Supplement to David Lewis’s Metaphysics

Counterpart-theoretic Semantics for Quantified Modal Logic

Lewis’s original proposal

Lewis (1968) proposes a translation from the language of quantified modal logic into an extensional first-order language with quantifiers ranging over possible worlds and possible individuals. Like the “standard translation” for Kripke semantics (van Benthem 1983), Lewis’s translation implicitly defines a semantics for quantified modal logic.

The eight postulates of Lewis (1968) can be seen as defining a concept of a model. As usual, a model contains some worlds and some individuals. Every world is associated with a domain of individuals which are “in” the world. According to Lewis’s second postulate, no individual is “in” more than one world; so different worlds have disjoint domains. Like in Kripke semantics, the worlds may be related by an accessibility relation. In addition, individuals may be related by a counterpart relation. Lewis’s sixth postulate says that this relation is reflexive. According to his fifth postulate, nothing is a counterpart of anything else in its world. (This assumption is dropped in Lewis 1986e, 232.) Lewis also identifies a designated “actual” world, relative to which non-modal sentences are interpreted.

In the semantics induced by Lewis's translation rules, formulas of quantified modal logic are true relative to a world and an assignment function. The interpretation of atomic sentences and boolean connectives is standard, except that disjointness of domains allows interpreting predicates in terms of sets of tuples of individuals, with no world-relativity. Quantifiers are given an “actualist” interpretation, so they range only over individuals in the relevant world. The key novelty is the interpretation of the modal operators:

\(\Box \phi\) is true relative to a world \(w\) and assignment \(g\) iff \(\phi\) is true relative to every world \(w^\prime\) accessible from \(w\) and every assignment \(g^\prime\) such that \(g^\prime(x)\) is a counterpart of \(g(x)\) for each variable \(x\) that is free in \(\phi\).

\(\Diamond \phi\) is the dual of \(\Box \phi\).

A few preliminary comments:

  1. The requirement of disjoint domains could easily be dropped by making the interpretation of predicates world-relative and assuming that the counterpart relation links world-individual pairs. This would not affect the logic.

  2. If we further assume that the counterpart relation is an equivalence relation and that it relates every individual at any world to exactly one individual at every other world, then the resulting semantics is equivalent to constant-domain Kripke semantics. (See e.g., Hughes & Cresswell 1996, 354f.)

  3. Lewis assumes that the language of quantified modal logic does not have names or function symbols. He suggests that English names should be analysed as wide-scope Russellian descriptions (Lewis 1968, 120f.). To simplify the following discussion, we will assume that there are names ‘\(a\)’ and ‘\(b\)’ that semantically behave like free variables, insofar as their reference is shifted by the modal operators. See Ghilardi & Meloni (1991) for how to add function symbols, and Schurz (1997), Fitting (2004), Kracht & Kutz (2005) among others, for alternative treatments of names in counterpart semantics.

  4. Since quantifiers are actualist, the interpretation of closed formulas only requires interpreting formulas relative to a world \(w\) and assignment \(g\) that maps every variable to an individual in \(w\). Accordingly, we will assume that the names ‘a’ and ‘b’ (initially) pick out individuals in the actual world. See Forbes (1985), Kracht & Kutz (2005), Kracht & Kutz (2007), Kupffer (2010), among others, for counterpart semantics for a language with “possibilist” quantifiers.

  5. Lewis’s original semantics does not allow associating different counterpart relations with different terms. In Lewis (1971, 209) he says that he does not know how to allow for this in a formal semantics, because it is not clear how the relevant counterpart relations are determined. See Ramachandran (1998), Fara (2012), Schwarz (2014), Kocurek (2018), among others, for relevant proposals.

  6. Lewis’s original semantics also does not allow imposing constraints on the choice of counterparts for formulas that are “multiply de re” (see Hazen 1979, 328f.; Lewis 1983d, 44f.). To get around this, one can assume that the counterpart relation relates not individuals, but sequences of individuals (roughly as in Lewis 1983d). Alternatively, one can replace the single counterpart relation by a set of counterpart relations (see below, section 4).


