Leibniz’s Ethics

First published Thu Aug 26, 2004; substantive revision Mon Oct 31, 2016

Although Leibniz never wrote a systematic ethical treatise, in his view theology is a type of jurisprudence, a science of law (NE, p. 526). And Leibniz contributed a systematic work to the field of theology, namely, the Theodicy (1710), the only large-scale philosophical work that he published during his lifetime. Given that Leibniz the natural theologian and metaphysician is, at the same time, a moral philosopher, ethics has a central place in his philosophical system. No divisions exist among the nominally different fields. Thus the view that he never wrote a systematic ethical treatise is not true without qualification. Moreover, the fact that he views theology as a science of law provides some insight into the character of his ethics. He offers a natural law theory, and, like other such theories, its basic structure consists of a theory of the good and a theory of law. Compliance with the principles spelled out in the latter is necessary and sufficient to achieve the good. Since, according to Leibniz, God is the measure of the good, the primary directive of his ethics is that one ought to imitate divinity as far as possible.

1. Theory of the Good

Leibniz's ethics centers on a composite theory of the good. Three longstanding philosophical doctrines compose the theory: (1) the Platonic view that goodness is coextensive with reality or being, (2) the perfectionist view that the highest good consists in the development and perfection of one's nature, and (3) the hedonist view that the highest good is pleasure. This set of doctrines is disclosed in Leibniz's tripartite division of the good into the metaphysical good, the moral good, and the physical good (T §209, p. 258). He equates the metaphysical good with reality, moral goodness with virtue, and the physical good with pleasure. Moreover, with each type of good exists a correlative type of evil. The metaphysical good of reality correlates with the metaphysical evil of privation of reality or non-being. Similarly, the moral goodness of virtue relates to the moral evil of sin or vice. Finally, the physical good of pleasure is contrary to the physical evil of pain (T §21, p. 136). The theory constructed out of these divergent doctrines illustrates Leibniz's eclectic approach to philosophical investigation. As he puts it in a comment on his own system of philosophy, “This system appears to unite Plato with Democritus, Aristotle with Descartes, the Scholastics with the moderns, theology and morality with reason. Apparently it takes the best from all systems and then advances further than anyone has yet done” (NE, p. 71).  

Before looking at the way he attempts to advance moral philosophy and the theory of the good, it will help to have some background concerning what Leibniz calls the metaphysical good and its correlative metaphysical evil. In uniting goodness with reality, Leibniz borrows, not without putting his own stamp on it, a view that had currency with certain medieval philosophers (e.g., Augustine, Boethius, and Aquinas). The doctrine nonetheless originated in the Neoplatonic philosophy of Plotinus (204–269) and Porphyry (234–c.305), though there is clearly suggestion of it in Plato (e.g., Republic 518c, Timaeus 28b). In reuniting goodness and reality, or to what he interchangeably refers to as perfection, Leibniz thus characteristically recovers and attempts to restore a doctrine that had currency among medieval thinkers (for a study of the medieval treatment of the doctrine of metaphysical goodness, see the essays in MacDonald (ed.) 1991).

Reality (i.e., perfection) in Leibniz's view is not the sort of thing that something either has or does not have. It is not an all-or-nothing matter. Rather, perfection is scalar—it comes in varying degrees. God has infinite perfection, the maximum amount, because He is limitless (PE, “Monadology,” §41). Every existent other than God, including the universe, possesses a limited degree of perfection. “For,” as Leibniz explains, “God could not give the creature all without making of it a God; therefore there must needs be different degrees in the perfection of things, and limitations also of every kind” (T §31, p. 142). Because nothing but God is infinite, everything else exhibits metaphysical perfection in varying, limited degrees.

