggelige Taler)
  • Three Upbuilding Discourses by S. Kierkegaard (Tre opbyggelige Taler)
  • Philosophical Fragments or a Fragment of Philosophy by Johannes Climacus, published by S. Kierkegaard (Philosophiske Smuler eller En Smule Philosophie)
  • The Concept of Anxiety: A Simple Psychologically-Oriented Reflection on the Dogmatic Problem of Original Sin by Vigilius Haufniensis (Begrebet Angest. En simpel psychologisk-paapegende Overveielse i Retning of det dogmatiske Problem om Arvesynden)
  • Prefaces: Light Reading for Certain Classes as the Occasion may Require by Nicolaus Notabene (Forord. Morskabslœsning for enkelte Stœnder efter Tid og Lejlighed)

    Published on the same day as The Concept of Anxiety.

  • Four Edifying Discourses by S. Kierkegaard (Fire opbyggelige Taler)
  • Three Discourses on Imagined Occasions by S. Kierkegaard (Tre Taler ved tœnkte Leiligheder)
  • Stages On Life’s Way: Studies by Various Persons, compiled, forwarded to the press, and published by Hilarius Bookbinder (Stadier paa Livets Vej. Studier af Forskjellige)
  • Eighteen Upbuilding Discourses by S. Kierkegaard

    A collection of the above-mentioned Upbuilding Discourses from 1843 and 1844.

  • Article in The Fatherland (Fœdrelandet) in which Frater Taciturnus (a character from Stages on Life’s Way) asked to be attacked in The Corsair
  • Concluding Unscientific Postscript to Philosophical Fragments: A Mimetic-Pathetic-Dialectical Compilation, An Existential Contribution, by Johannes Climacus, published by S. Kierkegaard (Affslutende Uvidenskabelig Efterskrift til de philosophiske Smuler)
  • A Literary Review: “Two Ages”—novella by the author of “An Everyday Story”—reviewed by S. Kierkegaard (En literair Anmeldelse)
  • Upbuilding Discourses in Various Spirits by S. Kierkegaard (Opbyggelige Taler i forskjellig Aand)
  • Works of Love: Some Christian Reflections in the Form of Discourses by S. Kierkegaard (Kjerlighedens Gjerninger. Nogle christelige Overveielser i Talers Form)
  • Christian Discourses by S. Kierkegaard (Christelige Taler)
  • The Crisis and a Crisis in the Life of an Actress by Inter et Inter (Krisen og en Krise i en Skuespillerindes Liv)
  • The Point of View for my Work as an Author: A Direct Communication, A Report to History by S. Kierkegaard (Synspunktet for min Forfatter-Virksomhed. En ligefrem Meddelelse, Rapport til Historien)

    Published posthumously.

  • Second edition of Either-Or
  • The Lilies of the Field and the Birds of the Air: Three devotional discourses by S. Kierkegaard (Lilien paa Marken og Fuglen under Himlen. Tre gudelige Taler)
  • Two Ethico-Religious Treatises by H.H. (Tvende ethisk-religieuse Smaa-Afhandlinger)
  • The Sickness Unto Death: A Christian psychological exposition for edification and awakening by Anti-Climacus, published by S. Kierkegaard (Sygdommen til Døden. En christelig psychologisk Udvikling til Opvœkkelse)
  • “The High Priest”—“The Tax Collector”—and “The Woman who was a Sinner”: three addresses at Holy Communion on Fridays by S. Kierkegaard (“Yppersteprœsten”—“Tolderen”—“Synderinden”, tre Taler ved Altergangen om Fredagen)
  • Practice in Christianity by Anti-Climacus, published by S. Kierkegaard (Indøvelse i Christendom)
  • An Upbuilding Discourse by S. Kierkegaard (En opbyggelig Tale)
  • On My Work as an Author by S. Kierkegaard (Om min Forfatter-Virksomhed)
  • Two Discourses at the Communion on Fridays by S. Kierkegaard (To Taler ved Altergangen om Fredagen)
  • For Self-Examination Recommended to the contemporary age by S. Kierkegaard (Til Selvprøvelse)
  • Judge For Yourselves! Recommended to the contemporary age for Self-Examination. Second series, by S. Kierkegaard (Dømmer Selv!)

    Published posthumously.