It is often suggested that Lewis’s semantics gives rise to a deviant and unmanageable logic. Here is a sample of non-standard features.

F1. Familiar principles of S5 modal logic such as \(\Box A \rightarrow \Box \Box A\) or \(\Diamond A \rightarrow \Box \Diamond A\) are invalid, even if the accessibility relation is universal. (See e.g., Lewis 1968; Forbes 1982, Cresswell 2004.)

F2. The “Necessity of Identity” \(\Box \forall x \forall y (x=y \rightarrow \Box x=y)\) and the “Necessity of Distinctness” \(\Box \forall x \forall y (x \neq y \rightarrow \Box x \neq y)\) are invalid. (See e.g., Hazen 1979; Ramachandran 2008.)

F3. The “Necessity of Existence” \(\forall y \Box \exists x (x=y)\) and the Converse Barcan Formula \(\Box \forall x A \rightarrow \forall x \Box A\) are valid. (See e.g., Lewis 1968; Forbes 1982.)

F4. Modal contexts are not closed under logical consequence. For example, \(\Box (A \land B) \rightarrow \Box A\) is invalid, and so is \(\Box (A \rightarrow B) \rightarrow (\Box A \rightarrow \Box B)\) or \(\Box Rab \rightarrow \Box \exists x Rax\). (See e.g., Hazen 1979, Woollaston 1994.)

F5. Familiar substitution rules of first-order logic appear to be invalid. For example, \(\forall x \Diamond x \neq a\) does not entail \(\Diamond a \neq a\). (See e.g., Kripke 1980, fn 13; Woollaston 1994.)

F6. If the language of quantified modal logic is extended by an ‘actually’ operator, we seem to get a deviant logic for the extended language. (See e.g., Hazen 1979; Fara & Williamson 2005.)

It will be useful to look at these issues in terms of their causes. F1 arises from the assumption that the counterpart relation is not an equivalence relation. F2, F5, and F6 arise from the possibility of non-functional and non-injective counterpart relations. F3, F4, and other aspects of F6 arise from the possibility that an individual may lack a counterpart at some accessible world.

As we will see, in each case one can argue that the non-standard feature should be embraced, but one can also adjust the semantics so as to block the feature.


In propositional modal logic, there is a well-known correspondence between modal schemas and properties of the accessibility relation: \(\Box A \rightarrow \Box \Box A\) is valid on a relational frame iff the accessibility relation is transitive; \(A \rightarrow \Box \Diamond A\) is valid iff the relation is symmetric; and so on. In Lewis’s semantics, these results do not carry over to quantified modal logic. For example, \(\Box A \rightarrow \Box \Box A\) can be invalid even though the accessibility relation is transitive, provided that the counterpart relation is intransitive.

In the main entry, we mentioned that this might be seen as an advantage of counterpart semantics, since it allows for a resolution of puzzles like the Chisholm-Chandler paradox, where we seem to have an intuitive counterexample to \(\Box A \rightarrow \Box \Box A\). Counterpart semantics promises to vindicate the intuition without assuming that metaphysical accessibility is not an equivalence relation.

If one wants \(\Box A \rightarrow \Box \Box A\) to be valid for metaphysical modality (despite apparent counterexamples), one can simply assume that the counterpart relation for this application is transitive. Lewis himself rejected transitivity, but he was open to the idea that the metaphysical counterparthood relation is symmetric (see Beebee & Fisher 2020, Volume 1, Letter 137).