Since everything but God exhibits a finite level of perfection, everything but God also exhibits a degree of imperfection, some privation of reality. Privation of reality necessarily belongs to creation in the sense that it is logically impossible for a created thing to be unlimited (PE, “Principles of Nature and Grace, Based on Reason,” §9; T §20, p. 135). Only that whose existence is absolutely necessary and therefore depends on nothing other than itself has infinite perfection. For Leibniz, metaphysical evil is the privation of reality inherent in the natures of created things (T §21, p. 136) (for further reading on Leibniz's conception of metaphysical evil, see Latzer 1994 and Antognazza 2014).

In a letter in which he replies to an inquiry by the philosopher Christian Wolff (1679–1754) about the concept of perfection, Leibniz gives the following analysis:

Perfection is the harmony of things, or the state where everything is worthy of being observed, that is, the state of agreement [consensus] or identity in variety; you can even say that it is the degree of contemplatibility [considerabilitas] (PE, 18 May 1715, p. 233–4).

This indicates that there are in a sense two aspects of metaphysical perfection. First, metaphysical perfection is constituted by harmony, that is, unity in variety. A situation is harmonious to the extent that a variety of things are ordered in accordance with general laws or principles, such as laws of motion governing terrestrial and celestial objects (PE, “Principles of Nature and Grace, Based on Reason,” §11). Second, that which possesses a degree of metaphysical perfection in the sense of harmony can also be said to be worthy of observation to some extent. If there were nothing ordered in accordance with general laws, there would be nothing worthy of observation because everything would be submerged in chaos. Thus harmony makes something contemplatible, like a painting by the Italian Renaissance artist Raphael (PW, “Codex Iuris Gentium,” p. 171).

Leibniz's ethics is therefore perfectionist in two distinct but related senses. On the one hand, the metaphysical good consists in the reality of a thing, its degree of metaphysical perfection, which is identical to its harmony. This may be called metaphysical perfectionism. On the other hand, Leibniz maintains that moral goodness involves the development and perfection of a characteristic or set of characteristics fundamental to human nature. Such a characteristic in a cultivated state is called a virtue. This is moral perfectionism. For Leibniz, metaphysical perfection is a necessary condition for moral perfection in that intellectual apprehension of harmony gives rise to moral perfection.

To see how he arrives at this position, it is necessary to return to the other two types of goodness: the moral good and the physical good. “Virtue,” according to Leibniz, “is the habit of acting according to wisdom” (PW, “Felicity,” §1, p. 83). Yet one virtue in particular reigns supreme and contains all the others, and that virtue is justice, which Leibniz defines as the “charity of the wise man” (PW, “Codex Iuris Gentium,” p. 171; cf. PW, p. 57 & p. 83). One whose love is guided by wisdom possesses the charity of the wise. Love is the pleasure one takes in the happiness and perfection of others (PW, “Felicity,” §5; NE, p. 163). God's wisdom is infinite and His love is universal, extending to all beings capable of happiness. God's universal benevolence, Leibniz suggests, is an ideal we ought to do our best to imitate and continuously aspire to (PW, “Meditation on the Common Concept of Justice”, pp. 57–8; cf. PE, “Principles of Nature and Grace, Based on Reason,” §14, pp. 211–12). The more one's benevolence expands to encompass the happiness of more and more others, the more one grows in justice and virtue, thereby increasing in moral goodness (for further reading on Leibniz's view of justice as the charity of the wise, see Riley 1996 (Chapter 4) and 2003).

The physical good thus bridges the moral good with the metaphysical good. It links virtue and harmony because, for Leibniz, pleasure is the perception or knowledge of perfection. Pain, on the other hand, is the perception or knowledge of imperfection (NE, p. 194; PW, “Felicity,” §4). A sensual pleasure, such as the pleasure of listening to music or that of viewing a painting, is a confused perception of perfection (i.e., a confused perception of harmony). In contrast, an intellectual pleasure, such as the pleasure of knowing the fundamental order of reality, is a distinct perception of perfection. Sensual pleasures in some cases approximate intellectual pleasures, but they inevitably fall short because they tend to be deceptive and transitory, whereas intellectual pleasures are pure and lasting, and true happiness, according to Leibniz, is simply a lasting state of pleasure (PW, “Felicity,” §3; NE, p. 194).