  • “Was Bishop Mynster ‘a witness to the truth,’ one of ‘the true witnesses to the truth’—is this the truth?” by S. Kierkegaard in Fœdrelandet (“Var Biskop Mynster et ‘Sandhedsvidne’, et af ‘de rette Sandhedsvidner’, er dette Sandhed?”)

    The first of 21 articles in Fœdrelandet.

  • This Must Be Said, So Let It Be Said, by S. Kierkegaard (Dette skal siges; saa vœre det da sagt)

    Newspaper article.

  • The Moment by S. Kierkegaard (Øjeblikket)
  • Christ’s Judgement on Official Christianity by S. Kierkegaard (Hvad Christus dømmer om officiel Christendom)
  • The Changelessness of God: A Discourse by S. Kierkegaard (Guds Uforanderlighed. En Tale)


A. Primary Literature: Works by Kierkegaard

A.1 Kierkegaard’s Works in Danish

The now definitive critical edition of Kierkegaard’s writings is:

  • [SKS] Kierkegaard, Søren, Søren Kierkegaard’s Skrifter, N. J. Cappelørn et al. (eds), Copenhagen: Gad, 1997–2013, 55 volumes. Also available online at: http://www.sks.dk/

A.2 Kierkegaard’s Works in English

The most used translations for most of Kierkegaard’s works is the Kierkegaard’s Writings series published by Princeton University Press under the general editorship of Howard V. and Edna. H. Hong. In citations above, we have followed the commonly used sigla of abbreviations of these titles, a more complete list of which is as follows. In some instances, we have cited alternative translations, which are listed here instead of the translations in the Kierkegaard’s Writings series.

Published works
  • [BA] The Book on Adler, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 24), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1997.

    Published posthumously.

  • [CA] The Concept of Anxiety, Reidar Thomte (ed. and trans.) in collaboration with Albert B. Anderson (Kierkegaard’s Writings 8), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1980.
  • [CD] Christian Discourses, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 17), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1997. Published with The Crisis and a Crisis in the Life of an Actress.
  • [CI] The Concept of Irony, with Continual Reference to Socrates, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 2), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1989.
  • [COR] The Corsair Affair, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 13), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1982
  • [CUP] Concluding Unscientific Postscript to “Philosophical Fragments”, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.), 2 volumes (Kierkegaard’s Writings 12), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • [EO] Either/Or, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.), 2 volumes (Kierkegaard’s Writings 3–4), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1987.
  • [EPW] Early Polemical Writings, Julia Watkin (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 1), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1990.
  • [EUD] Eighteen Upbuilding Discourses, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 5), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1990.
  • [FSE/JFY] For Self-Examination and Judge for Yourself! Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 21), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1990.
  • [FT] Fear and Trembling, C. Stephen Evans and Sylvia Walsh (eds), Sylvia Walsh (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.
  • [P] Prefaces and “Writing Sampler”, Todd W. Nichol (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 9), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1998.
  • [PC] Practice in Christianity, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 20), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1991.
  • [PF/JC] Philosophical Fragments, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 7), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1985. Published with Johannes Climacus or “De omnibus dubitandum est”.
  • [PV] The Point of View: “On My Work as an Author”; “The Point of View for My Work as an Author”; “Armed Neutrality”, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 22), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1998.
  • [R] Repetition, in Fear and Trembling; Repetition, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 6), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1983.
  • [SLW] Stages on Life’s Way, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 11), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1988.
  • [SUD] The Sickness Unto Death, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 19), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1980.
  • [TA] Two Ages: The Age of Revolution and the Present Age. A Literary Review, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 14), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1978.
  • [TDIO] Three Discourses on Imagined Occasions, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 10), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1993.
  • [TM] “The Moment” and Late Writings, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 23), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1998.
  • [UDVS] Upbuilding Discourses in Various Spirits, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 15), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1993.
  • [WA] Without Authority, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 18), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1997.
  • [WL] Works of Love, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.) (Kierkegaard’s Writings 16), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1995.
Journals, Notebooks and Other Papers
  • [KJN] Kierkegaard’s Journals and Notebooks, N. J. Cappelørn et al. (ed.), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2007–2020.

    Multi-volume translation of all Kierkegaard’s journals, notebooks and miscellaneous papers, based on the relevant parts of SKS.