Reasoning about metaphysical modality is not the only application of modal logic. Counterpart semantics has found applications in many other areas, from temporal logic (e.g., Sider 1996) to epistemic logic (e.g., van Rooij 2006) to algebraic topology (e.g., Braüner & Ghilardi 2007). Different applications might call for different logics. Relational semantics for propositional modal logic is popular in part because it allows defining a wide range of logics by putting restrictions on the accessibility relation. Counterpart semantics similarly allows defining a wider range of logics by putting joint constraints on accessibility and counterparthood.

Multiple counterparts and common counterparts

Lewis’s semantics allows for cases in which an individual has several counterparts at an accessible world, and for cases in which several individuals have a common counterpart at a world. This has some noteworthy consequences.

For one thing, the “Necessity of Identity” and the “Necessity of Distinctness” become invalid. Informally, if ‘\(a\)’ and ‘\(b\)’ pick out an individual with two counterparts at some accessible world, then \(\Box a = a\) is true, because every counterpart of \(a\) at every accessible world is identical to itself, but \(\Box a = b\) is false, because not every counterpart of \(a\) is identical to every counterpart of \(b\).

Multiple counterparts create a special challenge if the modal language is extended by operators that shift the point of evaluation to a single world, such as nominals, Stalnaker-type counterfactuals, or an ‘actually’ operator (\(\mathsf{ACT}\)). Suppose some possible individual has two counterparts in the actual world, one of which satisfies \(\phi(x)\) and the other does not. Should we regard \(\Diamond \exists x \mathsf{ACT} \ \phi(x)\) as true or false? The first answer renders \(\Diamond \exists x (\mathsf{ACT} \ Fx \land \mathsf{ACT} \ \neg Fx)\) satisfiable; the second \(\Diamond \exists x (\neg \mathsf{ACT} \ Fx \land \neg \mathsf{ACT} \ \neg Fx)\). Some intuit that both answers are problematic. (See e.g., Hazen 1979; Fara & Williamson 2005.)

It has also been suggested that allowing for multiple counterparts invalidates familiar rules and axioms of classical predicate logic. For example, since \(\Box a = a\) and \(a=b\) do not entail \(\Box a = b\), “Leibniz’s Law” seems to become invalid. The same is true for Universal Instantiation. For example, \(\forall x \Diamond (x \neq a)\) does not entail \(\Diamond a \neq a\). (See e.g., Kripke 1980, fn.13; Woollaston 1994, 259; Cresswell 2004, 35.) Since Leibniz’s Law and Universal Instantiation remain valid for non-modal formulas, Lewis’s logic also appears to violate closure under second-order substitution. (See Bauer & Wansing 2002).

Lewis (1983d) rejects the charge that his semantics invalidates rules of classical logic. Universal Instantiation and Leibniz’s Law both involve substitution of terms, and Lewis points out that such rules always require a proviso to deal with the possibility of “capturing”. In classical predicate logic, for example, \(x=y \rightarrow (\exists y (x \neq y) \rightarrow \exists y (y \neq y))\) is not a proper instance of Leibniz’ Law, because the variable ‘\(y\)’ gets captured by the quantifier ‘\(\exists y\)’. In Lewis’s semantics, modal operators function as unselective binders, capturing all variables in their scope. We should therefore not be surprised that substitution rules have to be restricted. Schwarz (2012, 17f.) defines a general restriction, analogous to the condition that a variable must be “free for” another variable in classical predicate logic. A popular alternative in counterpart semantics is to introduce special syntactic machinery such as \(\lambda\)-abstraction that allows distinguishing between de re readings and de dicto readings. Substitution is then allowed only in de re contexts, and the \(\lambda\)-conversion rules are restricted (see Ghilardi & Meloni 1988; Corsi 2002; and Schwarz 2013 (Other Internet Resources) for details).

The fact still remains that allowing for multiple (and common) counterparts renders many rules and sentences invalid that are valid in Kripke semantics. Like in the previous section, we can distinguish two kinds of response. One is to embrace the deviance, another is to block it.