Despite his identification of happiness with lasting pleasure, however, it is an oversimplification to characterize Leibniz's theory of the good as nothing more than a form of hedonism. Given that pleasure is a confused or distinct apprehension of harmony, knowledge serves as the necessary means by which an individual cultivates the moral good, the charity of the wise. Knowledge of the perfection of others, of the perfection of the universe, and of God, the perfect being, is inherently pleasurable and concomitantly contributes to the proper order of one's character by generating love in conformity with wisdom.

The harmony of the universe then is a precondition for virtue and happiness, but harmony alone is not sufficient. Knowledge is also necessary. If there were no minds, or if there were no minds capable of knowledge, the universe would be devoid of virtue and happiness. Thus knowledge unifies Leibniz's composite theory of the good. He says,

§15. One must hold as certain that the more a mind desires to know order, reason, the beauty of things which God has produced, and the more he is moved to imitate this order in the things which God has left to his direction, the happier he will be.

§16. It is most true, as a result, that one cannot know God without loving one's brother, that one cannot have wisdom without having charity (which is the real touchstone of virtue), and that one even advances one's own good in working for that of others…. (PW, “Felicity,” p. 84)

The intellectualist cast of Leibniz's ethics stands out unmistakably in this passage. Knowledge of the order, rationality, and beauty of creation is necessary for happiness. So too is actively imitating that order. Together, they are sufficient. Without knowledge, action and the effort to promote the perfection of others do not necessarily meet with success and may even backfire, leading to greater physical evil. Without actively promoting rational order, knowledge alone does not lead to happiness. Leibniz's ethics no doubt has an intellectualist character, but mere passive contemplation of the rational order of the universe is not the ideal of moral goodness. Instead, moral goodness combines knowledge of the rational order with the active promotion of rational order as far as possible (for a discussion of Leibniz's view of the role of divine grace in the attainment of salvation, see Rutherford 2014).

2. Natural Law Theory

So far we have seen that, for Leibniz, the human good consists in the lasting state of pleasure that accompanies moral perfection.  Moral perfection, in turn, is cultivated through the perpetual pursuit and acquisition of knowledge of the perfection of others, the universe, and God. Although all knowledge contributes to moral perfection and is therefore practical in a broad sense of the term, ethics nevertheless is a distinct branch of science, capable of the same level of demonstrative rigor as arithmetic and geometry (NE, Preface, p. 50; PW, “Meditation on the Common Concept of Justice,” pp. 49–50). Leibniz shares this view of ethics with other important seventeenth-century thinkers, such as Hobbes (1588–1679), Spinoza (1632–1677), and Locke (1632–1704). And although Leibniz never wrote a comprehensive ethical treatise in the geometrical style, it is clear from what he left us that, in addition to a naturalistic-metaphysical theory of the good, ethical science also includes a science of natural law.

As a natural law theorist, Leibniz holds that compliance with the set of universal ethical principles that make up the natural law is necessary and sufficient to achieve the good. Also, like the eminent modern natural lawyer Hugo Grotius (1583–1645), whom Leibniz greatly admired—referring to him as the “incomparable Grotius” (PW, “Opinion on the Principles of Pufendorf,” p. 65; T §6, p. 77), he believes that the natural law and the obligation to comply with it are independent of God's will. It is not possible, in other words, for God to have legislated a different set of moral absolutes than those that obtain; nor do the moral absolutes derive their obligatory authority from having been legislated by God. According to Leibniz,

Neither the norm of conduct itself, nor the essence of the just, depends on his [God's] free decision, but rather on eternal truths, objects of the divine intellect, which constitute, so to speak, the essence of divinity itself. . . . And, indeed, justice follows certain rules of equality and of proportion [which are] no less founded in the immutable nature of things, and in the divine ideas, than are the principles of arithmetic and of geometry (PW, “Opinion on the Principles of Pufendorf,” p. 71).