Two older selections from Kierkegaard’s unpublished works are:

  • [JP] Søren Kierkegaards Journals and Papers, Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (ed. and trans.), Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1967–78, 7 volumes.
  • [LD] Letters and Documents, Hendrik Rosenmeier (ed. and trans.), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1978.

A more manageable introduction to Kierkegaard’s journals and unpublished papers is:

  • [PJ] Papers and Journals: A Selection, Alastair Hannay (trans. with introduction and notes), Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1996.

B. Selected Secondary Literature and Other Works Referred To

We have here focused on books: articles are only referenced if referred to in the above text.

  • Adorno, Theodor W., 1933 [1989], Kierkegaard: Konstruktion des ästhetischen, (Beiträge zur Philosophie und ihrer Geschichte 2), Tübingen: Mohr. Translated as Kierkegaard: Construction of the Aesthetic, Robert Hullot-Kentor (trans.), (Theory and History of Literature 61), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1989.
  • –––, 1939 [2003], “On Kierkegaard’s Doctrine of Love”, Zeitschrift für Sozialforschung, 8(3): 413–429. Reprinted in Conway 2003, Vol. II: 7–21. doi:10.5840/zfs19398377
  • Agacinski, Sylviane, 1977 [1988], Aparté : conceptions et morts de Sören Kierkegaard, (La philosophie en effet), Paris: Aubier. Translated as Aparté: Conceptions and Deaths of Søren Kierkegaard, Kevin Newmark (trans.), (Kierkegaard and Postmodernism), Gainesville, FL: University Presses of Florida, 1988.
  • Backhouse, Stephen, 2011, Kierkegaard’s Critique of Christian Nationalism, (Oxford Theological Monographs), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199604722.001.0001
  • –––, 2016, Kierkegaard: A Single Life, Grand Rapids, MI: Zondervan.
  • Barrett, Lee, 2013, “Kierkegaard as Theologian: A History of Countervailing Interpretations”, in Lippitt and Pattison 2013: 528–549 (ch. 27).
  • Beabout, Gregory R., 1996, Freedom and its Misuses: Kierkegaard on Anxiety and Despair, Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press.
  • Bernier, Mark, 2015, The Task of Hope in Kierkegaard, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198747888.001.0001
  • Binswanger, Ludwig, 1958, “The Case of Ellen West: An Anthropological-Clinical Study”, Werner M. Mendel and Joseph Lyons (trans.), in Existence: A New Dimension in Psychiatry and Psychology, Rollo May, Ernest Angel, and Henri F. Ellenberger (eds), New York: Basic Books/Hachette Book Group, 237–364. doi:10.1037/11321-009
  • Buben, Adam, Eleanor Helms, and Patrick Stokes (eds), 2019, The Kierkegaardian Mind, London/New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780429198571
  • Bukdahl, Jørgen, 1970 [2001], Søren Kierkegaard og den menige mand, Copenhagen: Gyldendal. Translated as Søren Kierkegaard and the Common Man, Bruce H. Kirmmse (trans.), Grand Rapids, MI: W.B. Eerdmans, 2001.
  • Carlisle, Clare, 2005, Kierkegaard’s Philosophy of Becoming: Movements and Positions, (SUNY Series in Theology and Continental Thought), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • –––, 2010, Kierkegaard’s Fear and Trembling: A Reader’s Guide, London: Continuum.
  • –––, 2013, “Kierkegaard and Heidegger”, in Lippitt and Pattison 2013: 421–439 (ch. 22).
  • –––, 2019, Philosopher of the Heart: The Restless Life of Søren Kierkegaard, London: Allen Lane.
  • Cavell, Stanley, 1969, “Kierkegaard’s On Authority and Revelation”, in his Must We Mean What We Say?, New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, chapter 1.
  • Compaijen, Rob, 2018, Kierkegaard, MacIntyre, Williams, and the Internal Point of View, Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan. doi:10.1007/978-3-319-74552-7
  • Conant, James, 1989, “Must We Show What We Cannot Say”, in The Senses of Stanley Cavell, Richard Fleming and Michael Payne (eds), Lewisburg, PA: Bucknell University Press, 242–283.
  • –––, 1993, “Kierkegaard, Wittgenstein and Nonsense”, in Pursuits of Reason: Essays in Honor of Stanley Cavell, Ted Cohen, Paul Guyer, and Hilary Putnam (eds), (Philosophical Inquiries 2), Lubbock, TX: Texas Tech University Press, 195–224.
  • –––, 1995, “Putting Two and Two Together: Kierkegaard, Wittgenstein and the Point of View for Their Work as Authors”, in Philosophy and the Grammar of Religious Belief, Timothy Tessin and Mario von der Ruhr (eds), London: Palgrave Macmillan UK, 248–331. doi:10.1007/978-1-349-23867-5_11
  • Conway, Daniel W. (ed.), 2003, Søren Kierkegaard: Critical Assessments of Leading Philosophers, 4 vols., London/New York: Routledge.
  • ––– (ed.), 2015, Kierkegaard’s “Fear and Trembling”: A Critical Guide, (Cambridge Critical Guides), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139540834
  • Davenport, John J., 2008, “Faith as Eschatological Trust in Fear and Trembling”, in Mooney 2008: 196–233 (ch. 15).
  • ––– , 2012, Narrative Identity, Autonomy, and Mortality: From Frankfurt and MacIntyre to Kierkegaard, (Routledge Studies in Contemporary Philosophy 36), New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203125946