Along the first line, one might argue that allowing for contingent identity and distinctness is useful to defuse philosophical puzzles. Relevant puzzles would not include the putative identity between persons and bodies or statues and pieces of clay. In Lewis’s semantics, \(a=b \rightarrow (\Diamond Fa \rightarrow \Diamond Fb)\) is valid, so we can’t account for identical things that appear to have different modal properties. Here we would need models with different counterpart relations (see comment 5 in section 1), so that we could have worlds where someone’s person counterpart is not identical to their body counterpart. Contingent identity in Lewis’s original semantics instead involves multiple counterparts relative to the same counterpart relation.

As mentioned in the main entry, relevant puzzles for this kind of multiple counterparthood might be cases of fission, fusion, or time-travel in the temporal dimension, and cases of possible fission, fusion, or time-travel in the modal dimension. Schwarz (2012) argues that such cases also call for a deviant logic of actually. (See also Stalnaker 1986, 136f.)

Further motivation for Lewis’s non-standard treatment of substitution comes from applications of modal logic outside metaphysics. Ninan (2018) invokes multiple counterparts to explain certain puzzles about epistemic modality. Braüner & Ghilardi (2007, 599–607, 614f.) present a range of mathematical applications that seem to call for a logic with the Lewisian restrictions on substitution.

For some application, one might still prefer a more orthodox logic of quantification, identity, and actuality. This can be achieved in several ways.

One obvious move is to simply restrict the relevant models to ones in which the counterpart relation is functional and/or injective (see e.g., Torza 2011).

This may appear to be at odds with Lewis’s assumption that counterparthood is a matter of qualitative similarity. In a world of two-way eternal recurrence, for example, the individuals in any epoch are perfect qualitative duplicates of individuals in every other epoch; a qualitative counterpart relation can then hardly select exactly one of the individuals as, say, Joe Biden’s counterpart.

However, every Lewisian counterpart relation \(C\) can be unravelled into a set \(F\) of functional and injective counterpart relations: if \(x\) at \(w\) has two counterparts \(y\) and \(y^\prime\) at \(v\), then one of the unravelled relations will link \(x\) with \(y\), another will link \(x\) with \(y^\prime\). We can easily adjust Lewis’s semantics to quantify over the unravelled relations:

\(\Box \phi\) is true relative to \(w,g\) iff \(\phi\) is true relative to every world \(w^\prime\) accessible from \(w\) and every assignment \(g^\prime\) such that for every \(f \in F\) and every variable \(x\) that is free in \(phi\), \(g^\prime(x)\) stands in \(f\) to \(g(x)\).

This kind of functional counterpart semantics was first introduced in Hazen (1977) and Hazen (1979), and has been explored in different forms by many authors; see e.g., Ghilardi (1991), Stalnaker (1994), Stalnaker (2012) (ch.3 and p154ff.), Sider (2008, Other Internet Resources), Kupffer (2010), Russell (2013), Bacon (2014).

The triple quantification in the clause for the box (over worlds, counterparts, and unravelled counterpart relations) may initially seem ad hoc, but it can be given independent motivation.

For one, it allows putting restrictions on the choice of counterparts for “multiply de re” sentences. Suppose we judge that Elizabeth II is necessarily the daughter of George VI, even though both have many counterparts in a world of eternal recurrence, so that not every counterpart of Elizabeth is the daughter of every counterpart of George. On the functional approach, we can restrict the set of counterpart relations \(F\) so that all its members link Elizabeth to an Elizabeth counterpart who is the daughter of the George counterpart linked to George. (In that case, \(F\) is no longer construed by unravelling a simple Lewisian counterpart relation.)