The concept of justice in Leibniz's view is fixed independent of God's choice, and so God has no more power to alter the nature of justice than He does to alter the nature of circularity.

The idea that justice and moral obligation do not depend on a free decree of God is a significant doctrine in Leibniz's philosophy. In the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, a focal point of debate in moral philosophy centered on a version of the Euthyphro problem—between those who sided with Grotius and Leibniz in holding that moral goodness and obligation do not depend on God's will and those who held the opposite view, that moral goodness and obligation are as they are as a result of God's free choice. Two of the most important seventeenth-century proponents of the latter, voluntarist position are Thomas Hobbes and Samuel Pufendorf (1632–1694). Leibniz's objections to voluntarism became widely known in the early eighteenth century when a letter he wrote attacking voluntarism was appended to a new edition of Pufendorf's The Duty of Man and Citizen (1718). This anti-voluntarist tract, “Opinion on the Principles of Pufendorf” (written in 1706), contains one of his fullest discussions of justice. A full treatment of Leibniz's anti-voluntarism would take us too far afield, but a central criticism is that, in regarding moral goodness and obligation as dependent on God's free choice, voluntarism undermines the basis for our love of God (PW, “Opinion on the Principles of Pufendorf,” p. 71–2). If, as the voluntarist holds, moral goodness is an artifact of God, it is not an essential attribute of the divine nature. God therefore cannot be loved for His goodness.  Voluntarism thus subverts morality and religion because love of God is essential to both (for more in depth discussions of Leibniz's anti-voluntarism, see Schneewind 1998 (250–259) and Haakonssen 1996 (46–9)).

Following a current in the natural law tradition, Leibniz supplements his account of justice as the charity of the wise with three principles handed down from Roman law via Justinian's Institutes (533 AD). The three principles are “to hurt no one” (neminem laedere), “to give each his due” (suum cuique tribuere), and “to live honorably” (honeste vivere) or, as Leibniz glosses it, to live piously. Leibniz suggests that these principles underwrite three distinct degrees of justice (PW, “Codex Iuris Gentium,” pp. 171–2). The lowest degree is “strict right” (ius strictum), which has as its precept that “no one is to be injured, so that he will not be given a motive for a legal action within the state, nor outside the state a right of war” (PW, “Codex Iuris Gentium,” p. 172). Strict right primarily includes a bare minimum set of negative duties, such as the duties not to harm, not to murder, and not to commit theft. The function of this degree of justice is the “conservation of peace.”  The second degree Leibniz calls “equity” or “charity” in the narrow sense of the term, which has its basis in the principle “to give each his due.”  This grade of justice includes, for example, duties of gratitude and of charitable donation, things we owe to others but which failure to fulfill is not sanctioned by law. Whereas strict right functions merely to avoid misery by fostering peace, the duties of equity actively promote the happiness of others as far as possible within this life.

Strict right and equity, he explains, correspond to Grotius’ distinction between perfect and imperfect rights (PW, “Codex Iuris Gentium,” p. 172). Unlike Grotius, however, Leibniz views this distinction as one of degree rather than as one of kind. Also, equity, the second grade of justice, comprehends strict right within its scope, and strict right and equity are comprehended under the third and highest grade of justice, namely, piety.

The principle of piety is “to live honorably.”  An important difference between strict right and equity, on the one hand, and piety, on the other, is that the former pertain to our pursuit of goods and avoidance of evils over the course of our natural lives while the latter pertains to our pursuit of goods and avoidance of evils throughout our entire lives, that is, over the whole course of our immortal existence. The third grade of justice thus relies on two central tenets of Leibniz's metaphysics, for which he believes there are demonstrative proofs; indeed, he believes he provides such proofs (PE, “Principles of Nature and Grace, Based on Reason,” §4, §8; PE, “Monadology,” §4, §38). The tenets on which this account relies are (1) that the soul is immortal and (2) that God is the ruler of the universe. Most relevant to our purpose are not the arguments he supplies in support of these but, rather, the work that the theses do in his account of piety.