  • –––, 2017, “The Integration of Neighbor-Love and Special Loves in Kierkegaard and von Hildebrand”, in Minister, Simmons and Strawser 2017: 46–77 (ch. 4).
  • Davenport, John and Anthony Rudd (eds), 2001, Kierkegaard After MacIntyre: Essays on Freedom, Narrative, and Virtue, Chicago: Open Court.
  • Derrida, Jacques, 1992 [1995], “Donner la mort”, in L’Ethique du don: Jacques Derrida et la pensée du don: colloque de Royaumont, décembre 1990, Jacques Derrida, Jean-Michel Rabaté, and Michael Wetzel (eds), Paris: Métailié-Transition. Translated as The Gift of Death, David Wills (trans.), (Religion and Postmodernism), Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1995.
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  • –––, 1990, Søren Kierkegaard’s Christian Psychology: Insights for Counselling and Pastoral Care, Grand Rapids, MI: Zondervan.
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  • –––, 1997, Subjektivitet og Negativitet: Kierkegaard, Copenhagen: Gyldendal.
  • Hall, Amy Laura, 2002, Kierkegaard and the Treachery of Love, (Cambridge Studies in Religion and Critical Thought 9), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511487736
  • Hall, Ronald L., 2000, The Human Embrace: The Love of Philosophy and the Philosophy of Love—Kierkegaard, Cavell, Nussbaum, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Hampson, Daphne, 2013, Kierkegaard: Exposition and Critique, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:osobl/9780199673230.001.0001
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  • Kirmmse, Bruce H., 1990, Kierkegaard in Golden Age Denmark, Bloomington: Indiana State University Press.
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  • Laing, R. D., 1960, The Divided Self: An Existential Study in Sanity and Madness, London: Tavistock Publications.
  • Law, David R., 2013, Kierkegaard’s Kenotic Christology, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199698639.001.0001
  • Lippitt, John, 2000, Humour and Irony in Kierkegaard’s Thought, London/New York: Macmillan/St. Martin’s Press.
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  • Lippitt, John and Patrick Stokes (eds), 2015, Narrative, Identity and the Kierkegaardian Self, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
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  • Løgstrup, Knud Ejler, 1956 [1997], Den etiske fordring, København: Gyldendal. Translated as The Ethical Demand, Theodor I. Jensen, Gary Puckering, and Eric Watkins (trans.), Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1997.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair C., 1981 [1984], After Virtue: A Study in Moral Theory, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press. Second edition, 1984.
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  • Mahn, Jason A., 2011, Fortunate Fallibility: Kierkegaard and the Power of Sin, (Reflection and Theory in the Study of Religion Series), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199790661.001.0001
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  • Malik, Habib C., 1997, Receiving Søren Kierkegaard: The Early Impact and Transmission of His Thought, Washington, DC: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Martens, Paul, 2012, “Iris Murdoch: Kierkegaard as Existentialist, Romantic, Hegelian, and Problematically Religious”, in Stewart 2007–2017, Volume 11 Tome III.
  • Matustik, Martin J. and Merold Westphal (eds), 1995, Kierkegaard in Post/Modernity, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
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  • Mooney, Edward F., 1991, Knights of Faith and Resignation: Reading Kierkegaard’s Fear and Trembling, Albany: State University of New York Press.
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  • Mortensen, Finn Hauberg, 1996, Kierkegaard Made in Japan, Odense: University Press of Southern Denmark.
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  • Nygren, Anders, 1930–1936 [1953], Den kristna kärlekstanken genom tiderna: Eros och Agape, 2 vols., Stockholm: Svenska Kyrkans Diakonistyrelses Bokförlag. Reprinted as Eros och Agape, 1966. Translated as Agape and Eros, Philip S. Watson (trans.), London: S.P.C.K., 1953. Reprinted New York: Harper and Row, 1969.
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  • Pattison, George, 1992, Kierkegaard: The Aesthetic and the Religious, New York: St. Martin’s Press. doi:10.1007/978-1-349-11818-2
  • –––, 2002, Kierkegaard’s Upbuilding Discourses: Philosophy, Theology, and Literature, (Routledge Studies in Nineteenth-Century Philosophy 2), London/New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203216576
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  • –––, 2012, Kierkegaard and the Theology of the Nineteenth Century: The Paradox and the “Point of Contact”, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139088237
  • Pattison, George and Steven Shakespeare (eds), 1998, Kierkegaard The Self in Society, Basingstoke: Macmillan. doi:10.1007/978-1-349-26684-5
  • Perkins, Robert L. (ed.), 1984–2010, International Kierkegaard Commentary, Macon, GA: Mercer University Press.

