Supplement to David Lewis’s Metaphysics

The Natural/Non-Natural Distinction

Lewis’s “New Work for a Theory of Universals” (1983b) contains by far his most extensive treatment of both the nature of and need for a distinction between perfectly natural properties and relations, and less-than-perfectly natural properties and relations. Presupposing his realism about possible worlds, Lewis argues that for any set of actual and possible objects (fundamental or not), there is a property, namely the property an object has just in case it is a member of the given set. Likewise, for any set of ordered pairs of actual and possible objects, there is a two-place relation; and so on. (Note that since the objects can themselves be sets, the position automatically makes room for higher-order properties and relations.) In fact, he goes further, taking properties and relations simply to be such sets.

This position is roughly analogous to the position that to every predicate, no matter how oddly defined, there corresponds a property or relation; and likewise to the position that to every method we might conceive of for classifying objects (or object-tuples), no matter how unprincipled, arbitrary, and gerrymandered, there corresponds a property (or relation). The analogy breaks down only because our linguistic devices and conceptual resources are far too limited to encompass all the classifications (i.e., sets of possibilia) there are. (And also because some of our predicates are logically pathological, so that there is no such thing as the set of possibilia that satisfy them. Consider the old standby, “— is a set that is not a member of itself”.) Properties and relations, on this conception, are abundant—to put it mildly.

Lewis argues that properties and relations, on this abundant conception, are well-suited to play the roles of semantic values in formal linguistics, and contents for mental states. But even if he is right, it would be a mistake to see him as offering here an argument for believing in the sorts of things that, on the abundant conception, are to be called “properties” and “relations”. It’s not that he’s averse to arguing that we should believe in X’s because doing so will make our theoretical lives easier. It’s rather that his realism about possible worlds, combined with his realism about set theory, makes it inevitable that he is committed to the existence of these entities. The issue for him is a rather more modest one: he already believes in certain entities, which he finds, happily enough, will do a certain sort of theoretical work for him; given the work in question, he finds it appropriate to call these entities “properties” and “relations”. Observe that matters are quite otherwise for those metaphysicians who don’t believe in Lewis’s possible worlds; endorsing the abundant conception will, for such a philosopher, likely require carving out room in her ontology for them. (See Plantinga 1976 for an example of one who makes use of the abundant conception against a quite different ontological background from Lewis’s.)

Now for the crucial point: the central argument of “New Work” is that the abundant conception is badly inadequate, for a wide range of theoretical tasks for which properties and relations are needed. To cite two of the most obvious, suppose we wish to say that an object changes over a given time interval just in case it either gains or loses a property in that interval; or that two objects are similar to the extent that they share properties. Equipped only with the abundant conception, we will be left with the trivializing conclusions that everything always (and necessarily) changes, and that any two objects are just as similar as any other two. That seems wrong: it seems, by contrast, that these accounts of change and of similarity must presuppose a much more discriminating conception of what counts, in the relevant sense, as a property. Lewis’s statement of the point is characteristically elegant:

Because properties are so abundant, they are undiscriminating. Any two things share infinitely many properties, and fail to share infinitely many others. That is so whether the two things are perfect duplicates or utterly dissimilar. Thus properties do nothing to capture facts of resemblance. …Likewise, properties do nothing to capture the causal powers of things. Almost all properties are causally irrelevant, and there is nothing to make the relevant ones stand out from the crowd. Properties carve reality at the joints—and everywhere else as well. If it’s distinctions we want, too much structure is no better than none. (1999, p. 13)

“New Work” goes on to extend the list of jobs for which the abundant conception is inadequate: Lewis argues that his accounts of supervenience, lawhood, causation, events, and mental content all provide essential work for a theory of properties and relations that conceives them as vastly more sparse than does the abundant conception.

For present purposes, it will pay to focus on an additional, and central, piece of “work” (not singled out for attention in “New Work”; though see Lewis 2001). It is the basic job-description articulated in the main text, the one highlighted by our two foundational metaphysical questions: What is there? What is it like? Almost-Lewis, remember, answers the first by saying that what exists (fundamentally) are spacetime points. But it seems that it will not do to say that what they are like is entirely settled merely by the various sets that can be composed out of them. Tim Maudlin has put the point nicely: “if there are no objective facts about the comparative character of objects, we must fall back into the unpalatable position that the only real structure of the universe is its cardinality.” (1997, p. 84) Rather, what they are like—in the relevant and fundamental sense—is settled by what perfectly natural properties and relations they instantiate.

Two additional points deserve mention. First, Lewis’s account of modality provides him, at least, with an additional and crucial piece of “work” for a theory of natural properties and relations. For he holds that reality as a whole divides into chunks that deserve to be called “possible worlds”; the central idea behind his reduction of the modal to the non-modal is that modal idioms involve, in a certain systematic way, quantification over these chunks and the things they contain. Some account is needed, then, of how the chunking works—of what it is for two things to belong to the same possible world. Lewis’s favored answer appeals to the one species of perfectly natural relation that he is sure that there is: spatiotemporal relations. Thus, two things are world-mates, according to him, iff they bear some spatiotemporal relation to each other. (See Lewis 1986e, esp. pp. 69ff.)

The second point concerns the need for a graded distinction between more and less natural properties, and what sort of account of natural properties can meet this need. Now, this need does not arise from what I have been emphasizing as the foundational role for a natural/non-natural distinction, which is to secure a clear and objective sense in which reality as a whole can be said to have a fundamental structure. But for Lewis, it does arise all the same, perhaps most dramatically in his account of how our talk, and especially thought, manages to have reasonably determinate content (Lewis 1983b, 1984). An essential part of what makes it the case that we refer, in thought (and hence, for Lewis, in talk) to certain properties and entities, and not to others that in purely formal respects would make equally good candidates, is that the former properties and entities are more objectively eligible as candidates for reference than the latter; and this graded distinction of eligibility is in turn to be explained in terms of a graded distinction of naturalness.

Given Lewis’s reductionist commitments, he therefore needs some account of how the facts about the pattern of instantiation of perfectly natural properties make it the case that among those properties that are not perfectly natural, some are nevertheless more natural than others (whence by extension, we can hope, some non-fundamental entities will count as “more natural” than others). He says very little about this issue, but the account he evidently favors gets hinted at occasionally—for example, here, in “Putnam’s paradox”:

… physics discovers which things and classes are the most elite of all; but others are elite also, though to a lesser degree. The less elite are so because they are connected to the most elite by chains of definability. Long chains, by the time we reach the moderately elite classes of cats and pencils and puddles; but the chains required to reach the utterly ineligible would be far longer still. (1999, p. 66)

This suggests the following proposal: Property F counts as more natural than property G just in case some predicate expressing F can be defined, in terms of predicates expressing perfectly natural properties, more simply than can any predicate expressing G.

It seems a difficult, important, and entirely open question whether this proposal succeeds—and if not, what else might replace it.

Copyright © 2021 by
Ned Hall <>
Brian Rabern <>
Wolfgang Schwarz <>

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