A person is pious in Leibniz's sense of the term in virtue of being perfectly just, which means that the pious person loves others in conformity with wisdom. But it is extremely difficult to fully realize this ideal love so long as one's outlook is restricted to the goods and evils that may be encountered in one's natural life. If one's outlook is limited to this life, one may come to fulfill the first and second grades of justice without too much difficulty, but rarely does anyone achieve the highest level of justice without consideration of the soul's immortality and God's governance (PW, “Codex Iuris Gentium,” p. 173; PW, “Meditation on the Common Concept of Justice,” p. 58). This is because, even though the virtuous person's “interior harmony” is intrinsically pleasing, most are unable to appreciate virtue due to the fact that, from the perspective of mortality, virtuous actions often go unrewarded while vicious ones go unpunished. Thus most people will not bear tremendous hardships for the sake of virtue. Only the most exceptional individuals are willing to be virtuous and do the right thing at any mortal cost. And this very willingness, this “spiritual disposition” as Leibniz calls it, constitutes piety (PW, “Meditation on the Common Concept of Justice,” p. 58).

In the opening chapter of his dialogue between himself, represented by Theophilus, and a spokesperson for Locke, named Philalethes, Leibniz makes the following autobiographical remark:

You [Philalethes] had more to do with the speculative philosophers, while I was more inclined towards moral questions. But I have been learning, more and more, how greatly morality can be strengthened by the solid principles of true philosophy; which is why I have lately been studying them more intensively, and have started on some quite new trains of thought (NE, p. 71, emphasis added).

We are now in a position to see how specifically the solid principles of philosophy strengthen morality. True philosophy (i.e., sound metaphysics) aids morality by providing grounds for assurance that in the end happiness is directly proportioned to merit. The more virtuous one is, the greater the happiness one can expect because one's well-being does not completely depend on the goods of this life and because it is incompatible with God's universal benevolence and infinite wisdom that even a single virtuous deed should go unrewarded and a vicious one unpunished. “After this,” Leibniz concludes, “it must be imprudent not to be just, because no one will fail to derive good or evil from what he will have done, according as it is just or unjust” (PW, “Meditation on the Common Concept of Justice,” pp. 58–9). Even though exceptional individuals may be able to remain virtuous at any apparent mortal cost, it follows from Leibniz's metaphysics that there is in fact no mortal price to pay for being virtuous. On the contrary, virtue is necessary and sufficient for true happiness (for further reading on Leibniz's natural law theory, see Brown 1995 and 2011a).

3. Moral Psychology

Leibniz believes that enlightened self-interest is in complete agreement with the requirements of virtue. The cornerstone of this harmony between interest and morality is metaphysics, his doctrines concerning the soul's immortality and God's governance. Still, the virtuous person does not regard right action and the well-being of others as a means to his or her own happiness. According to Leibniz,

Thus he who acts well, not out of hope or fear, but by an inclination of his soul, is so far from not behaving justly that, on the contrary, he acts more justly than all others, imitating, in a certain way, as a man, divine justice. Whoever, indeed, does good out of love for God or of his neighbor, takes pleasure precisely in the action itself (such being the nature of love) and does not need any other incitement, or the command of a superior; for that man the saying that the law is not made for the just is valid (PW, “Opinion on the Principles of Pufendorf,” p. 72).

Not self-love but love of others motivates the virtuous person, or what Leibniz calls “disinterested love” (PW, “Codex Iuris Gentium,” p. 171). Metaphysics thus strengthens morality without overhauling it. In revealing that virtue alone ultimately satisfies self-interest, true philosophy guides us steadfastly along the path to virtue. Yet the truly virtuous person performs a morally right action for its own sake.