    Multi-volume series, with volumes for each of Kierkegaard’s works in the Kierkegaard’s Writings series.

  • Phillips, D. Z., 1999, Philosophy’s Cool Place, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Piety, M. G., 2010, Ways of Knowing: Kierkegaard’s Pluralist Epistemology, Waco, TX: Baylor University Press.
  • Podmore, Simon D., 2011, Kierkegaard and the Self Before God: Anatomy of the Abyss, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Pojman, Louis P., 1984, The Logic of Subjectivity: Kierkegaard’s Philosophy of Religion, Alabama: University of Alabama Press.
  • Pons, Jolita, 2004, Stealing a Gift: Kierkegaard’s Pseudonyms and the Bible, New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Poole, Roger, 1993, Kierkegaard: The Indirect Communication, Charlottesville, VA: University of Virginia Press.
  • Pyper, Hugh S., 2011, The Joy of Kierkegaard: Essays on Kierkegaard as a Biblical Reader, (Bibleworld), Sheffield/Oakville, CT: Equinox Pub. doi:10.4324/9781315729305
  • –––, 2013, “Kierkegaard and English Language Literature”, in Lippitt and Pattison 2013: 570–589 (ch. 29).
  • Rae, Murray A., 1997, Kierkegaard’s Vision of the Incarnation: By Faith Transformed, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198269403.001.0001
  • –––, 2010, Kierkegaard and Theology, London: T. and T. Clark.
  • Rée, Jonathan and Jane Chamberlain (eds), 1998, Kierkegaard: A Critical Reader, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Roberts, Robert C., 2022, Recovering Christian Character: The Psychological Wisdom of Søren Kierkegaard, Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.
  • Rudd, Anthony, 1993, Kierkegaard and the Limits of the Ethical, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198752189.001.0001
  • –––, 2012, Self, Value, and Narrative: A Kierkegaardian Approach, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199660049.001.0001
  • –––, 2013, “Kierkegaard, Wittgenstein and the Wittgensteinian Tradition”, in Lippitt and Pattison 2013: 484–503 (ch. 25).
  • Rudd, Anthony and John Davenport (eds), 2015, Love, Reason and Will: Kierkegaard After Frankfurt, New York and London: Bloomsbury.
  • Rush, Fred, 2016, Irony and Idealism: Rereading Schlegel, Hegel, and Kierkegaard, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199688227.001.0001
  • Schönbaumsfeld, Genia, 2007, A Confusion of the Spheres: Kierkegaard and Wittgenstein on Philosophy and Religion, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199229826.001.0001
  • Shakespeare, Steven, 2001, Kierkegaard, Language, and the Reality of God, (Transcending Boundaries in Philosophy and Theology), Aldershot/Burlington, VT: Ashgate. doi:10.4324/9781315210155
  • –––, 2013, “Kierkegaard and Postmodernism”, in Lippitt and Pattison 2013: 464–483 (ch. 24).
  • Shestov, Lev, 1936 [1969], Kierkegaard et la Philosophie Existentielle: “vox clamantie in deserto”. Translated as Kierkegaard and the Existential Philosophy, Elinor Hewitt (trans.), Athens, OH: Ohio University Press, 1969. [The first published version of this work was the French translation of 1936. Both that version and the English translation of 1969 were based on the original Russian version which wasn’t published until after the French translation.]
  • Simmons, J. Aaron and David Wood (eds), 2008, Kierkegaard and Levinas: Ethics, Politics, and Religion, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Söderquist, K. Brian, 2007, The Isolated Self: Truth and Untruth in Søren Kierkegaard’s “On the Concept of Irony”, Copenhagen: Reitzel.
  • Stewart, Jon, 2003, Kierkegaard’s Relations to Hegel Reconsidered, (Modern European Philosophy), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511498367
  • ––– (general editor), 2007–2017, Kierkegaard Research: Sources, Reception and Resources, Aldershot: Ashgate (2007–2015); New York: Routledge (2016–2017).