The functional approach can also be motivated by Lewis’s (1986e, 231f.) distinction between possible worlds and “individual possibilities”. Intuitively, a world of eternal recurrence represents one possibility for the world, but many possibilities for us. In general, if a world contains multiple counterparts of a given individual, then the world might be regarded as multiple possibilities for that individual, one for each counterpart. Likewise, a possibility for n individuals might be represented as a pair of a possible world and n (suitably coordinated) counterparts of the original individuals at the world. In a functional model, each unraveled counterpart relation selects a unique counterpart for every individual at every accessible world. By quantifying over both worlds and unraveled counterpart relations, the revised clause for the box effectively quantifies over all relevant individual possibilities.

Surprisingly, the extra layer of quantification (over counterpart relations) has also proved useful in mathematical logic.

A well-known limitation of Kripke semantics for quantified modal logic is that many important systems of propositional modal logic become incomplete when quantifiers are added. For example, Ghilardi (1991) proves—with the help of functional counterpart semantics—that every quantified system in between S4.3 and S5 is incomplete with respect to (variable-domain) Kripke semantics. (With constant domains, things are even worse; see e.g., Hughes & Cresswell 1996, 265–71.) In Ghilardi (1992), Ghilardi shows that this problem disappears in functional counterpart semantics, where the quantified extension of every canonical propositional modal logic above S4 is complete.

This formal advantage of counterpart semantics requires multiple counterpart relations (see Kracht & Kutz 2005, sec.7), but it does not require the relations to be functional and injective. Ghilardi’s result trivially generalises to a semantics with multiple, possibly non-functional, counterpart relations. See Kutz (2000), Kracht & Kutz (2002), Kracht & Kutz (2005), and Schwarz (2013, Other Internet Resources) for investigations into this kind of semantics.

Missing counterparts

Lewis does not assume that every individual has a counterpart at every world. This is meant to capture the intuition that most of us could have failed to exist. Oddly, however, \(\forall x \Box \exists y (x=y)\) comes out valid by Lewis’s translation rules, and so does the Converse Barcan Formula \(\Box \forall x A \rightarrow \forall x \Box A\). What becomes invalid instead are some basic principles of normal propositional modal logic. For example, \(\Box (Fa \land Gb)\) does not entail \(\Box Fa\).

Here is why. In Lewis’s semantics, \(\Box Fa\) is true iff all counterparts of \(a\) at all worlds are \(F\); equivalently: iff at all worlds where \(a\) has a counterpart, all these counterparts are \(F\). Similarly, \(\Box (Fa \land Gb)\) is true iff at all worlds where \(a\) and \(b\) both have counterparts, all the \(a\)-counterparts are \(F\) and all the \(b\)-counterparts \(G\). If \(a\) has non-\(F\) counterparts, but only in worlds where \(b\) has no counterparts, then \(\Box (Fa \land Gb)\) is true while \(\Box Fa\) is false.

We can also see why \(\forall x \Box \exists y (x=y)\) is valid. \(\Box \exists y (x=y)\) is true iff at every world where \(x\) has a counterpart, all these counterparts are identical to something.

As Hazen (1979, 327f.) notes, these results are the consequence of a semantic choice that is independent of questions about trans-world identity. Kripke (1971, 137) distinguished two readings of a statement like ‘Joe Biden is necessarily human’. On its “weak” reading, the statement expresses that Biden is human at all worlds at which he exists. On its “strong” reading, the sentence expresses that Biden is human at all worlds whatsoever. Lewis adopts the weak reading. He assumes that \(\Box Hb\) is meant to formalise the hypothesis that it is “necessary for Biden” that he is human, meaning that he is human at all worlds where he exists (in the sense of having a counterpart).

On the weak reading of the box, the validity of \(\forall x \Box \exists y (x=y)\) and the Converse Barcan Formula should be unsurprising. The formulas do not express that everything exists at all accessible worlds. (This rather corresponds to \(\exists x \Box \phi \rightarrow \Box \exists x \phi\); see Ghilardi & Meloni 1988.) It should also be unsurprising that \(\Box (Fa \land Gb) \rightarrow \Box Fa\) becomes invalid, unless we assume that everything exists at (or has a counterpart at) all accessible worlds. We would get the same non-standard logic if we tracked individuals by identity rather than by the counterpart relation.