Disinterested love is not completely selfless however. Nor can it consistently be on Leibniz's view since he subscribes to a version of psychological egoism; “for we do all for our own good,” he maintains, “and it is impossible for us to have other feelings whatever we may say” (W, “Letter to Nicaise,” p. 565). In his account of disinterested love, Leibniz in fact seeks to reconcile egoism and altruism, and, in doing so, anticipates Bishop Butler's (1692–1752) landmark attack against psychological egoism (BM1, Fifteen Sermons (1726), pp. 364–373).

The key to Leibniz's reconciliation is a distinction between the pleasure involved in the satisfaction of a desire and the object of a desire. Desires spur all human actions. Some desires emerge distinctly in conscious awareness while many do not, or do so only confusedly. The former he calls volitions and the latter appetitions (NE, p. 173). Satisfaction of any desire gives its subject at least a minimal degree of pleasure, however fleeting. An unfulfilled volition causes at a minimum enough suffering for one to be aware of it, but an unfulfilled appetition, by contrast, gives rise to “semi-suffering,” or what he calls, following Locke, “uneasiness” (NE, p. 188–9). Such semi-suffering, Leibniz explains, “does not amount to discomfort, but is restricted to the elements or rudiments of suffering, which we cannot be aware of in themselves but which suffice to act as spurs and to stimulate the will” (NE, p. 189). No finite being is ever totally free of semi-sufferings and, to a lesser degree, semi-pleasures. Even where we appear to ourselves to be completely indifferent about our options, unconscious desires move us toward one course of action rather than another (NE, p. 188).

Every desire inclines one to joy, its immediate satisfaction and the transitory pleasure arising therefrom. Moreover, Leibniz takes it as axiomatic that no one pursues anything but what appears to him or her to be the greatest good (NE, p. 185; T §45, p. 148). Failure to be virtuous and achieve happiness is therefore a consequence of ignorance, error, or inattention to what one knows. Inattention results from a lapse in the ability to call to mind the knowledge one possesses, and this, according to Leibniz, accounts for the puzzling psychological phenomenon known as weakness of will  (NE, pp. 186–187). Weakness of will, it turns out, is a type of forgetfulness. As such, an individual has some control over it, albeit indirectly. Upbringing and education certainly affect an individual's ability to bring specific thoughts to mind, but steps may be taken to ensure that certain considerations rather than others occur to one in practical deliberation (NE, p. 187 & pp. 195–196). For example, Leibniz counsels,

Thus when a man is in a good frame of mind he ought to make himself laws and rules for the future, and then carry them out strictly, drawing himself away–abruptly or gradually, depending on the nature of the case–from situations which are capable of corrupting him. A lover will be cured by a voyage undertaken just for that purpose; a period of seclusion will stop us from keeping company with people who confirm some bad disposition in us. (NE, p. 187)

Advance preparation is the key to strength of will. An individual needs to equip him- or herself with principles and appropriate habits of thought in order to make correct choices in pressure situations. Otherwise, he or she is merely an instrument of conscious and unconscious inclinations (for a discussion of Leibniz's view of practical rationality see Roinila 2008).

Recall that true happiness is a lasting state of pleasure. The most direct route to happiness, as commonsense testifies, is not through the gratification of every desire that happens to occur to one. Volitions and appetitions must be moderated by experience and reason (NE, p. 189). Experience and reason teach us to neglect or postpone fulfillment of some desires so that others may be fulfilled instead, the most valuable among them being those that reason gives us (NE, p. 194–5). Reason generates inclinations whose strength and objects are distinct, as opposed to bodily inclinations whose strength and objects are confused. The confusion inherent in bodily inclinations makes their fulfillment considerably more problematic than that of rational inclinations. The bodily desire for nourishment, for example, may be satisfied by eating a piece of fruit, but, as Leibniz points out, “a fruit with a good taste and a good odor can conceal a poison” (PW, “Felicity,” §6a, p. 83). Fulfillment of confused bodily inclinations may, and too often does, lead to pain and suffering further on. Such however is not the case with rational inclinations. Distinct knowledge, which is a distinct perception of harmony, satisfies the distinct inclinations of reason. And since the universe is maximally harmonious, there is no end to the pleasure we can derive from the acquisition of distinct knowledge.