    Exhaustive, multi-volume study, including Emmanuel et al. (eds) 2013–15 above.

  • ––– (ed.), 2015, A Companion to Kierkegaard, (Blackwell Companions to Philosophy 58), Chichester/Malden, MA: Wiley Blackwell. doi:10.1002/9781118783795
  • Stokes, Patrick, 2010, Kierkegaard’s Mirrors: Interest, Self, and Moral Vision, London: Palgrave Macmillan UK. doi:10.1057/9780230251267
  • –––, 2015, The Naked Self: Kierkegaard and Personal Identity, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198732730.001.0001
  • Stokes, Patrick and Adam Buben (eds), 2011, Kierkegaard and Death, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Strawser, Michael, 2015, Kierkegaard and the Philosophy of Love, Lanham: Lexington Books.
  • Taylor, Mark C., 1980, Journeys to Selfhood: Hegel and Kierkegaard, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.
  • Theunissen, Michael, 1993 [2005], Der Begriff Verzweiflung: Korrekturen an Kierkegaard, (Suhrkamp Taschenbuch Wissenschaft 1062), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp. Translated as Kierkegaard’s Concept of Despair, Varbara Harshav and Helmut Illbruck (trans.), (Princeton Monographs in Philosophy), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Thulstrup, Niels, 1967 [1980], Kierkegaards forhold til Hegel og til den spekulative Idealisme indtil 1846, København: Gyldendal. Translated as Kierkegaard’s Relation to Hegel, George L. Stengren (trans.), (Princeton Legacy Library), Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press. doi:10.1515/9781400857203
  • Vos, Pieter, 2020, Longing for the Good Life: Virtue Ethics After Protestantism, London/New York: T&T Clark.
  • Walsh, Sylvia, 1994, Living Poetically: Kierkegaard’s Existential Aesthetics, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University.
  • –––, 2005, Living Christianly: Kierkegaard’s Dialectic of Christian Existence, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • –––, 2009, Kierkegaard: Thinking Christianly in an Existential Mode, (Christian Theology in Context), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199208357.001.0001
  • –––, 2018, Kierkegaard and Religion: Personality, Character, and Virtue, (Cambridge Studies in Religion, Philosophy, and Society), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781316848180
  • –––, 2022, Kierkegaard on Woman, Gender, and Love, Macon, GA: Mercer University Press.
  • Watkin, Julia, 2001, Historical Dictionary of Kierkegaard’s Philosophy, Lanham, MD and London: The Scarecrow Press.
  • Welz, Claudia, 2013, “Kierkegaard and Phenomenology”, in Lippitt and Pattison 2013: 440–463 (ch. 23).
  • Westphal, Merold, 1987, Kierkegaard’s Critique of Reason and Society, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • –––, 1996, Becoming a Self: A Reading of Kierkegaard’s Concluding Unscientific Postscript, West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press.
  • –––, 2014, Kierkegaard’s Concept of Faith, Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.

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