Lewis acknowledged the problem raised by the validity of \(\forall x \Box \exists y (x=y)\). He agreed that a sentence like ‘Joe Biden necessarily exists’ is intuitively false. But he saw no systematic way of getting \(\Box Hb\) to be true while \(\Box \exists x (x=b)\) is false (Lewis (1986e): 11-13). This is one of the considerations that led him to conclude that English modal sentences can’t be adequately translated into the standard language of quantified modal logic.

There are further reasons to doubt that the language of quantified modal logic is adequate to formalise claims about individual possibility (or weak necessity). For example, we might intuit that George VI could have existed without having any children, while Queen Elizabeth II could not have existed without having George VI as her father. That is, we might want to say that it is necessary for Elizabeth that she is the daughter of George, although it is not necessary for George that Elizabeth is his daughter: \(\Box Fab\) should be true relative to \(a\) but not relative to \(b\). The standard language of quantified modal logic does not allow drawing this distinction (compare Hunter & Seager 1981, 74f.). Similarly, there is no natural way to say that it is jointly necessary for Elizabeth and George that George has a daughter.

These considerations suggest that if we want to adopt Lewis’s preferred reading of de re modal statements, we should adjust the syntax of quantified modal logic. Corsi (2007) introduces special boxes and diamonds that can bind singular terms. Ghilardi & Meloni (1988), Ghilardi & Meloni (1991), and Ghilardi (2001) instead follow a long-standing tradition in categorical logic of using a typed language. The properly typed versions of all K-schemas then become valid. Informally, if \(Fa \land Fb\) is necessary for \(a\) and \(b\), then \(Fa\) is also necessary for \(a\) and \(b\).

Braüner & Ghilardi (2007) present a complete axiomatisation of Lewis’s semantics for a typed language, along with some mathematical applications. One interesting aspect of this framework is that some logical principles that are connected in Kripke semantics become independent in counterpart semantics. For example, making both accessibility and counterparthood an equivalence relation results in a logic that validates (typed versions of) all the S5 schemas, but fails to validate the Barcan Formula (see Ghilardi 2001, 105ff.).

An advantage of reading the box as weak necessity is that we don’t need to think about how a formula should be interpreted relative to a world if one of its terms does not pick out any individual in that world (see comment 4 in section 1). However, the issue must still be faced if an ‘actually’ operator is added to the language. The ‘actually’ operator is supposed to shift the point of evaluation back to the actual world, irrespective of whether the relevant individuals exist here; so we have to explain how to interpret \(\mathsf{ACT} \ \phi(x)\) if the value of \(x\) has no counterpart in the actual world (see e.g., Fara & Williamson 2005).

From a technical perspective, an easy way to avoid all complications arising from missing counterparts is to stipulate that—perhaps for certain applications—every individual at every world has a counterpart at every world. This move resembles assuming constant domains in Kripke semantics. It makes the “weak” reading of the box equivalent to the “strong” reading. Like in Kripke semantics, the assumption simplifies the logic, but may be regarded as philosophically problematic. To avoid rendering \(\forall x \Box \exists y (x=y)\) valid, one may add that the quantifiers only range over some of the individuals at the relevant world, distinguishing between an “inner” and an “outer domain” (see e.g., Forbes 1982; Forbes 1985; Kracht & Kutz 2002; Varzi 2020).

One can also replace Lewis’s weak reading of the box by a strong reading without assuming that everything has a counterpart at every world. Instead, one can assume that when modal operators shift the point of evaluation to another world, then the relevant terms either pick out a counterpart of their previous referent at that world, or they become empty. One then has a range of familiar options from free logic for how to interpret formulas with empty terms. (See e.g., Stalnaker 1994 and Schwarz 2012; also Ramachandran 1989 for a related approach.)

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