All desires, no matter how confused or distinct, incline one toward the pleasure one takes in their satisfaction. Leibniz then can be understood as subscribing to psychological egoism where by this is meant that a person does all to satisfy one or more of his or her own inclinations. But it does not follow that all inclinations are alike—that, say, all of one's desires have one's own pleasure as their object. This is where the egoist goes wrong and where Leibniz finds room for accommodating both egoism and altruism.  What all actions have in common is that they are spurred by an inclination of the agent, the satisfaction of which gives him or her pleasure. But the same type of object does not satisfy all inclinations alike. For Leibniz, some inclinations have confused sensible objects, such as the sweetness of fruit, the melody of a song, or the beauty of a painting. Others have distinct intellectual objects, such as the perfection of God, of the natural world, or of another human being. A sweet piece of fruit cannot satisfy a desire for perfection in the natural world any more than a distinct perception of harmony in the natural world can satisfy a bodily desire for nourishment. Different inclinations concern different objects.

To be inclined toward the perfection of another rational being is to be disposed to take pleasure in their perfection. Notice however that the object of the inclination, that which one's view is fixed on, is not one's own pleasure. This does not mean that an individual's own pleasure cannot be the object of one of his or her desires. For most, self-love may be their predominant motive. Nevertheless, an individual can have an other-directed desire for the perfection of another rational being, which is to have disinterested love. To love disinterestedly, Leibniz explains, is to be “disposed to take pleasure in the perfection, well-being or happiness of the object of one's love. And this involves not thinking about or asking for any pleasure of one's own except what one can get from the happiness or pleasure of the loved one” (NE, p. 163). Since happiness is the outward manifestation of perfection, it makes no real difference whether love is said to have the perfection or the happiness of another rational being as its object. Leibniz thus makes the insightful suggestion that, though we do everything we do out of an inclination whose satisfaction gives us pleasure, this is perfectly compatible with desiring the perfection of another without any other end in view, which actually occurs whenever the object of our desire is another's perfection or happiness. “In truth,” Leibniz concludes, “the happiness of those whose happiness pleases us turns into our own happiness, since things which please us are desired for their own sake” (PW, “Codex Iuris Gentium,” p. 171) (for further reading on Leibniz's conception of disinterested love, see Brown 2011b).

Genuine altruism, then, does not require complete selflessness. Indeed, selflessness, even if it were possible, would not be desirable (W, “Letter to Nicaise,” p. 566). After all, according to Leibniz,

One cannot envisage in God any other motive than that of perfection, or, if you like, of his pleasure; supposing (according to my definition) that pleasure is nothing but a feeling of perfection, he has nothing to consider outside himself; on the contrary everything depends on him. But his goodness would not be supreme, if he did not aim at the good and at perfection so far as is possible. But what will one say, if I show that this same motive has a place in truly virtuous and generous men, whose supreme function [degré] is to imitate divinity, in so far as human nature is capable of it? (PW, “Meditation on the Common Concept of Justice,” pp. 57–8).

Imitate divinity—this is the overarching imperative of Leibniz's ethics, if not the guiding principle of his entire philosophical system. For him, God, not humanity, is the “measure of all things” (PW, “Opinion on the Principles of Pufendorf,” p. 69). Our chief task therefore is to make perpetual progress toward the ideal of divine nature, for each of us is like a little divinity in the City of God (PE, “Monadology,” §83 & §85, pp. 223–4; T §147, pp. 215–216).


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